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Dialetheism should be clearly distinguished from trivialism, the view that all contradictions are true (and hence, assuming that a conjunction entails its conjuncts, that everything is true). Though a trivialist must be a dialetheist, the converse is not the case. Dialetheism should also be clearly distinguished from paraconsistency. An inference relation, , is explosive if, according to it, a contradiction entails everything (for all A and B: A,A B). It is paraconsistent iff it is not explosive. Dialetheists, unless they are also trivialists, must subscribe to the view that entailment (deductively valid inference) is paraconsistent. But one may subscribe to this view for other reasons; for example, that, though the actual truth is consistent, entailment must preserve what holds in non-actual situations, some of which may be inconsistent; or that entailment must preserve more than just truth, e.g., information content.
Despite the orthodoxy about the LNC, there have been a few dialetheists since Aristotle. It is arguably the case that some of the Neoplatonists were dialetheists. Nicholas of Cusa, for example, held that God has all properties, including contradictory ones (Heron, 1954, I.4). And, according to some interpretations, Meinong was a dialetheist, holding that some non-existent objects, such as the round square, have inconsistent properties (see Routley, 1980, ch.5). But the most obvious dialetheists since the Presocratics and before the 20th century are Hegel and his successors in dialectics, such as Marx and Engels (see Priest 1990, 1991). According to these, reality (in the form of Geist for Hegel, or social structures for Marx) may be literally inconsistent. For example, in the Logic, Hegel says: Something moves, not because at one moment it is here and another there, but because at one and the same moment it is here and not here, because in this "here", it at once is and is not (Miller, 1969, p. 440). Indeed, it is the resolution of these contradictory states that drives the development of the history of thought (or society) forwards.
Dialetheism appears to be a much more common and recurrent view in Eastern Philosophy than in the West. In ancient Indian logic/metaphysics, there were standardly four possibilities to be considered on any statement at issue: that it is true (only), false (only), neither true nor false, or both. Early Buddhist logic added a fifth possibility: none of these. (This was called the catushkoti.) The Jains went even further and advocated the possibility of contradictory values of the kind: true (only) and both true and false. (Smart, 1964, has a discussion of the above issues.) Contradictory utterances are a commonplace in Taoism. For example, the Chuang Tsu says: That which makes things has no boundaries with things, but for things to have boundaries is what we mean by saying "the boundaries between things". The boundaryless boundary is the boundary without a boundary (Mair, 1994, p. 218). When Buddhism and Taoism fused to form Chan (or Zen, to give it its Japanese name), a philosophy arose in which contradiction plays a central role. The very process for reaching enlightenment (Prajna) is a process, according to Suzuki (1969, p. 55), "which is at once above and in the process of reasoning. This is a contradiction, formally considered, but in truth, this contradiction is itself made possible because of Prajna."
Of course, interpreting the philosophers I have mentioned is a sensitive issue; and many commentators, especially Western ones who have wanted to make sense of their chosen philosopher whilst subscribing to the LNC, have suggested that the contradictory utterances of the philosopher in question are not really contradictory. There are a number of standard devices that may be employed here. One is to claim that the contradictory utterance is to be taken as having some non-literal form of meaning, e.g., that it is a metaphor. Another is to claim that the contradictory assertion is ambiguous in some way, and that it is true on one disambiguation (or in one respect) and false in another. It is certainly the case that contradictory utterances that one sometimes hears are best construed in some such way. Whether this is so in the case of the philosophers I have mentioned, is a matter for detailed case-by-case consideration. In most of these cases, it may be argued, such interpretations produce a manifestly inaccurate and distorted version of the views of the philosopher in question.
Probably the major argument used by modern dialetheists invokes the paradoxes of self-reference, such as the liar paradox (this sentence is not true), and Russell's paradox (concerning the set of all sets that are not members of themselves). Though paradoxes of this kind have been known since antiquity, they were thrown into prominence by developments in the foundations of mathematics at the turn of this century. In the case of each paradox, there appears to be a perfectly sound argument ending in a contradiction; and if the arguments are sound, then dialetheism is true. Of course, many have argued that the soundness of such arguments is merely an appearance, and that subtle fallacies may be diagnosed in them. Such suggestions were made in ancient and medieval logic; but many more have been made in modern logic--indeed, attacking the paradoxes has been something of a leitmotiv of modern logic. And one thing that appears to have come out of this is how resilient the paradoxes are: attempts to solve them often simply succeed in relocating the paradoxes elsewhere, as so called "strengthened" forms of the arguments show. There is, at any rate, no generally agreed upon solution to many of the paradoxes, particularly those of a semantic (as opposed to set-theoretic) nature. It is these facts that give dialetheism about the paradoxes of self-reference one of its major appeals. It is not the only one, though: the simplicity of a dialetheic account of truth, to the effect that truth is simply characterised by the T-schema, is another.
The paradoxes of self reference are not the only examples of dialetheias that have been mooted. Others include the following. (1) Transition states: when I leave the room, for an instant I am both in it and not in it. (2) Some of Zeno's paradoxes: the moving arrow is both where it is, and where it is not. (3) Certain legal situations: there are laws to the effect that persons in category A must do something, and persons in category B may not do it. Someone in both categories then turns up. (4) Borderline cases of vague predicates: an adolescent is both an adult and not an adult. (5) Certain quantum mechanical states: a particle may go through two slits simultaneously, even though this is not possible. (6) Multi-criterial terms: where a term has more than one necessary and sufficient empirical criterion for application, and these fall apart in novel circumstances. The viability of all the preceding examples depends on detailed philosophical consideration, differing from case to case.
A standard modern argument against dialetheism is to invoke the logical principle of explosion, in virtue of which dialetheism would entail trivialism. Given that trivialism is absurd, which we may agree upon here (though why this is so is not as easy a question as it might appear), dialetheism must be rejected. It is clear that this argument will fail against someone who subscribes to a paraconsistent logic, as most dialetheists will.
Another argument that is sometimes deployed is as follows. A sentence is meaningful only if it rules something out. But if the LNC fails, A does not rule out A or, a fortiori, anything else. Hence meaningful language presupposes the LNC. There are many problems with this argument, but the central one is that the first premise is simply false. Consider the sentence Everything is true. This entails everything, and so rules out nothing. Yet it is quite meaningful. It is what everyone except a trivialist rejects.
Of the other arguments one might consider in this context, I will consider only one more, which goes as follows. The truth conditions for negation are: A is true iff A is not true. Hence, if A and A were true, A would be both true and not true, which is impossible. The truth conditions for negation employed by this argument are contentious. (An alternative is that A is true iff A is false-- and in the semantics of many paraconsistent logics, truth and falsity may overlap.) But in any case, the argument fails, since it clearly begs the question at last step. Many other arguments for the LNC, whatever other they failings have, seem ultimately to beg the question in similar ways.
A more persuasive worry about dialetheism, relating to rationality, is the claim that if a person could legitimately accept a contradiction, then no one could be forced, rationally, to abandon a view held. For if a person accepts A then, when an argument for A is put up, they could simply accept both A and A. But this is too fast. The fact that some contradictions are rationally acceptable does not entail that all are. There is certainly a case that the liar sentence is both true and false, but this in no way provides a case that Brisbane is and is not in Australia. (Of course, if one subscribes to the claim that entailment is explosive, a case for one contradiction is a case for all; but if entailment is paraconsistent, this argument is of no use.) As orthodox philosophy of science indicates, there are, in fact, many considerations that speak against the rational acceptability of a view: that it is unduly complex, that it is contrived, that it has observable consequences that are not observed. (Why these are negative criteria is a different--and often difficult--question.) And these criteria may speak against the acceptability of a view, whether it is consistent or inconsistent. In the end, the rational evaluation of a view must balance it against all criteria of this kind (of which, inconsistency is, arguably, one), each, on its own, being defeasible.
I think it fair to say that since Aristotle's defence of the LNC, consistency has been something of a shibboleth in Western philosophy. The thought that consistency is a sine qua non for central notions such as validity, truth, meaningfulness, rationality, is deeply ingrained into its psyche. One thing that has come out of the modern investigations into dialetheism appears to be how superficial such a thought is. If consistency is, indeed, a necessary condition for any of these notions it would seem to be for reasons much deeper than anyone has yet succeeded in articulating. And if it is not, then the way is open for the exploration of all kinds of avenues and questions in philosophy and the sciences that have traditionally been closed off.
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First published: December 4, 1998
Content last modified: December 4, 1998