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It need hardly be said that Sellars did not take himself to have accurately accounted for the historical origins of our capacity for mental state attribution. Rather, his aim was to open a new space in the debate about the status of mental state attributions by pointing out that mental states could be the posits of a theory of mind. As we shall see, subsequent generations took Sellars's suggestion entirely seriously, and were right to do so.
Another important historical source of the idea that our everyday understanding of mental states constitutes a folk theory of mind is the rise of cognitivism in the 1960s. Following the widespread perception that behaviorism had failed, cognitive scientists began to posit internal episodes as causes of overt behavior. These internal episodes were typically taken to be representations, and the term "theory" was applied to posited representational structures of sufficient complexity. For example, cognitive scientists seeking to explain our capacity to manipulate middle-sized physical objects posited an internally represented theory of dynamics, often referred to as "folk physics". (See for example McCloskey 1983.) It was only natural, therefore, that cognitive scientists adopted the explanatory strategy of positing internally represented theories when they attempted to explain our folk capacity to predict and explain behavior. The label "folk psychology" was widely adopted for that posit.
It is worth mentioning a third historical strand. Since at least the 1940s social psychologists have been interested in our capacity to attribute mental states to others. In an important early study, Heider and Simmel showed subjects a short movie which consisted of geometric shapes moving on a screen (Heider & Simmel 1944). When asked to report what they saw, almost every subject attributed propositional attitudes to the shapes, suggesting the existence of a universal and largely automatic capacity for propositional attitude attribution. In subsequent decades, social psychologists explored the accuracy and limitations of this capacity. For example, Nisbett and Wilson (1977) investigated a range of circumstances under which subjects mispredict behavior, and discovered that the circumstances under which mispredictions occur are just those circumstances under which subjects offer contrived or confabulated explanations of behavior.
On the externalist account of folk psychology, folk psychology is a theory of mind implicit in our everyday talk about mental states. In the everyday traffic of our lives we make remarks linking sensory experiences to mental states; mental states to other mental states; and mental states to behavior. Thus we remark that the smell of freshly baked bread made Sally feel hungry; that Sally wanted to go on a diet because she thought that she was overweight; and that Sally went to the fridge because she desired a piece of chocolate cake. According to some philosophers, remarks such as these (or suitable generalisations of remarks such as these) function as a term-introducing theory which implicitly defines terms such as "believe", "want" and "desire". (See for example Lewis 1972.)
On the internalist account of folk psychology, folk psychology is a theory of human psychology which is represented in the mind-brain and which underpins our everyday capacity to predict and explain the behavior of ourselves and others. On this view, folk psychology is a data structure or knowledge representation which mediates between our observations of behavior-in-circumstances and our predictions and explanations of that behavior.
In the following two sections I give further details about the externalist and internalist accounts of folk psychology, respectively. In the final section I raise some issues about the relationship between folk psychology (internal) and folk psychology (external). However, before moving on it will be helpful to introduce a further piece of terminology which is often used in the literature.
The claim that our everyday understanding of mental states constitutes a folk theory of mind is often called the "theory theory". We have seen that two senses of "folk psychology" can be distinguished; similarly, two senses of "theory theory" can be distinguished. On the externalist reading of "theory theory", our everyday talk about mental states implicitly constitutes a theory of mind: folk psychology (external). On the internalist reading of "theory theory", our everyday capacity to predict and explain behavior is underpinned by an internally represented theory of mind: folk psychology (internal). Unfortunately, theory theorists are not always as clear as one might hope about which sense of "theory theory" they are endorsing.
Collect all the platitudes ... regarding the causal relations of mental states, sensory stimuli, and motor responses. ... Add also all the platitudes to the effect that one mental state falls under another ... Perhaps there are platitudes of other forms as well. Include only the platitudes which are common knowledge amongst us: everyone knows them, everyone knows that everyone else knows them, and so on. (Lewis 1972: 256.)Having assembled the platitudes we can then form their conjunction. Let m1, ... , mn be the mental state terms used in these platitudes. We can then express the conjunction of platitudes as:
S1(m1, ... ,mn) & S2(m1, ... ,mn) & ... & Sj(m1, ... ,mn)where each Si(m1, ... ,mn) is a sentence in which some or all of the mental state terms mi occur. This conjunction will also contain a variety of terms which name non-mental states. For example, it will contain terms referring to types of sensory input (sharp blows; bright lights; gentle strokings) and to types of behavioral output (saying "ouch"; shielding the eyes; smiling). Following Lewis we can call these terms the O-terms (O1, ... , On). In the interests of clarity, these terms have been suppressed.
We can now replace (each occurrence of) mental state term mi by a corresponding free variable xi:
S1(x1, ... ,xn) & S2(x1, ... ,xn) & ... & Sj(x1, ... ,xn)Prefixing an existential quantifier we obtain the Ramsey sentence for folk psychology:
x1 ... xn[S1(x1, ... ,xn) & S2(x1, ... ,xn) & ... & Sj(x1, ... ,xn)]The Ramsey sentence for folk psychology says that there exists a set of entities x1, ... ,xn which exhibit just those relations which the states named by the term m1, ... , mn exhibit. It is possible to obtain from the Ramsey sentence an explicit definition of any mental state term mi. (See Lewis 1972 for the formal details.) Lewis has thus shown how to obtain an explicit definition of any mental state term mi from the collected platitudes; in other words, he has shown how we can treat our everyday talk about mental states as a term-introducing theory of mind.
To clarify Lewis's Ramsey sentence approach, assume that our everyday talk about mental states consists of just three platitudes:
P1 Bodily damage causes pain.
P2 People who are in pain experience acute distress.
P3 People who are in pain nurse the afflicted body part.These platitudes express the causal relationships between bodily damage and pain; between pain and states of acute distress; and between pain and a certain sort of behavior (nursing the afflicted body part).
Using "m1" for "pain" and "m2" for "acute distress", we can write the conjunction of P1 to P3 as:
S1(m1) & S2(m1, m2) & S3(m1)Once again the O-terms have been suppressed in the interests of clarity, but it is worth bearing in mind that the O-terms include a name referring to bodily damage and a name referring to a certain sort of behavior, viz, nursing the afflicted body part.
Replacing m1 and m2 with free variables x1 and x2, respectively, we obtain:
S1(x1) & S2(x1, x2) & S3(x1).Prefixing an existential quantifier we obtain the Ramsey sentence for our toy theory:
x1, x2[S1(x1) & S2(x1, x2) & S3(x1)].The Ramsey sentence says that there exists states x1 and x2 that (respectively) play the roles accorded to pain and acute distress by the platitudes P1 to P3.
From the Ramsey sentence we can obtain an explicit definition of, say, m1. (Again readers are encouraged to consult Lewis 1972 for the formal details.)
m1 (ie pain) = the unique x1 such that x1 is caused by bodily damage, causes acute distress, and causes the nursing of the afflicted body part.Notice that the definition of m1 was obtained from the platitudes: nothing was added during the process of defining m1. It is clear, therefore, that the definition was implicit in the platitudes all along.
This example makes it clear that Lewis is primarily concerned with those platitudes which detail "the causal relations of mental states, sensory stimuli, and motor responses" (Lewis 1972: 256). Lewis is therefore interpreting folk psychology as a functionalist theory; that is, as a theory which identifies mental states in terms of their causal-functional relations. Indeed, some authors use the terms "theory theory" and "functionalism" interchangeably. Attractive though Lewis's position is, it is at least partly hostage to fortune. For it is an open question whether the theory implicit in our everyday platitudes about mental states really is a strictly functionalist one. Many authors have doubted that, for example, our talk about qualia can be adequately cashed out in functionalist terms. (See for example Chalmers 1996.) Indeed, it is an open question whether our everyday talk about mental states is sufficiently systematic to support Lewis's Ramsey sentence approach.
There is, moreover, a largely empirical question to be raised about folk psychology (external). For even if we accept that our everyday talk about mental states implicitly constitutes a theory of mind, it remains to be determined if that theory is true. Maybe future research in psychology or neuroscience will establish that folk psychology (external) is false. And if folk psychology (external) is false, it would seem to follow that there are no such thing as beliefs and desires, pains, hungers and tickles. This surprising doctrine is called eliminativism, and has been a major focus of discussion amongst philosophers of mind over the last 15 years. (See Churchland 1981; Horgan & Woodward 1985.)
It is important to stress that internalist theory theorists need not be committed to any particular theory of mental representation. In particular, they need not be committed to the language of thought hypothesis. Folk psychology (internal) may be represented in the language of thought, or by a distributed connectionist network, or by some other means. (This point is well made by Stich & Nichols 1992.) Of course, since theories are essentially representational structures, theory theory (internal) is incompatible with radically anti-representationalist theories of mind. I will not, though, consider anti-representationalism further.
It is also important to stress that internalist theory theorists need not be committed to the claim that folk psychology (internal) is learned in the way that we learn, say, physics or chemistry. (It is here that the analogy with Newtonian mechanics breaks down.) Some internalist theory theorists have argued that folk psychology is indeed largely learned (see Gopnik & Wellman 1992). That position has been challenged by a version of Chomsky's "poverty of stimulus" argument. Empirical studies suggest that young children become fairly competent folk psychologists by four or five years (Wimmer & Perner 1983). Is it really plausible that four year olds have been exposed to sufficient examples of behavior-in-circumstance to construct, via the principles of induction, full-blown folk psychology?
Other internalist theory theorist argue that folk psychology (internal) is largely innate; or at least that we are born with a mechanism dedicated to the acquisition of folk psychology (see for example Fodor 1992 and Carruthers 1996: especially Section 1.7). There are strong parallels here with debates about nativism in psycholinguistics. Some psycholinguists argue that our capacity to use language is a product of natural selection (see for example Pinker 1994). Similarly, some internalist theory theorists argue that our capacity to predict and explain behavior is a product of natural selection (see for example Baron-Cohen 1992).
It should be clear that the theory theory (internal) is a very attractive doctrine. Nevertheless, it has not remained unchallenged. Simulation theorists have argued that our mentalizing capacity is not primarily a capacity to theorize but is rather a capacity to simulate the mental processes of others. (See folk psychology, as simulation.) The debate between simulationists and internalist theory theorists has both philosophical and empirical dimensions, and it is fair to say that, at present, the issue is very much open. (For an excellent introduction to this debate see Davies & Stone 1995.)
The previous paragraph assumed that the theory theory is true on both its internalist and its externalist readings. But if simulation theory is true, our capacity to mentalize is not underpinned by folk psychology (internal) and so the internalist version of the theory theory is false. Note, though, that the externalist version of the theory theory could remain true even if the internalist version were false: simulation theory is compatible with the idea that our everyday talk about mental states implicitly constitutes a theory of mind. These options, and the consequences for eliminativism, are considered in more detail in Stich & Ravenscroft 1994.
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First published: September 22, 1997
Content last modified: October 1, 1997