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Godwin's moral theory is often described as utilitarian. He clearly does play an important part in the history of utilitarianism, not least for his invocation of both British and French writers in the tradition, such as Joseph Priestley and d'Holbach and Helvetius, and for the way that his ethical theory is underpinned by a distinctive rationalist necessarianism on the basis of which he insisted on a strong form of first order impartiality. One of Godwin's lasting contributions to moral philosophy, the famous fire cause, in which we are asked to consider whom I should save from a burning room if I can only save one person and if the choice is between Archbishop Fénelon and a common chambermaid. Fénelon is about to compose his immortal Télémaque and the chambermaid turns out to be my mother. Godwin's conclusion that we must save the former relies on consequentialist grounds. However, since his account of the content of utility is inseparable from the development of truth and wisdom, and since we can best promote this through the full and free exercise of private judgment and public discussion, the resulting position looks more like a form of perfectionism than utilitarianism.
Godwin's philosophical importance rests principally on his Political Justice. He wrote other philosophical works, The Enquirer (1798) and Thoughts on Man (1831), but he has become perhaps better known for his novels, the most famous of which is Caleb Williams (1794), and for the part he played in literary London from 1783-1836 - from his heyday in the 1790s as the radical philosopher who married Mary Wollstonecraft, through the next forty years in which he was variously the butt of attacks by Thomas Malthus, Samuel Parr and a host of anti-jacobin scribes, friend of the romantic poets, publisher and author of children's books, father-in-law and sponger off Percy Bysshe Shelley, and historian of the Civil War, to his final anomalous position as a government pensioner supported by a Tory administration. His papers and his diary, which sparsely records what he read and wrote and whom he met, provide an immense resource for scholars of the romantic period.
He was first educated by a Mrs. Gedge, an elderly woman, much occupied in the concerns of religion, with whom he read the Old and New Testaments. After her death in 1764, he and his brother went to Mr. Akers' school in Hilderston (now Hindolverston). Godwin remained a religious enthusiast and dissenter -- preaching to his fellow schoolchildren, identifying some as children of the devil, and refusing to answer questions on the Collect of the week, taken from the Book of Common Prayer (CNM I, 24). His success at Akers' reinforced his commitment to intellectual activity and his aversion to physical toil, and compounded his pride, for which he was frequently admonished by his father. Despite his father's opposition, his resolution to become a minister never wavered, and in 1767 he went to board with a Mr. Samuel Newton, the minister of an independent congregation in Norwich.
Newton was deeply influenced by the writings of Robert Sandeman (1718-1771), a hyper-Calvinist who, scorned faith and presents God as saving or damning a person solely "according to the right or wrong judgment of the understanding" (CNM I, 30). Godwin compared Newton in his Autobiography to Caligula or Nero for his spiteful and violent treatment, and he left him in the early summer of 1770, having abandoned his calling and decided to become a bookseller. Six months at Hindolverston persuaded him to resume his pupillage for a further, final year, after which he was pronounced fit for entry into the Dissenting College at Homerton and discharged. Homerton turned him down "on suspicion of Sandemanianism" (CNM I, 41). The more tolerant Hoxton Academy, principally run by Andrew Kippis and Abraham Rees admitted him. Hoxton was noted for its Arminianism and Arianism (that is, for the belief that Divine sovereignty was compatible with free will in man and for the rejection of the divinity of Christ), but Godwin's Sandemanianism remained stubbornly untouched, although he supplemented it with "a creed upon materialism and immaterialism, liberty and necessity, in which no subsequent improvement of my understanding has been able to produce any variation." (CNM I, 42). In June 1778 he set out to practice his vocation. He had a brief appointment in Ware, followed by a period in London, apparently without income, before obtaining a post in 1780 at Stowmarket, Suffolk. He held the post for two years, during which time his religious beliefs underwent a revolution, moving towards deism after following the suggestion of one of his parishioners and reading Holbach, Helvetius and Rousseau. Not surprisingly, he fell into dispute with his congregation and moved to London in 1782 where friends encouraged him to write for his living.
Later that year he completed his first work, The history of the Life of William Pitt, Earl of Chatham (1783), and by the following year was contributing to the English Review, at two guineas a sheet. At the end of 1782 he returned briefly to his original profession, being employed at Beaconsfield in Buckinghamshire for seven months, during which he produced a volume of sermons, Sketches of History (1783). When this appointment broke down he returned to London and resumed his career as an author.
Godwin's output between 1782 and 1784 included, in addition to his Life of Chatham and his sermons, three novels, two political pamphlets, a work on education, and a spoof of the critical reviews. None made Godwin much money and it was only when his former tutor, Andrew Kippis, invited him to write the British and Foreign History section for the New Annual Register, in July 1784, that he was assured of an adequate income. He probably also made some money from the pieces he wrote in 1785 for the Political Herald, a Whig journal, edited by Dr. Gilbert Stuart. The pamphlets, and his pieces for the Political Herald, reveal him to be an extremely well informed commentator on contemporary affairs. Between 1785 and 1793 Godwin published little save his work for the New Annual Register. Nonetheless, in the summer of 1791, at the height of the debate on the French Revolution, sparked by Edmund Burke's Reflections on the Revolution in France (1790), he persuaded his publisher, George Robinson, to support him while he wrote a work summarising recent developments in political philosophy. The work grew from its original conception and was eventually published in two volumes in February 1793 as An Enquiry Concerning Political Justice. It is was an immediate success and remains the founding work of philosophical anarchism. Although Godwin drew on principles canvassed in the debate, and on the work of the philosophes, Political Justice was also powerfully influenced by Godwin's Dissenting education and his involvement in Dissenting circles around Kippis and Timothy and Thomas Brand Hollis. His success soon made him a central figure in radical political and literary circles of London; he become friends with John Thelwall, Holcroft, and John Horne Tooke (all of whom were indicted for Treason in 1794), he associated with a wide range of other established writers such as Elizabeth Inchbald, James Mackintosh, and Joseph Ritson, and he was sought out by a younger generation of enthusiasts, including William Wordsworth, Samuel Taylor Coleridge and William Hazlitt. In May 1794 Godwin's most successful novel, Things as they are, or The adventures of Caleb Williams was published, adding further to his literary reputation, and in the October of that year his shrewd political pamphlet, Cursory Strictures on the Charge delivered by Lord Chief Justice Eyre to the Grand Jury, attacked the case for Treason constructed by Eyre against the leaders of the London Corresponding Society and the Society for Constitutional Information, several of whom were his close associates.
A second edition of Godwin's Political Justice, in which some
of the more rationalist and utopian statements of the first edition
were modified, was published at the end of 1795. Shortly thereafter
he became reacquainted with Mary
In 1805, in an effort to establish his finances on a more secure footing, his friends helped establish him as the proprietor of a children's bookshop. Over the next ten years, writing mainly under the pseudonym Edward Baldwin, Godwin produced a variety of books for children: including collections of fables, myths, and bible stories, histories of England, Rome and Greece, and various dictionaries and grammars, but he wrote little of any real political or philosophical significance for ten years.
In 1814 Godwin's domestic life was thrown into turmoil when Percy Bysshe Shelley eloped to France with Godwin's seventeen-year-old daughter Mary, accompanied by Mary's sixteen year old stepsister, Clare Clairmont. The following decade was marked by repeated family and financial crises, by the suicides of Shelley's first wife, Godwin's stepdaughter Fanny, and of his young protégé Patrickson, and by the deaths of three of Mary Shelley's children, followed hard by the death of Shelley himself in 1822. Yet it was also a productive period for Godwin. His Lives of Edward and John Philips, nephews of Milton (1815), his chilling tale of madness, Mandeville (1817), and his four volume History of the Commonwealth (1824-8) each represent his fascination with the republicanism of the civil war period. He also returned to the subject of education in his Letters of Advice to a Young American (1818) and in 1820 he produced a critique of Malthus' Essay, which won him some respect in some previously hostile quarters, alongside the undisguised enmity of the Edinburgh Review. In the last five years of his life he wrote two further novels, and he returned to the philosophical and terrain of his earlier career in his Thoughts on Man (1831), his most sustained piece of philosophy since his Enquirer (1798). His final work, unpublished in his lifetime, was a series of essays on Christianity, in which he fulfilled an ambition, first noted in 1798, to "sweep away the whole fiction of an intelligent former world and a future state; to call men off from those incoherent and contradictory dreams, that so often occupy their thoughts, and vainly agitate their fears; and to lead them to apply their whole energy to practical objects and genuine realities." (Political and Philosophical Writings (PPW) IV, 417). In 1833 Godwin finally received some recognition when he was given a sinecure post by the then Whig government. Peel's subsequent administration agreed to extend the post until Godwin died in April 1836.
I have fallen (if I have fallen) in one common grave with the cause and love of liberty; and in this sense I have been more honoured and illustrated in my decline, than ever I was in the highest tide of my success. (PPW II, 165)
Philosophically Godwin's greatest supporters were his contemporaries, such as Thomas Holcroft and John Thelwall, and a younger generation of men (and some literary women) who were attracted to Godwin's intellectual rigour and his radical critique of the social and political order. Many later abandoned him, Coleridge, Wordsworth and Southey as part of a rising tide of loyalist reaction, Shelley and Byron, for more personal and domestic reasons. However, his philosophical keyword>anarchismhad a profound influence on Robert Owen, William Thompson and other utopians in the nineteenth century, and there is also evidence of influence on the Chartist movement and on popular labour movements for political reform in the 1840s (see Marshall, 390). His impact in literary circles was long lasting, both through his political writings, and through his novels. Political Justice was read and translated by Benjamin Constant in France, and an abridged edition was translated into German in 1803, along with the first three of Godwin's mature novels. Marx and Engels knew of his work and cited him as having contributed to a theory of exploitation. Later in the nineteenth century Anton Menger and Paul Eltzbacher introduced Godwin's work to German audiences, leading to further translation. Caleb Williams appeared in Russian in 1838, and Chernyshevski, Kroptkin and Tolstoy all read and referred to him. In the late nineteenth century the last Book of Political Justice, formally titled Of Property, but dealing with the prospects for progress in the human race and including his attacks on marriage and co-operation, was reprinted as a socialist tract, and the whole work was reprinted again in the 1920s. A critical edition of the third edition with variants appeared in 1946, and an edition of the 1793 text with both later variants and material from the original manuscripts appeared in 1993. Biographies of Godwin have also appeared regularly since the first by C. Kegan-Paul in 1876, which drew heavily on the extensive manuscript sources. Philosophical interest has been less pronounced, although since the 1940s a slow trickle of books has emerged which have sought to do justice to Godwin's essentially liberal political principles and to his moral philosophy. That work has recognised the importance of thinkers of the French Enlightenment, and more recently the Dissenting inheritance which his education and early career provided. As a result, the traditional view of Godwin as a strict utilitarian has been increasingly challenged. Recent work in political philosophy on the appropriate form and scope of impartiality has looked to Godwin, most commonly to define a position to resist, but not exclusively so.
The work began as an attempt to review recent developments in political and moral philosophy, but it quickly became more ambitious in scope:
In the first fervour of enthusiasm I entertained the vain imagination of hewing a stone from rock which by its inherent energy and weight should overbear and annihilate all opposition, and place the principles of politics on an unmoveable basis. (CNM I, 49)The discarded first draft centres on the work of Montesquieu and Raynal, while the published work abandons the expository mode and develops its own independent line of argument. Godwin begins by defending the importance of political inquiry and refuting claims that moral and political phenomena are a function of climate, national character or luxury. He argues that character is a function of experience and that the type of government under which people live has an overwhelming impact upon their experience -- bad government produces wretched men and women. Although he is initially prepared to endorse the philosophe and republican view that government can have a positive impact on the development of virtue, this view is soon set aside in favour of the argument that moral and political improvement flows from progress in our understanding of moral and political truth -- a process to which there is no limit.
Book Two examines the basic principles of human society, equality, rights, justice, and private judgment. Godwin follows Paine's view in Common Sense, that "society is in every state a blessing...government even in its best state is but a necessary evil" (PPW III, 48), by seeing society as antecedent to government with its principles setting the bounds of its legitimacy. The basic moral principle is that of justice:
If justice have any meaning, it is just that I should contribute everything in my power to the benefit of the whole. (PPW III, 49)This principle is filled out by two further principles. The first, equality, is used to establish that we are beings of the same nature, susceptible of the same pleasures and pains, and equally endowed with the capacity for reason. This is to endorse the philosophe principle that birth and rank must not affect the way people are treated -
the thing really to be desired is the removing as much as possible arbitrary distinctions, and leaving to talents and virtue the field of exertion unimpaired (PPW III, 65).But he also believes (as in the Fénelon case) that some have a higher moral value than others. This second judgment seems rigorously consequentialist, in that we value them more if and only if they contribute more to the general good (a position in line with Godwin's rejection in Book Seven of all desert-based accounts of punishment). Tensions are introduced into his account, however, by the emphasis he places on intention in assessing a person's action -
It is in the disposition and view of the mind, and not in the good which may accidentally and inintentionally result, that virtue consists. (PPW III, 193)and by his characterisation of the ideal agent as someone devoted to a life of benevolence and virtue. In both instances he appeals to a agent-centred account of virtue, more than to a consequentialist account, and in doing so acknowledges a form of moral worth which is not wholly reducible to consequentialist considerations. The second principle to which he appeals, the doctrine of private judgment, is advanced as the logical complement to the principle of justice:
to a rational being there is but one rule of conduct, justice, and one mode of ascertaining that rule, the exercise of his understanding. (PPW, III, 72).Here again, although Godwin appeals in part to consequentialist considerations to ground a duty to private judgment, it also plays an integral part of his conception of what it is to be a fully rational agent. When combined with the principle of equality, the principle of private judgment issues in a basic constraint on certain types of consequentialist intervention - each person acts morally only in so far as each acts wholly on the dictates of his or her private judgment. To effect real improvement we must work by appealing to the rational capacities of each of our fellow citizens.
Book Three and the first part of Book Four develop Godwin's case against existing theories of government, in each case making his case by drawing on his opening argument that there is no intrinsic limit on the development of human understanding and enlightenment. The philosophical underpinning for this argument is given in the second half of Book Four where Godwin examines the character of truth and its relationship to virtue and goes on to discuss arguments relating to freedom of the will, the doctrine of philosophical necessity, and the character of moral motivation. He shows that men are capable of recognising truth, and that, because mind acts as a real cause, they will act on it when they perceive it clearly. Nothing beyond the perception of truth is required to motivate our compliance with moral principles. It is this which justifies the description of Godwin's position as rationalist, and it is on ths point - the motivating power of reason - that later editions show a degree of retraction. One possible source for the position is Richard Price's Reiview of the Principal Questions of Morals (1756, but it is noteworthy that Godwin himself later identified this error as a function of his Sandemanianism. In Political Justice, however, Godwin builds his argument on foundations laid by David Hartley and Joseph Priestley, albeit he develops their position by insisting that mind is the medium within which sensations, desires, passions and beliefs contend -- so that we should understand the conflict between passion and reason as one of contending opinions. Such contention can be assessed impartially by the mind which will assess the true value of each claim and act on the judgment.
Books Five to Eight apply the principles of justice, equality and private judgment in a critical examination of the institutions of government, issues of toleration and freedom of speech, theories of law and punishment, and, finally, the institution of property. In each case, government and its institutions are shown to constrain the development of our capacity to live wholly in accordance with the full and free exercise of private judgment. In the final book Godwin sketches his positive vision of the egalitarian society of the future, one which, having dispensed with all forms of organised co-operation, including orchestras and marriage, so as to ensure the fullest independence to each persons' judgment, will gradually witness the development of the powers of mind to the point that they gain ascendancy over physiological process allowing life to be prolonged indefinitely.
In 1800 Godwin wrote:
The Enquiry concerning Political Justice I apprehend to be blemished principally by three errors. 1. Stoicism, or an inattention to the principle, that pleasure and pain are the only bases upon which morality can exist. 2. Sandemanianism, or an inattention to the principle that feeling, and not judgment, is the source of human actions. 3. The unqualified condemnation of the private affections. It will easily be seen how strongly these errors are connected with the Calvinist system, which had been so deeply wrought into my mind in early life, as to enable these errors long to survive the general system of religious opinions of which they formed a part...The first of these errors...has been corrected with some care in the subsequent edition of Political Justice. The second and third owe their destruction to a perusal of Hume's Treatise of Human Nature in the following edition. (CNM, I, 54)This account is a fair characterisation of the changes which Godwin made in the second and third editions. Sentiment and feeling are given a much more powerful role, no longer to be expunged by the power of truth; the private affections are allowed to play a part in moral reasoning; and a more consistently
The impact of these changes on Godwin's over-all position is more difficult to assess. What we see in the changes is a consistent shift away from the rationalist account of moral motivation which marked the first edition to a position which is much more sceptical about the power of reason. This scepticism inevitably moderates Godwin's belief in perfectibility, since it becomes more difficult to argue for convergence on principles of morality and the progressive development of knowledge. It also inevitably undermines Godwin's faith in the triumph of mind over physiological processes. That said, neither the doctrine of private judgment nor the principle of utility depend on his earlier rationalism. The former is defended by Godwin on the grounds that only free action has moral value, and that the fullest possible exercise of private judgment is required for one's actions to be free - further evidence of Godwin's attempt to provide an agent-centred account of virtue alongside his consequentialism. With this commitment private judgment remains defensible even if there is a low probability that its exercise will produce true beliefs, so long as no other better method of tracking truth is available (which also becomes proportionately less likely as one's scepticism increases). The defence might require that cognitive status be attributed to moral judgments, but it might also be possible to sustain the argument for private judgment independent of the issue of ethical objectivity. The utility principle might seem to call for an ability to make sound ethical judgments in complex situations but, again, if we are sceptical about people's ability to judge well, this does not entail (and seems to deny) that there is a better way of judging. On both counts then, Godwin's central principles remain intact despite the changes he makes to the account of moral motivation and judgment. Moreover, Godwin's view of man's progressive character might be defended by placing greater weight on the baleful effects of the social and political institutions of the European aristocracies than on the epistemological dimensions of the account.
However, Godwin's endorsement of both the principle of utility as
the sole guide to moral duty and the principle of private judgment as
a block on the interference of others, is not without tensions. His
consistent doctrine is a combination of these two principles: that it
is each individual's duty to produce as much happiness in the world
as he is able, and that each person must be guided in acting by the
exercise of his private judgment, albeit informed by public
discussion. If the resulting doctrine is
Such issues of interpretation remain very much in dispute in studies of Godwin (compare Clarke (1977) with Philp (1986)), complicated by issues concerning the weight to be given to the different editions of Political Justice and Godwin's later writings. However, even if a utilitarian reading of Godwin is accepted, it remains the case that the doctrine is strictly a precept of individual moral judgment. Because of his broader views as to the corrupting influence of government, there can be no extension of the principle to politics. Each of us must judge as best we can how to advance the good of all, but every person is owed a respect for their private judgment which precludes us from exercising authority over them. By this constraint, Godwin delivers utilitarianism from the more statist approaches of Bentham and later utilitarians. It also ensures that the doctrine retains a fundamentally egalitarian form. The constraint also supports the view that Godwin reached his philosophical position less through the philosophes, than by secularising Dissenting arguments for the sanctity of private judgment and generalising their application to every mode of human activity. This commitment also provides support for a reading of Godwin's position which sees it as concerned with individual moral perfectibility, couched in the language of utility, rather than as strictly utilitarian.
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First published: January 16, 2000
Content last modified: January 16, 2000