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All that makes existence valuable to anyone depends on the enforcement of restraints upon the actions of other people. Some rules of conduct, therefore, must be imposed -- by law in the first place, and by opinion on many things which are not fit subjects for the operation of law. (1978, 5)The task, therefore, is not to argue for a "pure" unadulterated free speech; such a concept cannot be defended. Instead, we need to decide how much value we place on speech in relation to the worth we place on other important ideals: "speech, in short, is never a value in and of itself but is always produced within the precincts of some assumed conception of the good" (Fish, 1994, 104). In this essay, we will examine some conceptions of the good that are deemed to be legitimate limitations on speech. We will start with the harm principle and then move on to other, more encompassing arguments for limiting speech.
Before we do this, however, the reader might wish to disagree with the claims made above and warn of the dangers of the slippery slope. The slippery slope argument is that we should not limit free speech because once we do we will slide our way into tyranny and censorship. Such arguments assume that we can be on or off the slope. In fact, no such choice exists: we are necessarily on the slope whether we like it or not, and the task is always to decide how far up or down we choose to go, not whether we should step off altogether. It is worth noting that the slippery slope argument can be used to make the opposite point; one could argue with equal force that we should never allow any removal of government involvement with the action of individuals because once we do we are on the slippery slope to anarchy, the state of nature, and a life that Hobbes described in Leviathan as solitary, poore, nasty, brutish, and short (1968, 186).
The second thing to note is that we are in fact free to speak as we like. Hence, free speech differs from some other forms of freedom of action. If the government wishes to stop citizens performing certain actions, riding motor bikes for example, it can limit the freedom to do so by making sure that such vehicles are no longer available; current bikes could be destroyed and a ban can be placed on imports. Freedom of speech is a different case. A government cannot make it impossible to say certain things. The only thing it can do is punish people after they have said, written or published. This means that we are free to speak or write in a way that we are not free to ride outlawed motorbikes. This is an important point; if we insist that legal prohibitions remove freedom then we have to hold the incoherent position that a person was unfree in the performance of an action. The government would have to remove our vocal chords for us to be unfree to speak in the same way as those who want to ride motorbikes are unfree.
A better way to think about freedom of speech is to say that the threat of a sanction makes us less free than we would be without the threat because the threat makes it more difficult and more costly to exercise our freedom. Such sanctions take two major forms. The first, and most serious, is punishment by the state, which usually consists of a financial penalty, but occasionally can stretch to imprisonment. The second threat of sanction comes from social disapprobation. People will often refrain from making statements because they fear the ridicule and moral outrage of others. For example, one could expect a fair amount of these things if one made racist comments during a public lecture at a university. Usually it is the first type that sparks the most controversy but John Stuart Mill provides a strong warning about the chilling effect of the latter form of sanction.
We seem to have reached a paradoxical position. I started by claiming that there can be no such thing as a pure form of free speech: now I seem to be arguing that we are, in fact, free to say anything we like. The paradox is resolved by thinking of free speech in the following terms. I am, indeed, free to say what I like, but the state and other individuals can make that freedom more or less costly to exercise. The issue, therefore, boils down to assessing how cumbersome we wish to make it for people to say certain things. The best way to think about this is to ask whether speech should be protected rather than to ask whether it should be prohibited. This leads us to the recognition that we can and should regulate speech, but ultimately we cannot prevent it if the person is dedicated to making the statement.
If the arguments of the present chapter are of any validity, there ought to exist the fullest liberty of professing and discussing, as a matter of ethical conviction, any doctrine, however immoral it may be considered. (1978, 15)This is a very strong defense of free speech; Mill tells us that any doctrine should be allowed the light of day no matter how immoral it may seem to everyone else. And Mill does mean everyone:
If all mankind minus one were of one opinion, and only one person were of the contrary opinion, mankind would be no more justified in silencing that one person than he, if he had the power, would be justified in silencing mankind. (1978, 16)Such liberty should exist with every subject matter, such that we have absolute freedom of opinion and sentiment on all subjects, practical or speculative, scientific, moral or theological (1978, 11). Mill claims that we need the fullest liberty of expression to push our arguments to their logical limit, not to the limit of social embarrassment. Such liberty of expression is necessary, he suggests, for the dignity of persons.
This is as strong an argument for freedom of speech as we are likely to find. But as I already noted above, Mill also suggests that we need some rules of conduct that regulate the actions and words of members of a political community. The limitation he places on free expression is one very simple principle, now usually referred to as the Harm Principle, which states that
the only purpose for which power can be rightfully exercised over any member of a civilized community, against his will, is to prevent harm to others. (1978, 9)
There is a great deal of debate about what Mill had in mind when he referred to harm; for the purposes of this essay he will be taken to mean that an action has to directly and in the first instance invade the rights of a person (Mill himself uses the term rights, despite basing the arguments in the book on the principle of utility). The limits on free speech will be very narrow because it is difficult to support the claim that most speech actually causes harm to the rights of others. This is the position staked out by Mill in the first two chapters of On Liberty and it is a good starting point for a discussion of free speech because it is hard to imagine a more liberal position. It becomes very difficult to defend free speech once it can be demonstrated that its practice does actually invade the rights of others.
If we accept the argument based on the harm principle we need to ask what types of speech, if any, cause harm? Once we can answer this question, we have found the correct limits to free expression. Mill uses the example of speech related to corn dealers; he suggests that it is fine to claim that corn dealers are starvers of the poor if such a view is expressed through the medium of the printed page, but that it is not permissible to express the same view to an angry mob, ready to explode, that has gathered outside the house of the dealer. The difference between the two is that the latter is an expression such as to constitute...a positive instigation to some mischievous act, (1978, 53), namely, to place the rights, and possibly the life, of the corn dealer in danger. As Daniel Jacobson (2000) notes, it is important to remember that Mill will not sanction limits to free speech simply because someone is harmed by the statements of others. For example, the corn dealer may suffer severe financial hardship if he is accused of starving the poor. Mill distinguishes between legitimate and illegitimate harm, and it is only when speech causes a direct and clear violation of rights that it can be limited. Other examples where the harm principle may apply include libel laws, blackmail, advertising blatant untruths about commercial products, advertising dangerous products to children (e.g. cigarettes), and securing truth in contracts. In most of these cases, it is possible to make an argument that harm has been committed and that rights have been violated.
When pornography involves young children, most people will accept that it should be prohibited because of the harm that is being done to persons under the age of consent. It has proved much more difficult to make the same claim for consenting adults. It is hard to show that the actual people who appear in the books, magazines, films, videos and on the internet are being physically harmed, and it is even more difficult to demonstrate that harm has ocurred for women as a whole. Very few people would deny that violence against women is abhorrent and an all too common feature of our society, but how much of this is caused by violent pornography? One would have to show that a person who had no propensity to rape or batter females was caused to do so through exposure to material depicting violence to women.
Andrea Dworkin (1981) has attempted to show that harm is caused to women by pornography, but it has proven very difficult to draw a conclusive causal relationship. If pornographers were exhorting their readers to commit violence and rape, the case for prohibition would be much stronger, but they tend not to do this, just as films that depict murder do not actively incite the audience to mimic what they see on the screen. Remember that Mill's formulation of the harm principle suggests only speech that directly harms the rights of others in an illegitimate manner should be banned; finding such material offensive, obscene or outrageous is not sufficient grounds for prohibition. Overall, it seems very difficult to mount a compelling case for banning pornography (except in the case of minors) based on the concept of harm as formulated by Mill.
Another difficult case is hate speech. Most European liberal democracies have limitations on hate speech, but it is debatable whether these can be justified by the harm principle as formulated by Mill. One would have to show that such speech violated rights, directly and in the first instance. A famous example of hate speech is the Nazi march through Skokie, Illinois. In fact, the intention was not to engage in political speech at all, but simply to march through a predominantly Jewish community dressed in storm trooper uniforms and wearing swastikas (although the Illinois Supreme Court interpreted the wearing of swastikas as symbolic political speech). It is clear that most people, especially those who lived in Skokie, were outraged and offended by the march, but were they harmed? There was no plan to cause physical injury and the marchers did not intend to damage property.
The main argument against allowing the march, based on the harm principle, was that it would cause harm by inciting opponents of the march to riot. The problem with this claim is that it is the harm that could potentially be done to the people speaking that becomes the focal point and not the harm done to those who are the subject of the hate. To ban speech for this reason, i.e., for the good of the speaker, tends to undermine the basic right to free speech in the first place. It is possible to suggest that persons on the wrong end of hate speech are psychologically harmed, but this is more difficult to demonstrate than harm to a person's legal rights. It seems, therefore, that if we are to base our defense of speech on the harm principle we are going to have very few sanctions imposed on the spoken and written word. It is only when we can show direct harm to rights, which will almost always mean when an attack is made against a specific individual or a small group of persons, that it is legitimate to impose a sanction. One response is to suggest that the harm principle can be defined in a less stringent manner than Mill's formulation. This is a complicated issue that I cannot delve into here. Suffice it to say that if we can, then more options might become available for prohibiting hate speech and violent pornography.
There are two basic responses to the harm principle as a means of limiting speech. One is that it is too narrow; the other is that it is too broad. This latter view is not often expressed because, as already noted, most people think that free speech should be limited if it does cause harm. George Kateb (1996), however, has made an interesting argument that runs as follows. If we want to limit speech because of harm then we will have to ban a lot of political speech. Most of it is useless, a lot of it is offensive, and some of it causes harm because it is deceitful, and because it is aimed at discrediting specific groups. It also undermines democratic citizenship and stirs up nationalism and jingoism, which results in harm to citizens of other countries. Even worse than political discourse, according to Kateb, is religious speech; he claims that a lot of religious speech is hateful, useless, dishonest, and ferments war, bigotry and fundamentalism. It also creates bad self-image and feelings of guilt that can haunt persons throughout their lives. Pornography or hate speech, he claims, causes nowhere near as much harm as political and religious speech. His conclusion is that the harm principle casts its net too far and we should allow almost unlimited speech.
This is a powerful argument, but there seem to be at least two problems with the analysis. The first is that the harm principle would actually allow religious and political speech for the same reasons that it allows pornography and hate speech, namely that it is not possible to demonstrate that such speech does cause direct harm to rights. I find it very doubtful that Mill would support using his arguments about harm to ban political and religious speech. The second problem for Kateb is that if we accept he is right that such speech does cause harm in the sense of violating rights, the correct response is surely to start limiting political and religious speech. If Kateb's argument is sound he has shown that harm is more extensive than we might have thought; he has not demonstrated that the harm principle is invalid.
The other response to the harm principle is that it does not stretch far enough. One of the most impressive arguments for this position comes from Joel Feinberg, who suggests that the harm principle cannot shoulder all of the work necessary for a principle that has to deal with free speech. In some instances we also need an offense principle that can act as a guide to public censure. The basic idea is that the harm principle sets the bar too high and that we should prohibit some forms of expression because they are very offensive. Causing offense is less serious than harming someone, so the penalties imposed should not be as heavy as those for actions that cause harm. As Feinberg notes, however, this has not always been the case and he cites a number of instances in the U.S. where penalties for sodomy and consensual incest have ranged from twenty years imprisonment to the death penalty. These are victimless crimes and hence the punishment has to have a basis in the supposed offensiveness of the behavior rather than the harm that is caused.
Such a principle is difficult to apply because many people take offense as the result of an overly sensitive disposition, or worse, because of bigotry and unjustified prejudice. Despite the difficulty of applying a standard of this kind, something like the offense principle operates widely in liberal democracies where citizens are penalized for a variety of activities, including speech, that would escape prosecution under the harm principle. Wandering around the local shopping mall naked, or engaging in sexual acts in public places are two obvious examples. Given the specific nature of this essay, I will not delve into the issue of offensive behavior in all its manifestations, and I will limit the discussion to offensive forms of speech. Feinberg suggests that a variety of factors need to be taken into account when deciding whether speech can be limited by the offense principle and these include the extent, duration and social value of the speech, the ease with which it can be avoided, the motives of the speaker, the number of people offended, the intensity of the offense, and the general interest of the community at large.
How does the offense principle help us deal with the issue of pornography? Given the above criteria, Feinberg argues that books should never be banned for reasons of offence. If one has freely decided to read the book for pleasure, the offense principle obviously does not apply, and if one does not want to read it, it is easily avoidable. A similar argument would be applied to pornographic films. The French film Bais-Moi was in essence banned in Australia in 2002 because of its offensive material (it was denied a rating which meant that it could not be shown in cinemas). It would seem, however, that the offense principle outlined by Feinberg would not permit such prohibition because it is very easy to avoid being offended by the film. It should also be legal to advertise the film, but some limits could be placed on the content of the advertisement so that sexually explicit material is not placed on billboards in public places (because these are not easily avoidable). At first glance it might seem strange to have a more stringent speech code for advertisements than for the thing being advertised; the harm principle would not provide the grounds for such a distinction, but it is a logical conclusion of the offense principle.
What of pornography that is extremely offensive because of its violent content? In this case the offense is more profound: simply knowing that such films exist is enough to deeply offend many people. The difficulty here is that bare knowledge, i.e., being offended by merely knowing that something exists or is taking place, is not as serious as being offended by something that one does not like and that one cannot escape. If we allow that films should be banned because some people are offended, even when they do not have to view them, logical consistency demands that we allow the possibility of prohibiting many forms of expression. Many people find strong attacks on religion, or t.v. shows by religious fundamentalists deeply offensive. Hence, Feinberg argues that even though some forms of pornography are profoundly offensive to a lot of people, they should still be permitted.
Hate speech causes profound and personal offense. The discomfort that is caused to those who are the object of such attacks cannot easily be shrugged off. As in the case of violent pornography, the offense that is caused by the march through Skokie cannot be avoided simply by staying off the streets because the offense is taken over the bare knowledge that the march is taking place. As we have seen, however, bare knowledge does not seem sufficient grounds for prohibition. If we examine some of the other factors regarding offensive speech mentioned above, Feinberg suggests that the march through Skokie does not do very well: the social value of the speech seems to be marginal, the number of people offended will be large, and it is difficult to see how it is in the interests of the community. These reasons also hold for violent pornography.
A key difference, however, is in the intensity of the offense; it is particularly acute with hate speech because it is aimed at a specific audience. The motivations of the speakers in the Skokie example seemed to be to incite fear and hatred and to directly insult the members of the community with Nazi symbols. Nor, according to Feinberg, was there any political content to the speech. The distinction between violent pornography and this specific example of hate speech is that a particular group of people were targeted and the message of hate was paraded in such a way that it could not be easily avoided.
Feinberg also claims that when fighting words are used to provoke people who are prevented by law from using a fighting response, the offense is profound enough to allow for prohibition. If pornographers engaged in the same behavior, parading through neighborhoods where they were likely to meet great resistance and cause profound offense, they too should be prevented from doing so. It is clear, therefore, that the crucial component of the offense principle is the avoidability of the offensive material. For the argument to be consistent, it must follow that many forms of hate speech should still be allowed if the offense is easily avoidable. Nazis can still meet in private places, or even in public ones that are easily bypassed. Advertisements for such meetings can be edited (because they are less easy to avoid) but should not be banned.
Very few liberals take the Millian view that only speech causing direct harm should be prohibited; most support some form of the offense principle. Some are willing to extend the realm of state interference further and argue that hate speech should be banned even if it does not cause harm or unavoidable offense. The reason it should be banned is that it is inconsistent with the underlying values of liberal democracy to brand some citizens as inferior to others on the grounds of race or sexual orientation. The same applies to pornography; it should be prevented because it is wrong to portray women as sexual objects, who are often violently mistreated. Rae Langton, for example, starts from the liberal premise of equal concern and respect and concludes that it is justifiable to remove certain speech protections for pornographers. She avoids basing her argument on harm: "If, for example, there were conclusive evidence linking pornography to violence, one could simply justify a prohibitive strategy on the basis of the harm principle. However, the prohibitive arguments advanced in this article do not require empirical premises as strong as this...they rely instead on the notion or equality" (1990, 313).
Working within the framework of arguments supplied by Ronald Dworkin, who is opposed to prohibitive measures, she tries to demonstrate that egalitarian liberals such as Dworkin, should, in fact, support the prohibition of pornography. She suggests that we have "reason to be concerned about pornography, not because it is morally suspect, but because we care about equality and the rights of women" (1990, 311). This is an approach also taken by Catherine McKinnon (1987). She distinguishes, much like Feinberg, between pornography and erotica. Erotica might be explicit and create sexual arousal, neither of which is grounds for complaint. Pornography would not come under attack if it did the same thing as erotica; the complaint is that it portrays women in a manner that undermines their equal status as citizens: "We define pornography as the graphic sexually explicit subordination of women through pictures or words that also includes women dehumanized as sexual objects, things, or commodities; enjoying pain or humiliation or rape; being tied up, cut up, mutilated, bruised, or physically hurt; in postures of sexual submission or servility or display; reduced to body parts, penetrated by objects or animals, or presented in scenarios of degradation, injury, torture; shown as filthy or inferior; bleeding, bruised or hurt in a context which makes these conditions sexual" (1987, 176).
Langton agrees and concludes that "women as a group have rights against the consumers of pornography, and thereby have rights that are trumps against the policy of permitting pornography...the permissive policy is in conflict with the principle of equal concern and respect, and that women accordingly have rights against it" (1990, 346). Because she is not basing her argument on the harm principle, she does not have to show that women are harmed by pornography. For the argument to be persuasive, however, one does have to accept that permitting pornography does mean that women are not treated with equal concern and respect.
To argue the case above, one has to dilute one's support for freedom of expression in favor of other principles, such as equal respect for all citizens. This is a sensible approach according to Stanley Fish; the task is not to arrive at hard and fast principles that govern all speech, but to find a workable compromise that gives due weight to a variety of values. Supporters of this view will tend to remind us that when we are discussing free speech, we are not dealing with speech in isolation; what we are doing is comparing free speech with some other good. For instance, we have to decide whether it is better to place a higher value on speech than it is on the value of privacy, security, equality, or the prevention of harm.
To start from a principle of unregulated speech is to start from a place that itself needs to be vigorously defended. For Stanley Fish, the issue is one of finding a balance in which "we must consider in every case what is at stake and what are the risks and gains of alternative courses of action" (1994, 111). Is speech promoting our basic values or undermining them? "If you don't ask this question, or some version of it, but just say that speech is speech and that's it, you are mystifying--presenting as an arbitrary and untheorized fiat-- a policy that will seem whimsical or worse to those whose interests it harms or dismisses" (1994, 123).
In other words, there have to be reasons behind the argument to allow speech; we cannot simply say that the First Amendment says it is so, therefore it must be so. The task is not to come up with a principle that always favors expression, but rather, to decide what is good speech and what is bad speech. A good policy "will not assume that the only relevant sphere of action is the head and larynx of the individual speaker" (1994, 126). Is it more in keeping with the values of a democratic society, in which every person is deemed equal, to allow or prohibit speech that singles out specific individuals and groups as less than equal? The answer, according to Fish, cannot be settled by simply appealing to a pre-ordained ideal of absolute free speech, because this is a principle that is itself in need of defense. Fish's answer is that, "it depends. I am not saying that First Amendment principles are inherently bad (they are inherently nothing), only that they are not always the appropriate reference point for situations involving the production of speech" (1994, 113). But, all things considered, "I am persuaded that at the present moment, right now, the risk of not attending to hate speech is greater than the risk that by regulating it we will deprive ourselves of valuable voices and insights or slide down the slippery slope towards tyranny. This is a judgement for which I can offer reasons but no guarantees" (1994, 115).
Hence, the boundaries of free speech cannot be set in stone by philosophical principles. It is the world of politics that decides what we can and cannot say, not the world of abstract philosophy. Free speech is about political victories and defeats. The very guidelines for marking off protected from unprotected speech are the result of this battle, they are not truths in their own right: "No such thing as free (nonideologically constrained) speech; no such thing as a public forum purged of ideological pressures of exclusion" (1994, 116). Speech always takes place in an environment of convictions, assumptions, and perceptions i.e., within the confines of a structured world. The thing to do, according to Fish, is get out there and argue for one's position.
We should ask three questions according to Fish: "[g]iven that it is speech, what does it do, do we want it to be done, and is more to be gained or lost by moving to curtail it?" (1994, 127). He suggests that the answers we arrive at will vary according to the context. Free speech will be more limited in the military, where the underlying value is hierarchy and authority, than it will be at a university where one of the main values is the expression of ideas. Even on campus, there will be different levels of appropriate speech. Spouting off at the fountain in the center of campus should be less regulated than what a professor can say during a lecture. A campus is not simply a "free speech forum but a workplace where people have contractual obligations, assigned duties, pedagogical and administrative responsibilities" (1994,129). Almost all places in which we interact are governed by underlying values and hence speech will have to fit in with these principles: "[r]egulation of free speech is a defining feature of everyday life" (1994,129). Thinking of speech in this way takes a lot of the mystique away. Whether we should ban hate speech is just another question along the lines of whether we should allow university professors to talk about football in lectures that are supposed to be about Plato.
Although Stanley Fish takes some of the mystique away from the value of speech, he still thinks of limitations largely in terms of other regarding consequences. There are arguments, however, that suggest speech can be limited to prevent harm being done to the speaker. The argument here is that the agent might not have a full grasp of the consequences of the action involved (whether it be speech or some other form of behavior) and hence can be prevented from engaging in the act. Arguments used in the Skokie case would fit into this category. Most liberals are wary of such arguments because we are now entering the realm of paternalistic intervention where it is assumed that the state knows better than the individual what is in his or her best interests.
Mill, for example, is an opponent of paternalism generally, but he does believe there are certain instances when intervention is warranted. He suggests that if a public official is certain that a bridge will collapse, he can prevent a person crossing. If, however, there is only a danger that it will collapse the person can be warned but not coerced. The decision here seems to depend on the likelihood of personal injury; the more certain it becomes, the more legitimate the intervention. Prohibiting freedom of speech on these grounds is very questionable (it was not persuasive in the Skokie case) because it is very rare that speech would produce such a clear danger to the individual.
Hence we have exhausted the options that are open to the liberal regarding limitations on free speech and one cannot be classed as a liberal if one is willing to stray further into the arena of state intervention than already discussed. Liberals tend to be united in opposing paternalistic and moralistic justifications for limiting free expression. They have a strong presumption in favor of individual liberty because, it is argued, this is the only way that the autonomy of the individual can be respected. To wish to prohibit speech for reasons other than those already mentioned means that one has to make an argument that it is permissible to limit speech because of its unsavory content, or as Feinberg puts it, one has to be willing to say that
[i]t can be morally legitimate for the state, by means of the criminal law, to prohibit certain types of action that cause neither harm nor offense to any one, on the grounds that such actions constitute or cause evils of other kinds. (Harmless Wrongdoing, p. 3)Acts can be "evil" if they are dangerous to a traditional way of life, because they are immoral, or because they hinder the perfectability of the human race. Many arguments against pornography take the form that such material is wrong because of the moral harm it does to the consumer. Liberals oppose such views because they are not very interested in trying to mold the moral character of citizens.
We began this examination of free speech with the harm principle; let us end with it and assess whether it helps us determine the proper limits of free expression. The principle suggests that we need to distinguish between legal sanction and social disapprobation as means of limiting speech. As already noted, the latter does not ban speech but it makes it more uncomfortable to utter unpopular statements. J.S. Mill does not seem to support the imposition of legal penalties unless they are sanctioned by the harm principle. As one would expect, Mill also seems to be worried by the use of social pressure as a means of limiting speech. Chapter III of On Liberty is an incredible assault on social censorship, expressed through the tyranny of the majority, because it produces stunted, pinched, hidebound and withered individuals: everyone lives as under the eye of a hostile and dreaded censorship...[i]t does not occur to them to have any inclination except what is customary (1978, 58). He continues:
the general tendency of things throughout the world is to render mediocrity the ascendant power among mankind...at present individuals are lost in the crowd...the only power deserving the name is that of masses...[i]t does seem, however, that when the opinions of masses of merely average men are everywhere become or becoming the dominant power, the counterpoise and corrective to that tendency would be the more and more pronounced individuality of those who stand on the higher eminences of thought. (1978, 63-4)With these comments, and many of a similar ilk, Mill demonstrates his distaste of the apathetic, fickle, tedious, frightened and dangerous majority.
It is quite a surprise, therefore, to find that he also seems to embrace a fairly encompassing offense principle when the sanction does involve social disapprobation:
Again, there are many acts which, being directly injurious only to the agents themselves, ought not to be legally interdicted, but which, if done publicly, are a violation of good manners and, coming thus within the category of offenses against others, may rightly be prohibited. (1978, 97 [author's emphasis]
Similarly, he states that The liberty of the individual must be thus far limited; he must not make himself a nuisance (1978, 53). In the latter parts of On Liberty Mill also suggests that distasteful characters can be held in contempt, that we can avoid such persons (as long as we do not parade it), that we can warn others against the person, and that we can persuade, cajole and remonstrate with those we deem offensive. These actions are legitimate as the free expression of those who happen to be offended as long as they are done as a spontaneous response to the person's faults and not as a form of punishment.
But those who exhibit cruelty, malice, envy, insincerity, resentment and crass egoism are open to the greater sanction of disapprobation as a form of punishment, because these faults are wicked and are other-regarding. It may be true that these faults have an impact on others, but it is difficult to see how acting according to malice,envy or resentment necessarily violates the rights of others. The only way that Mill can make such claims is by expanding his argument to include an offense principle and hence by giving up on the harm principle as the only legitimate grounds for interference with behavior. Overall, Mill[special-character:#146s arguments about ostracism and disapprobation seem to provide little protection for the individual who may have spoken in a non-harmful manner but who has nevertheless offended the sensibilities of the masses.
Hence we see that one of the great defenders of the harm principle seems to shy away from it at certain crucial points. The principle, however, still remains an elementary part of the liberal defence of individual freedom. Liberals tend to defend freedom generally, and free speech in particular, for a variety of reasons; it fosters authenticity, genius, creativity, individuality and human flourishing. Mill tells us specifically that if we ban speech the silenced opinion may be true, or contain a portion of the truth, and that unchallenged opinions become mere prejudices and dead dogmas that are inherited rather than adopted.
These are empirical claims that require evidence. Is it likely that we enhance the cause of truth by allowing hate speech or violent and degrading forms of pornography? It is worth pondering the relationship between speech and truth. If we had a graph where one axis was truth and the other was free speech, would we get one extra unit of truth for every extra unit of free speech? How can such a thing even be measured? It is certainly questionable whether arguments degenerate into prejudice if they are not constantly challenged. Devil's advocates are often tedious rather than useful interlocutors. None of this is meant to suggest that free speech is not vitally important; this is, in fact, precisely the reason we need to find good arguments in its favor. But sometimes supporters of free speech, like its detractors, have a tendency to make assertions without providing compelling evidence to back them up.
In a liberal society, we have found that the harm principle provides reasons for limiting free speech when doing so prevents direct harm to rights. This means that very few speech acts should be prohibited. The offense principle has a wider reach than the harm principle, but it still recommends a very limited intervention in the realm of free speech. All forms of speech that are found to be offensive but easily avoidable should go unpunished. This means that all forms of pornography and most forms of hate speech will escape punishment. If this argument is acceptable, it seems only logical that we should extend it to other forms of behavior. Public nudity, for example, causes offense to some people, but most of us find it at most a bit embarrassing, and it is avoided by a simple turn of the head. The same goes with nudity and coarse language on television. Neither the harm or the offense principles as outlined by Mill support criminalizing bigamy or drug use, nor the enforcement of seat belts, crash helmets and the like.
Some argue that speech can be limited for the sake of other liberal values, particularly the concern for democratic equality; the claim is not that speech should always lose out when it clashes with other fundamental principles that underpin modern liberal democracies, but that it should not be automatically privileged. To extend prohibitions on speech and other actions beyond this point requires an argument for a form of legal paternalism that suggests the state should decide what is acceptable for the safety and moral instruction of citizens, even if it means limiting actions that do not cause harm or unavoidable offense to others. It is up to the reader to decide which of these positions is the most persuasive. It has certainly been the practice of most societies, even liberal-democratic ones, to impose some paternalistic restrictions and to limit speech because it causes offense. As we have seen, even Mill seems to back away somewhat from the harm principle. Hence the freedom of expression supported by the harm principle as outlined in Chapter One of On Liberty and by Feinberg's offense principle is still a possibility rather than a reality. It is also up to the reader to decide if it is an appealing possibility.
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First published: November 29, 2002
Content last modified: November 29, 2002