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Epiphenomenalism arose in a 19th century context in which a dualistic view of mental events was assumed to be correct. The first part of our discussion -- Traditional Arguments -- will be phrased in a style that reflects this dualistic presupposition. By contrast, many contemporary discussions work within a background assumption of the preferability of materialist monism. One might have supposed that this position would have put an end to the need to investigate epiphenomenalism; but, as we shall see under Arguments in the Age of Materialism, such a supposition is far from being the case. A brief outline of both discussions follows.
The central motivation for epiphenomenalism lies in the premise that all physical events have sufficient causes that lie within the class of physical events. If a mental event is something other than a physical event, then for it to make any causal contribution of its own in the physical world would require a violation of physical law. Descartes' (1649) interactionist model proposed that nonphysical events could cause small changes in the shape of the pineal gland. But such nonphysical effects, however slight, would mean that the physical account of motion is false -- for that account says that there will be no such change of shape unless there is a physical force that causes it.
One may try to rescue mental efficacy by supposing that whenever there is a mental effect in the physical world there is also a physical force that is a sufficient cause of the effect. This view, however, both offends Occamist principles and fails to satisfy the leading anti-epiphenomenalist intuition, namely, that the mental makes a difference to the physical, i.e., that it leads to behavior that would not have happened in absence of the mental. The view also leads to an epistemological problem: If there is always a sufficient physical cause for behavior, then one could never be in a position where one needs to suppose there is anything further. Thus, on the assumption of physical sufficiency, there could never be any reason to introduce mental causes into one's account of behavior.
Many contemporary thinkers would respond to the central motivation for epiphenomenalism by denying its dualistic presupposition, i.e., by holding that mental events are identical with physical events, and may therefore have physical effects. Discussion of this type of response will be given below in the Remarks on Kim's Way Out. Here it may be observed, however, that the argument stated in the previous two paragraphs is not supposed to be an argument for dualism, but only for adopting epiphenomenalism, once dualism is accepted.
Further support for epiphenomenalism can be derived from the fact, noted by Wilhelm Wundt (1912), that "each simple sensation is joined to a very complicated combination of peripheral and central nerve processes", together with the fact that the causes of behavior are likewise complex neural events. This latter fact makes it natural to look for complex events throughout the causal chain leading to behavior; and these can be found in the neural events that are required for the occurrence of simple sensations. The sensations themselves could not contribute to behavior without first having neural effects that are more complex than themselves. Thus an anti-epiphenomenalist stance would require us to prefer the hypothesis that simple sensations cause (relatively) complex neural events over the hypothesis that complex neural events (that are required in any case for the causation of sensations) are adequate to cause the neural events required for the causation of behavior.
This argument is surely the briefest of those against epiphenomenalism, but it may have been more persuasive than any other. Epiphenomenalists, however, can make the following reply. First, it can never be obvious what causes what. Animated cartoons are full of causal illusions. Falling barometers are regularly followed by storms, but do not cause them. More generally, a regularity is causal only if it is not explained as a consequence of underlying regularities. It is part of epiphenomenalist theory, however, that the regularities that we observe to hold between mental events and actions can be explained by underlying regularities. Schematically, suppose physical event P1 causes both mental event M and physical successor P2, as in Figure 1.
M | P1 --> P2 --> P3 --> ... (Figure 1)
Suppose there is no other cause of M, and no other cause of P2. Then every M will be followed by P2, yet the cause of P2 will be adequately found in P1. It is true that, under the assumptions stated, the counterfactual, "If M had not occurred, then P2 would not have occurred" holds; but then, so may "if the barometer had not fallen, the storm would not have occurred." The moral to be drawn is that causation may imply that certain counterfactuals hold, but the holding of counterfactuals is not enough to show causation. So, the fact that under normal conditions, some of our actions would not have occurred unless we had had certain mental events cannot show that those actions are caused by our mental events (rather than being caused by the physical causes of those mental events).
It is often said that pains cause withdrawals of affected parts of the body. In extreme cases, however -- for example in a case of touching a hot stove -- it can be observed that the affected part is withdrawn before the pain is felt. These cases cannot show that pain never causes withdrawals, but they do show that pain is not necessary as a cause of withdrawals. In less extreme cases, it is open to the epiphenomenalist to hold that the causal order is the same as in the extreme cases (i.e., some physical event, P1, causes both withdrawal and pain) but is not ordinarily recognized to be so.
According to the same biology that embraces natural selection, however, behavior has muscular causes, which in turn have neural causes. Barring neural events that are inexplicably in violation of biological constraints on their conditions of activation, there must be an adequate physical cause of every link in the causal chain leading to behavior. Thus, it is easily understood how certain kinds of neural events can be selected for. Epiphenomenalists hold that conscious events are effects of (certain) neural events. Thus, it fits well in their view that we have the conscious events we do because the neural causes of these events have been selected for. Indeed, if neural causes of behavior are selected for, and are sufficient causes, there cannot be any further effect attributed to natural selection.
William James (1879; 1890) offered an intriguing variant of the argument from natural selection. If pleasures and pains have no effects, there would seem to be no reason why we might not abhor the feelings that are caused by activities essential to life, or enjoy the feelings produced by what is detrimental. Thus, if epiphenomenalism (or, in James' own language, automaton-theory) were true, the felicitous alignment that generally holds between affective valuation of our feelings and the utility of the activities that generally produce them would require a special explanation. Yet on epiphenomenalist assumptions, this alignment could not receive a genuine explanation. The felicitous alignment could not be selected for, because if affective valuation had no behavioral effects, misalignment of affective valuation with utility of the causes of the evaluated feelings could not have any behavioral effects either. Epiphenomenalists would simply have to accept a brute and unscientific view of pre-established harmony of affective valuation of feelings and the utility of their causes.
Epiphenomenalists can meet James' argument, however, by supposing that both the pleasantness of pleasant feelings and the feelings themselves depend on neural causes (and analogously for painfulness and disliked qualities). So long as both types of neural events are efficacious in the production of behavior, their combination can be selected for, and thus the felicitous alignment of feelings with evaluation can be explained. Moreover, the supposition that the neural causes of both evaluation and feeling qualities should have behavioral effects is independently plausible: on grounds of natural selection, there should be both a preference system for quick action and a system that fosters discriminability, for use in longer term planning; and these must, in general, work together in a successful organism.
The first premise of this argument is a widely held dogma, but epiphenomenalists can deny it without evident absurdity. It is perfectly obvious to everyone that the bodies of human beings are very much alike in their construction, and it requires no sophisticated reasoning to infer that if others are made like me, they probably hurt when affected like me, e.g., when their bodies are stuck with pins, beaten, cut and so on. There is no principle that makes an inference from similar effects to similar causes more secure than an inference from similar causes to similar effects; on the contrary, the latter inference is more secure, because there can sometimes be different causes of undetectably similar effects. Thus, an inference to other minds that is allowed by epiphenomenalism must be at least as strong as the inferential route to other minds with which it is incompatible.
The argument that is given to support the destructive claims is that (i) knowledge of one's mental events requires that these events cause one's knowledge, but (ii) epiphenomenalism denies physical effects of mental events. So, either we cannot know our own mental events, or our knowledge of them cannot be what is causing the plainly physical event of our saying something about our mental events. Thus, suppose S is an epiphenomenalist, and that S utters "I am in terrible pain." S is committed to the view that the pain does not cause the utterance. But then, it seems, S would be making the same utterance whether or not a pain were occurring. If this is so, then S's testimonies about S's own pains are worthless -- both to us and to S. They cannot be taken to represent any knowledge about pains on S's part (if S's epiphenomenalist view is true). In fact, on an epiphenomenalist view, all the arguments for epiphenomenalism and rebuttals to counterarguments we have reviewed might be given even if we were all zombies -- i.e., even if we were all possessed of physical causes of our utterances and completely devoid of any mental life whatsoever.
The argument that epiphenomenalism is self-stultifying in the way just described rests on the premise that knowledge of a mental event requires causation by that mental event. But epiphenomenalists may reject that premise without absurdity. One way of seeing how to do this involves considering the interactionist diagram in Fig.2, which shows P1 as directly causing M but not P2, and M directly causing P2. (Directly causing is an intransitive relation. Causation (when used without modifier) is transitive: events are causally related if there is a chain of direct causes, however long, that connects them.)
M \ | C \ P1 P2 --> P3 --> .... (Figure 2)
Now consider P3, which is directly caused by P2 and which we will assume to cause (directly or indirectly) further behavior such as S's utterance of "I am in terrible pain". P3 is not directly caused by M. Does it convey knowledge of M? If we answer negatively, on the ground that P3 is not directly caused by M, we will be rejecting interactionism for virtually the same reason that epiphenomenalism is thought to be unacceptable. Since this is an extremely implausible stance, let us take it that P3 does convey knowledge of M. But what property does P3 actually have that makes it a case of conveying knowledge of M? Epiphenomenalists will wish to point out that P3 does not have any property that contains information as to how it was caused. Looking backward from P3, so to speak, one cannot tell whether it was indirectly caused by M (as in the interactionistic Fig. 2) or indirectly caused by M's cause (as in the epiphenomenalistic Fig. 1). There is, however, a property that P3 does have that is intuitively strongly connected to its conveying knowledge of M -- namely, that it would not be occurring unless M had recently occurred. But P3 has this property on epiphenomenalist and interactionist views alike. Thus, if not occurring unless M has recently occurred is the property that is responsible for P3's conveying knowledge of M, epiphenomenalists have as much right as anyone to claim that P3 conveys knowledge of M, and they are not debarred from knowing what they claim to know.
Critics of epiphenomenalism can of course point out that there is a property that interactionism, but not epiphenomenalism, assigns to P3 -- namely, the property of being indirectly caused by M. Epiphenomenalists, however, are likely to think that the intuitive connection between this property and knowledge is much weaker than that between knowledge of M and the fact that P3 would not be occurring unless M had recently occurred. In fact, they may hold that the relevance of indirect causation is exhausted by its ensuring that P3 would not occur unless M had recently occurred. They can then reiterate that there is another way of ensuring that this condition holds, namely, the set of relations, diagrammed in Fig. 1, that is affirmed by epiphenomenalism.
The foregoing way of responding to the self-stultification argument is further explained and defended in Robinson (1982b). An alternative response can be found in Chalmers (1996). Chalmers' property-dualistic view holds that there is more to a person than just a brain and a body. It allows for persons to be directly acquainted with experiences, and it is this direct acquaintance, rather than any causal relation, that justifies our beliefs about experiences. On this view, experiences are partially constitutive of beliefs about experiences, and "the justification of my belief [about experiences] accrues not just in virtue of my physical features but in virtue of some of my nonphysical features -- namely the experiences themselves" (Chalmers, 1996, p. 198). In supplying non-causal relations to support the claim to knowledge of experiences, this view disconnects the knowledge question from the question of how things stand causally, and thus avoids the self-stultification argument.
Questions about epiphenomenalism, however, arise the moment any distinction is made between the mental properties and the physical properties of an event. There are several ways of doing this within a broadly materialist monism. The following discussion will briefly indicate two ways in which this distinction can be made, and the kind of epiphenomenalistic questions that ensue.
It should be noted that most recent writers take a somewhat dogmatic position against epiphenomenalism. They presume that epiphenomenalism is to be avoided, and they go to great lengths to try to show that they have avoided incurring that anathema, despite maintaining the sufficiency of physical causation in conjunction with some kind of distinction between the mental and the physical.
(2) The same point can be reached through a somewhat different route. Many philosophers hold an externalist view of intentionality, according to which intentionality requires representation, and representation depends on circumstances external to the body of the representing subject. (To illustrate with Putnam's (1975) famous example from Twin Earth, what a thought that S might express by "This is water" is actually about depends on what the transparent, tasteless liquid in S's environment actually is.) It seems, however, that the causal determinants of S's behavior can depend only on events occurring inside S's body. Thus, if externalism is right, what S does cannot depend on S's thoughts.
This conclusion is compatible with holding that a proper description of S's behavior should refer to circumstances external to S. For example, describing S as reaching for a glass of water may not be appropriate unless S believes the glass contains water; and that this is what S believes may depend on circumstances external to S. But then, it is at least tempting to conclude that it cannot be S's belief (at least not S's belief fully described in intentional terms) that is causing the extension of S's arm toward the glass. After all, S's twin-earth double has, in some sense, a different belief (one that refers to XYZ) but the internal bodily story of the causation of the double's arm-extension will be exactly the same as the story for S (up to substitution of XYZ in the double's body wherever S has an H2O molecule).
Consider the world of pumps. These come in different kinds -- piston, diaphragm, rotary, etc. The status of an object as a pump arguably depends on its being part of a larger system. For example, we can use a fan to pump some noxious gas from one room to another, or to the outside of a building; but if we set a fan on the lawn, it may beat the air, but is not (functioning as) a pump. Pumps have causal properties -- e.g., they can move fluids. They have these causal properties in virtue of the properties of their parts; e.g., the imperviousness (to gas molecules) and angle of the fan blade cause gas molecules that hit it to move in certain directions.
The properties just listed match properties of mental events, on many views of the latter. Thus, the same belief (i.e., belief in the truth of the same proposition) may be realized as different neural states in different people (or the same person at different times); an occurrence of a belief in a (part of a) brain would not have the causal properties it is often thought of as having unless it were surrounded by a functioning whole brain and body; and a belief would not have the causal properties it is often thought of as having unless it had a neural constitution that could affect other neural (and eventually muscular) events.
Now, let us imagine a "pump epiphenomenalist" (P-Eist), who argues as follows. "Pumps have no efficacy. Of course, objects are caused to be pumps, i.e., their being pumps is a consequence of their parts having the properties they have and standing in the relations in which they stand. But all the causal work of pumps is explained by the properties and relations of the parts. It would be ludicrous to say that the movement of fluids has two causes, i.e., the push of the blades and the pumping. Explanation of the movements of fluids in terms of such things as rigidity and motion of the pump's parts has to be mentioned in any full account of those movements, and this kind of explanation explains everything that needs to be explained; thus the explanation in terms of rigidity and motion of the pump's parts excludes the property of being a pump from any explanatory role. Our intuition that pumps move fluids is just an illusion. Being a pump is a mere epiphenomenal property."
What the P-Eist says about pumps is in every way correct -- except for the conclusion. Thus, if mental event properties are analogous to the property of being a pump, then all the reasons that lead to epiphenomenalism can be granted, without granting the epiphenomenalist conclusion. Or, to put the matter somewhat differently, if epiphenomenalism leaves mental event properties no worse off than the property of being a pump, then we can accept epiphenomenalism of mental event properties with equanimity. Despite the points made in the preceding paragraph, we will not feel that we are making a mistake when we say that pumps move fluids; and no more should we feel that we are making a mistake if we say that S reaches for the glass because S believes it contains water.
Now, there are some mental properties for which it is plausible that the key analogy just described holds. These are the properties for which functionalism is most plausible, e.g., beliefs and desires. That is, it does not seem out of the question that a view can be sustained according to which S's neural condition at time t, in S's surrounding's at t (and, perhaps, given S's history) necessarily constitutes S as a believer of p, or a desirer of q. If such an account can be made out, then there is a robust sense to the idea that beliefs and desires are realized by the physical conditions just listed; that they are thus no worse off than pumps in the realm of efficacy; and that there will be no violation of our intuitions that S's actions occur because of what S believes and desires.
But there are other mental properties that resist the kind of story that seems plausible for beliefs and desires. As Kim again explicitly recognizes (1993, p. 366), these are the properties that have long caused difficulties for functionalism, namely, the qualities of phenomenal experiences such as pains, itches, tastes, smells, afterimages, and so on. The "explanatory gap" (Levine, 1983) or "unintelligibility" (Robinson, 1982a) in the connection between neural events and phenomenal qualities can be otherwise expressed as our inability to see any necessity in that connection. We are unable to understand why it should be that a series of neural activations occurring in various degrees of intensity and temporal relations should always be accompanied by pain, or itch, or, indeed, by any phenomenal quality whatever. Inability to see any such necessity is, of course, not a proof that such a necessity does not obtain. Nonetheless, absent insight into the necessity of the connection between neural properties and qualitative properties, we are arguably in an explanatory position similar to traditional epiphenomenalism. That is, we will have a sufficient explanation of behavioral reactions to stimuli that invokes exclusively neural properties. In addition, we may hold the view that these neural properties are necessarily connected to qualitative properties; but, lacking explanation of this necessity, this connection will contribute no understanding of how qualitative properties could make a difference to behavior. Because this difficulty has not been removed in the case of qualia, the success or failure of the previously discussed Traditional Arguments remains relevant to contemporary thinking about epiphenomenalism.
David Lewis (1988) undertakes a thorough response to the knowledge argument. Among Lewis's many considerations, there is one that seeks to enforce a connection between phenomenal information per se and epiphenomenalism. According to Lewis's argument, even if one says that phenomenal events are identical with physical events, and even if one says that phenomenal events produce physical effects in violation of physical laws, one will still be led to a form of epiphenomenalism if one says there is phenomenal information that is irreducibly different from physical information. To put the argument in ruthlessly summary form, let V1 and V2 be two possibilities for the phenomenal information that one acquires by, and only by, tasting Vegemite. Suppose that P1 is a physical state produced by the taste of Vegemite. That the taste of Vegemite has this physical effect is a piece of physical information. But this same physical information is compatible with two possibilities, (a) V1 is related by a law, L1, to P1; and (b) V2 is related by a different law, L2, to P1. Now, either of these possibilities is compatible with all the physical information we have; i.e., their difference makes no physical difference. Thus, that the phenomenal information in the taste of Vegemite is, say, V1 rather than V2 can make no difference to anything physical, i.e., V1 is epiphenomenal. Lewis's point here is not to argue for or against epiphenomenalism; rather, he assumes epiphenomenalism is false, and uses the fact that the hypothesis of phenomenal information leads to it as an argument against that hypothesis.
Denis Robinson (1993) raises the possibility that Lewis's argument can be extended to produce a far-reaching and puzzling result. Suppose that I1 and I2 are two possibilities for an intrinsic property of a basic physical entity, e.g., a quark. Everything relevant to physics can be expressed by the lawlike relations in which quarks stand to fundamental physical objects and properties. Let this set of relations be [S]. It appears that there are two possibilities, (a) I1 is related by a set of laws, [L1], to [S]; or (b) I2 is related by a different set of laws, [L2], to [S]. Either of these possibilities is compatible with all the physics we have, i.e., their difference makes no physical difference. Thus, that the intrinsic property of quarks is, say, I1 rather than I2 can make no difference to physics, i.e., I1 is epiphenomenal. The generalization of this point is that the intrinsic properties of the fundamental objects of physics must be epiphenomenal.
It thus appears that we must either (1) deny that fundamental objects of physics have any intrinsic properties, or (2) deny that Lewis's argument for the connection of phenomenal information with epiphenomenalism is sound, or (3) deny that Lewis's argument can be paralleled in the suggested way for the case of intrinsic physical properties, or (4) admit an epiphenomenalism of intrinsic properties into our view of the basic structure of physical reality.
Bertrand Russell (1927, p. 382) held the view that physical theory can reveal only causal structure, or "formal properties" of matter, and that "by examining our percepts we obtain knowledge which is not purely formal as to the matter of our brains." This idea is taken up sympathetically (with substantial reworking in a quantum mechanical context) by Lockwood (1993). Chalmers (1996) offers a useful discussion of the view, and expresses some sympathy for it. Denis Robinson (1993), however, regards intrinsic similarity of fundamental physical entities as different from similarity of phenomenal properties.
If phenomenal properties are intrinsic properties of fundamental physical objects, and the latter stand in lawlike relations, then lawlike relations will hold between phenomenal properties and some physical occurrences. This conclusion appears to give a causal role to phenomenal properties and thus to suggest a way out of epiphenomenalism. But if intrinsicality carries epiphenomenality, as D. Robinson's extension of Lewis's argument suggests, then this way out of epiphenomenalism would be blocked.
It is interesting, therefore, that the term "epiphenomenalism" does not occur in Huxley's (1874) essay on our topic; nor have I been able to find it elsewhere in his published work. (Neither does Huxley use the terms "stream of consciousness" or "brain-process".) Of course, it is possible that Huxley made oral use of "epiphenomenalism" in lecturing. This seems unlikely, however, as he had at his disposal another brief term for the view he was concerned to promote, the meaning of which would have been more immediately accessible to most audiences, namely, "automatism". This is the term that occurs in his 1874 essay, which bears the title "On the Hypothesis that Animals are Automata, and its History". Besides containing the analogy of the steam-whistle that contributes nothing to the locomotive's work, this essay compares consciousness to the sound of the bell of a clock that has no role in keeping the time, and treats volition as a symbol in consciousness of the brain-state cause of an action. As Ward correctly noted, nonefficacious mental events are referred to in this essay as "collateral products" of their physical causes. The essay is not solely concerned with animals: to the best of Huxley's judgment, "the argumentation which applies to brutes holds equally good of men".
Huxley and his contemporaries seem to have been impressed by preparations in which frogs had had various portions of their brains removed. Reasoning by analogy with humans lesioned by disease or battle, Huxley finds it plausible that the frogs are not conscious, or not exercising volition; yet when thrown into water, for example, they swim just as well as undamaged frogs. Huxley also discusses at some length the case of a Seargent F., who had sustained a shot that fractured his left parietal bone. Once or twice a month, this soldier would have a day-long bout in which he exhibited complex behavior (e.g., singing, writing a letter, "reloading", "aiming", and "firing" his cane with motions exactly appropriate to a rifle in a skirmish) while being plausibly unconscious, as evidenced by insensitivity to pins and shocks, sound, smell and taste, and to a great extent, vision. Huxley allows that there can be no direct evidence showing that the soldier is conscious or not conscious; but he concludes that he may be devoid of consciousness, while performing his complex and apparently purposeful movements.
Huxley was not alone among 19th century figures who gave vigorous and clear expositions of an epiphenomenalistic view. S. Hodgson (1870), W. K. Clifford (1874) and H. Maudsley (1886) were exponents of the view. Romanes' posthumous (1896) contains an excellent statement of the view, which was first published in the early 1880s; and William James (1879) likewise offers an early clear statement of it. Both Romanes and James follow their statements of the view with arguments against its acceptance.
None of the works just mentioned include the term "epiphenomenalism". I have located three articles in Mind in the 1890s that do use the term (the earliest, in 1893, hyphenates it as "epi-phenomenalism"). The earliest occurrence of the term for referring to automatism that I have been able to locate is in William James's The Principles of Psychology, first published in 1890. It occurs in his chapter "The Automaton-Theory" once, in scare quotes; the rest of the time, the view is referred to as the "automaton-theory" or the "conscious automaton-theory". James attributes the origination of the view to Shadworth Hodgson, in The Theory of Practice (1870). A section of this work titled "Dependence of consciousness on nerve movement" does indeed contain a forthright statement of the view (without "epiphenomenalism", "automatism" or any other "-ism" tag).
Early in his discussion of automatism, James (1890) includes some remarks about his intellectual development, and refers to his early study of medicine. "Epiphenomenon" has a use in this field, meaning a symptom concurrent with, but not causally contributory to, the course of a disease. Some early twentieth century dictionaries list only this meaning of the term; by mid-twentieth century, the focal philosophical meaning is standardly given. My present surmise is that the term "epiphenomenalism" came into philosophy from medicine in the late nineteenth century, possibly, though less certainly, through William James's use of the term in his influential Principles of Psychology (1890).
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First published: January 18, 1999
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