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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Supplement to René Descartes' Life and Works

Descartes' Law Thesis

Traditionally, scholars have paid little attention to Descartes's moral views, and even less to his legal and political views--this even though it is well known that he had earned a degree and license in Canon and Civil Law at Poitiers. Of course, an explanation for this is that Descartes wrote very little on such things. And so, the lack of attention is the direct result of a lack of text. However, in 1981, while reframing a seventeenth-century engraving that had been hanging in a museum restaurant, a curator for the Sainte-Croix Museum discovered a document that could change all of this. Stuffed in the back of the engraving was a small broadsheet, which was used by the original framer to secure the engraving in its frame. As was typical, such broadsheets were used to announce upcoming defenses and the theses of the candidates, the latter presented as a list of conclusions to be defended. After the defense dates had passed, the posters were discarded, and some found their way into the hands of framers who on occasion would use them as stuffing, as was the case here. The discovered 1616 broadsheet announced an upcoming (oral) thesis defense at the law school at Poitiers -- the defense of the law thesis of one Rene Descartes.

It wasn't until October of 1986 that the discovery would be officially documented in the Archives departementales de la Vienne, at Poitiers. And even though the existence of the document has been known for several years, very little has been done to bring the thesis and its contents to the attention of Descartes scholars. It is not included in the Adam and Tannery volumes. And, it is not included in any of the French or English translations of Descartes's work -- this, even though Jean-Robert Armogathe, Vincent Carraud, and Robert Feenstra have verified its authenticity. In fact, only one article appears that deals with the thesis in its entirety: an article published in 1988 in Nouvelles De La Republique Des Lettres, co-written by the three scholars just mentioned. They also provide the first French translation of the document (along with a Latin transcription). The broadsheet (hereafter referred to as the "1616 Law Thesis") contains a title, an introductory discussion, and a list of forty conclusions to be defended. And, although the document is only a single page, it appears to be fruitful enough to support new and exciting projects in Descartes scholarship.

The 1616 Law Thesis deals specifically with the legal concept of inheritance. Descartes's view concerning the transference of property from one generation to the next seems to foreshadow a view expounded in works to come -- for example, in the Rules for the Direction of the Mind (1628) and in the Discourse on the Method (1637). "Last Wills can be generally defined" he says, "as the ultimate rule by way of which inheritance is handed over" (1616 Law Thesis, my translation). This rule, he argues, is grounded in both Civil and Natural Law (Ibid.). The idea is that the property of one generation can be justifiably passed to the next by way of this rule. This, even though the Crown may have a claim to such property. The rule keeps the Crown from legally interfering with the transfer. In the Rules and Discourse we can find a parallel. Like the rule of inheritance, a rule (or a set of rules -- i.e., a method) must be used to secure the transference of knowledge from one generation to the next, the rule (or rules) keeping authority from interfering with the transfer.

We learn in the Discourse, and later in the Meditations, that Descartes was dissatisfied with the ‘knowledge’ he had acquired as a child (at La Fleche). This dissatisfaction resulted in his search for a method that would guarantee knowledge. Traditionally, Descartes's insight into the need for a method is dated around 1619, and is said to have found expression in print for the first time, some eighteen years later, in the Discourse. However, the insight is found lurking about in the introductory paragraph of the 1616 Law Thesis:

I thought that while even a tender sprout that I was especially inquisitive, for while nearly all the youngsters cried as they departed their youth, I was devoted to the fountains, the wet milk of my step-mother -- the nectar of the liberal arts -- dripping from my lips. At first in fact, I, wonderfully delighted, muttered a noisy stream of flattery, strongly desiring to drink the stuff of the honey-flowing poet. But soon, my admiration for their [my teachers'] heavy clammer and voices produced in me a torrent of images in which I took refuge, in turn hiding from me the eloquent waters for which I had [originally] thirsted. And, not only did these things produce in me more of a thirst for knowledge than they could quench, but none of them ever really satisfied me. The [resulting] desolation of knowledge eventually leveled me, and I, at that point, began to search with great zeal for any streams that were more abundant than this other, and that flowed [perhaps] in a different direction. [At first I thought that] carrying out something so ambitious was certainly not insane, since I did not think that such an undertaking would wear me down, or judge that a single petty stream would wear me out. My hope was that I could root out some [of the streams] from the rest, the sweet drops of the former at last calming my nature. And, my hope was that all [of this] would be settled by way of proof.

The reference to streams in this passage is connected to a central metaphor of the 1616 Law Thesis: the metaphor of the fountain. We find this metaphor used by Descartes in later works: The World, Treatise on Man, Discourse, and Optics, to name a few. It is used, for example, in explanations of light, force, motion, dynamic and mechanical processes, and animal behavior. It would seem that this metaphor, in addition to its being central to the 1616 Law Thesis, is central to understanding Cartesian views on the dynamic processes of both mind and body. This suggests the use of a central ‘picture’ that runs throughout the entire Cartesian corpus, a picture that is first introduced in his law thesis at Poitiers.

Further Documentation

Descartes' 1616 Law Thesis -- Copy of Original Document

Descartes' 1616 Law Thesis -- Latin Transcription

Descartes' 1616 Law Thesis -- English Translation (Work in Progress)


Thanks to Roger Ariew and Helen Hattab for their advice on this project, and to Daniel Garber for providing me with a copy of the original document.

Copyright © 2001, 2002 by
Kurt Smith

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First published: April 9, 2001
Content last modified: October 30, 2002