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Some copies of De modi significandi attribute the work to an early 14th-century English cleric named Thomas of Occam, but scholars have been skeptical about this because it occurs in just a handful 15th-century manuscripts. The vast majority of the manuscript evidence, and all of the earliest witnesses, refer to its author as Thomas of Erfurt.
De modis significandi proved to be so popular that it became the standard (and later, the representative) text for the Modist tradition (see next section). It exists in over forty 14th- and 15th-century manuscripts. A printed edition appeared in the late 15th century that was reprinted an incredible 11 times before its definitive reprinting in Luke Wadding's 1639 edition of the complete works of Duns Scotus.
There was already a grammatical concept of the modi significandi by the time the first Modistae, Martin of Dacia and Boethius of Dacia, appeared in Paris sometime before 1270. Originally, the idea referred to the different ways in which a word or expression (dictio) is able to signify something. Words themselves are the product of a primary act of imposition by which a particular utterance is connected with some thing or property of a thing, the utterance providing the matter, which in turn is said to be informed by the act of imposition. The word acquires its modi significandi through a second act of imposition encoding all of the general syntactic roles it can play in connection with other words and expressions, i.e., the various parts of speech it can fulfill (e.g., noun, verb, adverb) and the grammatical forms of these parts (e.g., the gender, number, and case of nouns; the tense and mood of verbs). These modes are said to cause the various lexical forms exhibited by the word in spoken and written languages. Thus, Latin uses the word canis to signify what English speakers mean by dog, but the same modes of signifying determine their function as singular and as nouns. We might think of modi significandi metaphorically as hooks or fasteners on a word because they reflect its potential for combination with other words in propositions and other grammatically well-formed constructions.
It is easy to see how such an account of meaning could lead to a bona fide theory of grammar, what Jan Pinborg has called the first systematic syntax developed in western linguistics. Indeed, speculative grammarians of both periods have attracted the attention of linguists and philosophers alike. But the stakes were higher for the Modistae because the influx of Aristotle's writings on metaphysics and natural philosophy in the late 12th and early 13th centuries forced everyone to think in terms of a new paradigm of knowledge. Could grammar be conceived as the science of language (scientia sermocinalis)? The question here was whether grammar could count as an Aristotelian speculative science, i.e., whether it is demonstrative in the sense of being a knowledge-producing activity ordained by a single subject whose principles are universal and necessary. Concerns of this sort clearly underlie Boethius of Dacia's appraisal of traditional grammar:
subjects in which a demonstrative mode of knowing is possible are seldom taught in a demonstrative way, but descriptively [sed modo narrativo] That is why Priscian states many conclusions for which he offers no reasons, but merely the authority of ancient grammarians. Accordingly, he does not teach, for only those who offer reasons for what they say are teachers.
Thomas of Erfurt indicates in the opening lines of De modis significativis that he aims to be one of these teachers:
The rationale of the method. Since in all science, to understand and to know come about from the knowledge of principles, as is written in I Physics, text comment 1, therefore, wishing to have knowledge of the science of grammar, it is primarily necessary for us to dwell upon all of its primary per se principles of which modes are the modes of signifying. But before knowledge is sought after in the particulars, there are certain things to be set out in advance in general, without which it is not possible to have the fullest understanding of them. (DMS, Preamble; Bursill-Hall: 1)
For Modistae such as Boethius of Dacia and Thomas of Erfurt, the proper subject of grammar is well-formed, significant speech (sermo congrue significativus), the principles of which are expressed in the modi significandi.
But this is where things get interesting, for the Modistae also understood the theory of the modi significandi to involve claims about the nature of thought and reality. The problem with Priscian, as 12th-century grammarians had pointed out, is that he said nothing about what causes the different parts of speech. Hence the need for a theory of the modi significandi. But the Modistae saw that this could only be part of the answer, for grammar is a linguistic phenomenon, and linguistic phenomena must have a cause within the natural order of things. Therefore, to complete the explanation, they argued that the formal structure of the modi significandi owes its existence to modi intelligendi, or modes of understanding, which in turn are caused by modi essendi, or the modes of being a thing can exhibit outside the mind.
The heart of the Modist project is the assumption that there is a triadic or parallel relationship between word, concept, and thing. Meaning is based proximately on understanding but ultimately on being. According to Thomas of Erfurt:
Every mode of signifying is from some property of the thing. Concerning the second thing to be noted, that since such notions or modes of signifying are not fictions, it must be that every mode of signifying radically originates from some property of the thing. This is plain thus: since the intellect, in order to signify, imposes the voice under some mode of signifying, it considers the property itself of the thing from which it originally drew the mode of signifying; this is because the intellect, since it is a passive power indeterminate of itself, does not advance to a determinate act unless it is determined from another source. Whence since it imposes the voice in order to signify under the determinate mode of signifying, it is necessarily moved by a determinate property of the thing; therefore some property of a thing, or mode of being of a thing, corresponds to any mode of signifying. (DMS, 2.4; Bursill-Hall: 3)
Note the phrase, since such notions or modes of signifying are not fictions. The modi significandi could not play any causal role in determining the parts of speech, nor the corresponding modi intelligendi in determining the modi significandi, nor the modi essendi in determining the modi intelligendi, unless they all actually exist. Here the Modistae drew on the Aristotelian idea that although spoken sounds and written marks differ from language to language, what these are in the first place signs of - affections of the soul - are the same for all; and what these affections are likenesses of - actual things - are also the same (De interpretatione 1.16a3-9). Likewise, the ordering of the modes was intended to replicate the ordering of disciplines in Aristotelian speculative science: just as psychology, the study of moving things qua animate, is subordinate to physics, the study of things qua moving, and physics is subordinate to metaphysics, the study of things qua existing, so the principles of grammar (modi significandi) are derived from mental acts of signifying (modi intelligendi), which reflect the way things actually are (modi essendi).
Tidy conceptual schemes tend to become less so when confronted with the facts. The Modistae spent a lot of time trying to explain recalcitrant linguistic data. After sketching the origins of the modi significandi in the first chapters of his treatise, Thomas immediately considers a few objections: how can goddess [dea] be signified with a feminine noun, which connotes passivity? Answer: a mode of signifying need not always be drawn from the thing signified, for sometimes it can be taken from the property of the thing of another utterance; thus, when we say in God, we do not mean to attribute a passive property to God, who suffers not, but only to imagine him as if being affected by our prayers. When we use a passive or feminine mode of signifying in relation to God, what we are really doing is signifying our own passive or feminine conception of some other thing that is a genuine recipient, i.e., something that does correspond to a determinate mode of being qua recipient, and then imposing the same word to signify God. In the same way, we impose names on things we cannot sense via the properties of sensible things, thereby attributing active modes of signifying to their names (DMS 2.5; Bursill-Hall: 4).
But what about words signifying fictions, such as chimera, or privations, such as blindness? These do not correspond to any mode of being, active or passive, since they signify nothing (i.e., no thing). According to Thomas, the active modes of signifying chimeras are taken from the parts from which we imagine a chimera to be composed, which [fiction] we imagine from the head of a lion, the tail of a dragon, etc.” (DMS 2.5; Bursill-Hall: 4) Names of privations, on the other hand, designate the modes of understanding of privations, which are their modes of being, through their own active modes of signifying about privations. The idea here is that blindness corresponds to our positive concept of sight qua absent, which enjoys a positive modus essendi in our intellects. Thus, although privations are not positive beings outside the soul, they are nevertheless positive beings in the soul … and since the understanding of them is their being, therefore, their mode of understanding would be their mode of being (DMS 2.6; Bursill-Hall: 4). Blindness outside the soul cannot cause any conception of itself per se, since blindness per se does not exist, and what does not exist cannot be the cause of anything. Accordingly, when we say, Homer was a blind man, the word blind actively signifies the passive mode of understanding something as being without sight, and owes its semantic function to the way its corresponding concept is understood. In the case of concepts that are neither fictions nor privations, these modes of understanding are further determined by their corresponding modes of being, i.e., by actual substances and properties outside the soul.
For the Modistae, then, the words chimera and horse differ, but only in terms of the complexity of their underlying modes. Thomas follows Siger of Courtrai in distinguishing between active and passive modi significandi/modi intelligendi to explain the difference between the act of signifying/understanding (materially construed as a property of the utterance/concept) and the object signified/understood (materially construed as a property of the thing signified/understood). The fact that nothing answers to the name chimera simply does not matter. Modism was a theory about meaning (significatio) of a word as opposed to its reference (suppositio), and reference was regarded as something determined by the logicians. Besides, if grammatical truths are universal and necessary -- i.e., if there really is a science of grammar -- then they cannot be altered by the fact that there are no chimeras. It is the assumption that some palpable phenomenon must underlie every grammatical truth, causing it to be the way it is, which guides Thomas's discussion in the remainder of the treatise, which soon moves on to more practical matters such as the different parts of speech (Etymologia) and their syntax (Diasynthetica). Included in the latter are the concepts of constructio (the syntactic joining of one word to another), congruitas (the proper formation of such constructions), and perfectio (the proper formation of complete expressions).
Modist explanations of semantic phenomena were extremely complicated. Indeed, if we consider the manifold ways in which a word can be a signifier together with its potential for combination with other words in expressions, there could be infinitely many modi significandi -- a proliferation of modes repeated all over again at the level of modi intelligendi. Philosophers today think of Meinong's theory of objects as a paradigm case of ontological incontinence. These philosophers have never met the Modistae, who would make even Meinong seem parsimonious. But in a way this is unfair, of course, since the Modistae were not ontologists and had no interest in the metaphysical consequences of their theories. They were first and foremost concerned with the phenomenon of linguistic meaning, and invoked whatever entities they felt could best explain what they observed.
Thomas's De modis significandi was the last work to develop Modist doctrine to any significant degree. Its clarity and relative brevity led to its adoption as the standard Modist text in medieval universities, replacing the earlier Modi significandi of Martin of Dacia. But by 1330 and for reasons that remain unclear, Modism had completely disappeared from Paris, pushed aside by the more powerful and comprehensive approach of the Summulae de dialectica of John Buridan (ca. 1300-1361). Modism was never able to overcome certain difficulties, such as its refusal to recognize extra-linguistic context, as a result of which it could not explain how meaning can be communicated via incongruous or imperfect expressions. But the most likely reason for its demise was that it no longer provided satisfying explanations of the phenomena it was supposed to explain. The one thing it could do, provide an account for the syntax of Latin grammar, could be achieved more economically by other means. In addition, the theory became absurdly complicated in order to save the phenomena of the modi significandi, suggesting that the modi finally collapsed under their own weight, like so many Ptolemaic epicycles.
One of the many later figures to have unwittingly admired Thomas was the American philosopher, Charles Sanders Peirce (1839-1914), who regarded Duns Scotus as a fellow traveler in metaphysics and whose own semiotic theory resembles the Modist program in certain respects. Peirce quotes verbatim the first six chapters of De modis significandis in an 1869 lecture comparing the views of (what he took to be) Duns Scotus and William of Ockham on names and signification. But the lecture is introductory in character, leaving it uncertain whether Peirce fully appreciated what was at stake in Modistic grammar, rather than viewing it, say, as some sort of linguistic addendum to Scotus's metaphysics.
Another figure so influenced was Martin Heidegger, whose Habilitationsschrift was published in 1916 under the title, Die Kategorien- und Bedeutungslehre des Duns Scotus. This book has not been much studied by Heidegger scholars, which is a pity because it is more about Heidegger's own project of advancing the Husserlian notion of a priori grammar than a work of philosophical exposition and interpretation. In what now seems a classic understatement, the historian of medieval philosophy Martin Grabmann wrote of this book in 1926, Martin Heidegger has demonstrated the continuity of the Grammatica speculativa hitherto attributed to Duns Scotus with the terminology and overall intellectual outlook of Husserl, so that the structure and distinctiveness of the medieval original is somewhat obscured. In his defense, Heidegger never pretends to be doing history of philosophy in Die Kategorien- und Bedeutungslehre des Duns Scotus. On the contrary, he states at the beginning of Part II that he is mostly interested in exploring the implications of De modis significandi for the broader theory of meaning, and that he is following scholarly consensus in attributing it to Duns Scotus.
In 1922, however, Grabmann conclusively demonstrated that it was Thomas of Erfurt who wrote De modis significandi, not Duns Scotus. So the claim that Heidegger wrote his Habilitationsschrift on Duns Scotus is only partly true. The first half, die Kategorienlehre, is correctly addressed to Duns Scotus's theory of the categories as developed in his authentic commentaries on Porphyry's Isagoge, and Aristotle's Categories and De sophisticis elenchis. But the second half, die Bedeutungslehre, is based almost entirely on Thomas of Erfurt.
For more recent influence, we need look no
further than Jacques Derrida, who mentions Thomas (this time dressed as
himself) in connection with the old Peircean idea that logic is a
branch of semiotics: As in Husserl (but the analogy, although it is
most thought-provoking, would stop there and one must apply it
carefully), the lowest level, the foundation of the possibility of
logic (or semiotics) corresponds to the project of the Grammatica
speculativa of Thomas d'Erfurt, falsely attributed to Duns
What impresses Derrida is not so much the reduction of logic to
grammar as the deconstructive potential of Husserl's
phenomenology of signs. The idea of deconstructing the science of
language would have struck Thomas as absurd, of course, though he
probably would have felt some affinity with the highly variegated
notion of the sign in modern semiotics.
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First published: May 6, 2002
Content last modified: May 6, 2002