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I should like you to remember here that, in matters which may be embraced by the will, I made a very careful distinction between the conduct of life and the contemplation of the truth. As far as the conduct of life is concerned, I am very far from thinking that we should assent only to what is clearly perceived. But when we are dealing solely with the contemplation of the truth, surely no one has ever denied that we should refrain from giving assent to matters which we do not perceive with sufficient distinctness.If Descartes holds that when doing strict metaphysics we ought not speak of what we do not clearly and distinctly perceive, a general Cartesian theory of modality should not be sensitive to claims that Descartes makes about possibilities or necessities that are confused.
For reasons having to do with his method, Descartes still makes a number of such claims throughout his corpus. For example, in the First Meditation Descartes entertains a number of possibilities that suggest that our minds might be mistaken about results that seem perfectly evident to us. One such possibility is that we have been created by a supremely good God but that, for reasons unbeknownst to us, our nature is such that we go wrong every time [we] add two and three or count the sides of a square, or in some even simpler matter (AT 7:21, CSM 2:14). Another is that we have not been created by God but have arrived at [our] present state by fate or chance or a continuous chain of events (AT 7:21, CSM 2:14). A third is that we have been created by a malicious demon (AT 7:22, CSM 2:15). Descartes mentions all of these possibilities to set up his Third Meditation point that until we know what made our minds, we are not in a position to trust them and so not in a position to know anything at all (AT 7:36, CSM 2:25). However, none of these possibilities is a possibility that is a constituent of Descartes' ontology. In the Fifth Meditation, Descartes reveals that a person who has meditated to a sufficient grasp of God's nature understands self-evidently that God exists and did not create our minds defectively:
as regards God, if I were not overwhelmed by preconceived opinions, and if the images of things perceived by the senses did not besiege my thought on every side, I would certainly acknowledge him sooner and more easily than anything else. For what is more self-evident than the fact that the supreme being exists, or that God, to whose essence alone existence belongs, exists (AT 7:69, CSM 2:47).For Descartes, a person who thinks that God is a deceiver or even that there is no such being as God is very confused.
It might seem surprising that Descartes flirts with these confusions at all. When he does so he is just employing his analytic method -- what he calls the best and truest method of instruction (Second Replies, AT 7:156, CSM 2:111). Descartes does not hide that he sometimes makes claims early in the Meditations that from a later and more sophisticated point of view he will retract. He says,
The analytic style of writing that I adopted there [in the Meditations] allows us from time to time to make certain assumptions that have not yet been thoroughly examined; and this comes out in the First Meditation where I made many assumptions which I proceeded to refute in subsequent Meditations.Descartes makes these claims because he is trying to teach his metaphysics and because he thinks that his readers will not be in a position to grasp that metaphysics if he only makes claims that are true. Descartes holds that
All of our ideas of what belongs to the mind have up till now been very confused and mixed up with the ideas of things that can be perceived by the senses. This is the first and most important reason for our inability to understand with sufficient clarity the customary assertions about the soul and God.In order to maneuver his readers into a position in which they are able to understand his metaphysics, Descartes needs to help them to clear up their ideas. If he simply tells us his view, we will hear it in terms of the confused ideas that (on his view) it is imperative we discard. The view that we would walk away with would not be Descartes' view but something else. Descartes therefore opts for a special strategy for presenting his metaphysics. If he is not going package his view by putting it forward unadorned, he will have to embellish it. If we object (as does Gassendi) to this kind of maneuver, Descartes insists that under the circumstances it is only appropriate. He says,
A philosopher would be no more surprised at such suppositions of falsity than he would be if, in order to straighten out a curved stick, we bent it round in the opposite direction. The philosopher knows that it is often useful to assume falsehoods instead of truths in this way in order to shed light on the truth… (Fifth Replies, AT 7:349-350, CSM 2:242).The falsehoods that Descartes assumes early in the Meditations include his claims about the possibility of God's deception and the possibility of His non-existence. But these are not real possibilities in Descartes' ontology. When Descartes talks about these alleged possibilities, he is not interested in truth. Rather, he is interested in helping his reader to abandon misconceptions. Descartes holds that when doing metaphysics, we ought refrain from making judgments about what we do not clearly and distinctly perceive. Along with anything else that we do not clearly and distinctly perceive, the alleged possibilities of God's deception and His non-existence do not belong in Descartes' ontology.
we must distinguish between possible and necessary existence. It must be noted that possible existence is contained in the concept or idea of everything that we clearly and distinctly understand; but in no case is necessary existence so contained except in the case of the idea of God.In addition, he says to Mesland that our mind is finite and so created as to be able to perceive as possible things which God has wished to be in fact possible. The interpretive issue here is what Descartes is talking about when he speaks in such terms. One interpretation that immediately suggests itself is that Descartes holds that there are things or states of affairs that, though not actual, are counterfactually possible. A number of considerations speak in favor of such a reading. One is that Descartes' view that mind and body are really distinct appears to be the view that minds and bodies that are in fact united can exist apart. Another is that Descartes says that we have clear and distinct perceptions of possible existence and of what is possible, thus making it appear that he holds that God's creatures include not only actuals but also unactualized possibles. Finally, this sort of reading fits Descartes within a long tradition of figures like Scotus and Brandwardine who posit possible being to secure the meaning and reference of claims about things that could be but aren't. If Descartes wants to make claims about unactualized possibles and if he does not want those claims to be non-sensical, unactualized possibles need to have some kind of ontological status in his system.
Descartes may in fact be committed to attributing reality to unactualized possibles, but a few interpretive problems arise if he does. One is that Descartes says elsewhere that unactualized being has no ontological status. In the Third Meditation, he argues that the objective reality of the idea of God cannot have been caused by potential perfections towards which a finite being might be evolving because potentialities are nothing and so have no causal power. He says,
... I perceive that the objective being of an idea cannot be produced merely by potential being, which strictly speaking is nothing, but only by actual or formal being. (AT 7:47, CSM 2:32)If Descartes holds that potential being is nothing, then it is difficult to see how he can include unactualized possibles in his ontology.
Another interpretive problem is that it is difficult to see where possible reality would fit into Descartes' parsimonious dualistic ontology. For Descartes, possibles would be creatures, yet Descartes holds that the only creatures are finite minds and bodies and their modes:
I recognize only two ultimate classes of things: first, intellectual of thinking things, i.e. those which pertain to mind or thinking substance; and secondly, material things, i.e. those which pertain to extended substance or body. Perception, volition and all the modes both of perceiving and willing are referred to thinking substance; while to extended substance belong size (that is, extension in length, breadth and depth), shape, motion, position, divisibility of component parts and the like.One category of being in Descartes' ontology is thinking substance (and its modes), and another is extended substance (and its modes). If Descartes' possibles are just created thinking or extended substances, then presumably they are actuals and not possibles. Of course, one might suggest that Descartes' dualism entails that there are two kinds of things -- thinking things and material things -- but that in each of these classes there are substances with actual existence and also substances with possible existence. On such a view, the class of thinking substances (for example) includes thinking substances with actual existence and thinking substances with possible existence. A problem with this view, though, is that Descartes cannot adhere to it if he also adheres to his theory of the conceptual distinction between a substance and its attributes. Descartes holds that all created substances have possible existence and that the existence of a substance is only conceptually distinct from that substance. He says,
we do not sufficiently distinguish between things existing outside our thought and the ideas of things, which are in our thought. Thus, when I think of the essence of a triangle, and of the existence of the same triangle, these two thoughts, as thoughts, even taken objectively differ modally in the strict sense of the term mode; but the case is not the same with the triangle existing outside thought, in which it seems to me manifest that essence and existence are in no way distinct. The same is the case with all universals. Thus, when I say that Peter is a man, the thought by which I think of Peter differs modally from the thought by which I think of man, but in Peter himself being a man is nothing other than being Peter. (To ***, 1645 or 1646, AT 7:350, CSMK 280-281)Descartes holds that in re a thing's existence is identical to the thing itself. If all creatures have possible existence, then a creature that actually exists has possible existence. If the thing's existence is just identical to that thing itself, then the thing's possible existence is identical to the thing and the thing's actual existence is identical to the thing. That is, a thing's possible existence just is its actual existence.
If Descartes wants to distinguish between possible existence and actual existence, he must abandon his theory of conceptual distinction. If he retains this theory, he has to say that possible existence is just another name for actual existence. Descartes actually suggests this equation in a few places. To describe the kind of existence had by creatures, Descartes uses possible existence and contingent existence interchangeably: he sometimes speaks of the beings that depend on God for their existence as having possible or contingent existence (Second Replies, AT 7:166, CSM 2:117; Notae, AT 8B:361, CSM 1:306), and sometimes he speaks of them as having just contingent existence (Principles 15, AT 8A:10, CSM 1:198). When he says that creatures have possible or contingent existence, he identifies the two kinds of existence: possible or [vel] contingent existence. If contingent existence is just the kind of existence had by beings that depend for their existence on God's will, then the fact that a thing has possible existence in Descartes' ontology does not suggest that the thing does not actually exist. Such a thing exists, but in a way that has it wholly dependent on God. Descartes suggests exactly this definition of possible existence when he contrasts necessary existence with the kind of existence had by creatures in First Replies: unlike necessary existence, the existence had by a creature is marked by the fact that it has no power to create itself or maintain itself in existence (AT 7:118, CSM 2:84). It might be that like some of his predecessors Descartes is using possible existence to describe a kind of being had only by actually existing things.
A final worry is whether or not unactualized possibles are allowed by Descartes' commitment to divine simplicity. Descartes embraces the view that a perfectly simple God would have no distinct parts and concludes that
In God willing and knowing are a single thing in such a way that by the very fact of willing something he knows it and it is only for this reason that such a thing is true. (To Mersenne, 6 May 1630, AT 1:149, CSMK 24)A philosopher like Leibniz will insist on a distinction between God's understanding and will so as to secure the existence of things in God's understanding that God does not actually create. For Descartes, however, there is no such distinction, and whatever is the object of God's understanding is also the object of his will. Descartes says,
in God, willing, understanding, and creating are all the same thing without one being prior to the other even conceptually. (To Mersenne, 27 May 1630, AT 1:152, CSMK 25-26)What is not the object of God's understanding is nothing at all, and what is the object of God's understanding is created and made actual. If Descartes is seriously committed to the identity of God's intellect and will, it is difficult to see how he can also be committed to the existence of unactualized possibles.
There are a number of passages in which Descartes speaks of what is possible. To fix an interpretation of these passages, we can look to a number of different places. One is common-sense. We might argue that any view is crazy that does not admit that there are things that could happen or exist but that do not. Since Descartes is not crazy, what he must mean when he speaks of the possible is unactualized being. Or, we might argue that Descartes is continuing the tradition of thinkers who clearly do posit unactualized possibles. If these figures include unactualized being within their ontologies, and if Descartes is building on their work, then (again) Descartes' claims about the possible are about unactualized being. Or, we might attempt to isolate parts of Descartes' system that have a bearing on what possible might mean in his system. Parts of this system entail that possible existence is just the actual existence of dependent beings. If by possible existence Descartes just means the dependent existence of actually existing creatures, then passages in which Descartes speaks of a thing as being possible or having possible existence are not evidence that Descartes holds that there are things that could be but are not. Of course, it might just be the case that Descartes has reason to help himself to entities that the rest of his system shuts out.
If Descartes does hold that there are things that could be but are not, his view still demands an important qualification. Descartes of course realizes that in everyday discourse we speak of things that can happen but don't. However, if our understanding of these things is not clear and distinct, and if our understanding of them as possible is not clear and distinct, then Descartes will not introduce them as possibilities. Descartes appreciates that according to common ways of speaking, all kinds of things are possible. He considers this concept of possible after Mersenne introduces it in Second Objections:
If by possible you mean what everyone commonly means, namely whatever does not conflict with our human concepts, then it is manifest that the nature of God, as I have described it, is possible in this sense . (Second Replies, AT 7:150, CSM 2:107)Here Descartes might seem to be offering a theory of possibility according to which what it means for something to be possible is just for it to be conceivable. However, this cannot be Descartes' view. Descartes holds that whatever we clearly and distinctly perceive is true and that truth is the conformity of thought with its object (To Mersenne, 16 October 1639; AT 2:597, CSMK 139). If a possibility that we are considering is clearly and distinctly perceived, then our clear and distinct perception conforms to reality, and the possibility that we are conceiving is not merely conceptual. Instead, there is also an object to which the clear and distinct perception conforms -- the sort of thing posited by commentators who argue that Descartes holds that God's creation consists not only of actuals but of unactualized possibles. Thus, for any possibility of which we have a conception, if there is no object to which that conception conforms -- that is, if the possibility exists only in thought -- the possibility is not clearly and distinctly perceived. Possibilities which exist only in thought are not part of Descartes' ontology and so on Descartes' view are not possibilities at all. Descartes' remarks to Mersenne actually bear this out. Descartes is indeed considering the view of possibility as conceivability, but in doing so he is merely acknowledging what everyone commonly means by possible. Descartes sometimes speaks of the possible as clearly and distinctly perceived. It is on these passages that any interpretation of Descartes' views on possibility must be built.
You ask me by what kind of causality God established the eternal truths. I reply: by the same kind of causality as he created all things, that is to say, as their efficient and total cause. (To [Mersenne], 27 May 1630, AT 1:152, CSMK 25)On the surface the position is baffling, especially when considered in conjunction with Descartes' view that God is omnipotent. The author of Fifth Objections, Pierre Gassendi, complained that the view is very difficult to conceive. Descartes' reply is interesting:
You say that you think it is very hard to propose that there is anything immutable and eternal apart from God. You would be right to think this if I was talking about existing things, or if I was proposing something as immutable in the sense that its immutability was independent of God. But just as the poets suppose that the Fates were originally established by Jupiter, but that after they were established he bound himself to abide by them, so I do not think that the essences of things, and the mathematical truths which we can know concerning them, are independent of God. Nevertheless I do think that they are immutable and eternal, since the will and decree of God willed and decreed that they should be so. Whether you think this is hard or easy to accept, it is enough for me that it is true. (Fifth Replies, AT 7:380, CSM 2:261)Descartes holds that each and every thing depends on God for its existence and that, as things, eternal truths depend on God as well. One of Gassendi's worries is that if God can do anything and thus can alter any item that He creates, nothing that He creates is immutable.
But this is not the only worry that arises with respect to Descartes' view on eternal truths. There is also a question about whether or not Descartes can account for the necessity that he attributes to them. In at least one place Descartes identifies eternal truths as necessary: he says that the necessity of these truths does not surpass our knowledge (To Mersenne, 6 May 1630; AT 1:150, CSMK 25). The worry here is that if they are necessary then it should not be the case that they could have been otherwise. Yet Descartes' commitment to divine omnipotence appears to commit him to this view:
You ask what necessitated God to create these truths; and I reply that he was free to make it not true that all the radii of the circle are equal -- just as free as he was not to create the world. And it is certain that these truths are no more necessarily attached to his essence than are other created things. (To [Mersenne], 27 May 1630; AT 1:152, CSMK 25)It appears that something in Descartes' comments about the eternal truths has to give. It might be that, since Descartes is clearly not prepared to adjust his commitment to divine omnipotence, he instead abandons his view that they are necessary. On this view, all eternal truths are inherently contingent because they could have been false, and they could have been false because God could have made their contradictories true. This does not just follow from Descartes' commitment to divine omnipotence; there are also some texts:
God cannot have been determined to make it true that contradictories cannot be true together, and therefore he could have done the opposite.On this reading, then Descartes does not really hold that the eternal truths are necessary. If to our rational faculties they appear to be necessary, this is just a function of the makeup of our rational faculties and not of the necessity of the truths themselves.
I do not think that we should ever say of anything that it cannot be brought about by God. For since every basis of truth and goodness depends on his omnipotence, I would not dare to say that God cannot make a mountain without a valley, or bring it about that 1 and 2 are not 3.
If Descartes holds that eternal truths are necessary in any robust sense, the latter view has an obvious drawback. A second view is that Descartes holds that eternal truths are necessary, but not necessarily so. On this reading, Descartes' view involves iterated modalities: a number of truths are possibly necessary, but God chooses only some of these possibilities to be the actual necessary truths. One of the passages that supports such a reading is from the already-cited letter to Mesland:
And even if God has willed that some truths should be necessary, this does not mean that he willed them necessarily; for it is one thing to will that they be necessary, and quite another to will this necessarily, or to be necessitated to will it.On this reading, Descartes' view is that eternal truths are necessary, but they are not necessarily necessary.
An alternative reading of Descartes' comments on the eternal truths suggests still another interpretation. Jonathan Bennett has pointed out that in some of the key passages in question Descartes does not say that God can make contradictories true but that we should not say that God cannot make contradictories true (Bennett 1994, 653-655). Here Descartes is not saying anything about God's power but about us and what we ought not say. Presumably, Descartes is just invoking his Fourth Meditation rule for judging in these passages. He is clear that when doing metaphysics we ought not affirm what we do not clearly and distinctly understand. Since we do not come close to a clear and distinct understanding of what it would be for one and two to add up to something other than three, and since we do not understand God's being unable to do something, the prospect that God cannot make 1 and 2 not add to 3 is hopelessly confused. Accordingly, we ought not speak of it. This analysis applies also to the important passage in the Mesland letter. Immediately after saying that God can make contradictories true together, Descartes takes it back: even if this be true, we should not try to comprehend it, since our nature is incapable of doing so. Descartes' claim that God can make contradictories true is something that we ought not affirm when doing metaphysics and thus something that should have no bearing on our interpretation of Descartes' system. Here Descartes may just be speaking in the language of faith and devotion in an attempt to gesture at God's perfection.
This last view handles very easily the passages in which Descartes says that we ought not say of impossibilities that God cannot bring them about. The view also squares nicely with the view that Descartes is an actualist. However, there are still passages in which Descartes says that God can bring about impossibilities (and not just that we ought not say that He cannot). For example, there is his claim to Mersenne that God was free to not make the radii of a circle equal. On the actualist reading, the freedom of Descartes' God to not create eternal truths would have to reduce to His independence from all things. Although Descartes does not come forward and actually state the Spinozistic view, it is interesting that he is reported as having stated it in Conversation with Burman:
Concerning ethics and religion, the opinion has prevailed that God can be altered, because of the prayers of mankind; for no one would have prayed to God if he knew, or had convinced himself, that God was unalterable . From the metaphysical point of view, however, it is quite unintelligible that God should be anything but completely unalterable. It is irrelevant that the decrees could have been separated from God; indeed, this should not really be asserted. For although God is completely indifferent with respect to all things, he necessarily made the decrees he did, since he necessarily willed what was best, even though it was of his own will that he did what was best. We should not make a separation here between the necessity and the indifference that apply to God's decrees; although his actions were completely indifferent, they were also completely necessary. Then again, although we may conceive that the decrees could have been separated from God, this is merely a token procedure of our own reasoning: the distinction thus introduced between God himself and his decrees is a mental, not a real one. In reality the decrees could not have been separated from God: he is not prior to them or distinct from them, nor could he have existed without them.If Descartes does hold that there are possible eternal truths that God does not actualize, it is difficult to see where they would fit in Descartes' ontology. It is also difficult to see how they square with some important pillars of Descartes' system. Descartes might be an actualist, and if he is he might be revealing this to Burman. Alternatively, Descartes might include unactualized eternal truths in his ontology. If he does posit such things, that might be evidence that he is not really so committed to his dualism or to the tenets that entail that potential being is strictly speaking nothing.
Thus far we have considered the interpretive issue of whether or not Descartes' eternal truths could have been otherwise. A question that still remains to be considered concerns the ontological status of Descartes' eternal truths, regardless of whether or not they could have been otherwise.
One view is that since Descartes' eternal truths are neither finite mental things, finite physical things, nor God, they must be something akin to Platonic forms. A problem with this view, of course, is that it does violence to Descartes' parsimonious dualism. A second view is that eternal truths are to be located in God. One of the merits of this view is that it provides for eternal truths to be eternal in a very robust sense. Since God is eternal, eternal truths are eternal presumably only if they are in God. Still, this view conflicts with the fact that Descartes holds that eternal truths are creatures.
A third reading of Descartes on eternal truths is that they are true ideas that conform to God's creation. In Principles I:48, Descartes says that eternal truths are beings which have no existence outside our thought (AT 8A:23, CSM 1:208). If eternal truths are truths that have no existence outside of our thought, one interpretive possibility is that they are simply true ideas. Since for Descartes truth is the conformity of thought with its object, like any other true ideas eternal truths conform to God or His creation. A problem with this interpretation is that, although it is easy to see how it allows eternal truths to be true, it is difficult to see how it allows them to be eternal. Descartes does allow that things can properly be called eternal when they are always the same (Fifth Replies, AT 7:381, CSM 2:262). However, Descartes says to Mersenne that from all eternity [God] willed them [eternal truths] to be, and by that very fact he created them (To [Mersenne], 27 May 1630, AT 1:152, CSMK 25). Here Descartes appears to attribute to eternal truths an eternity that they cannot have if they have no existence outside of our thought.
[B]y a complete thing I simply mean a substance endowed with the forms or attributes which enable me to recognize that it is a substance. (AT 7:222, CSM 2:156)Since a Cartesian substance is a thing that is ontologically independent (Principles I:51-52), a complete thing is an ontologically independent thing. When we clearly and distinctly perceive mind and body to be complete, we know that they are substances. When we still clearly and distinctly perceive them to be substances after clearly and distinctly perceiving them apart from each other, we know that they are not the same substance under different descriptions. On this view, Descartes holds that mind and body are ontologically independent substances, and their distinctness consists in their ability to continue to exist even after God separates them.
An alternative interpretation of Descartes on the real distinction between mind and body reads the distinction as consisting in the the ontological independence of mind and body, but not in their separability. Descartes holds that a sufficient condition for establishing a real distinction between two things is clearly and distinctly perceiving them to be non-identical substances (AT 7:13, CSM 2:9; AT 7:221-223, CSM 2:156-156). He therefore holds that the substantiality of two non-identical substances does not consist in their being separable but is just an indication of their separability. On this view, mind and body are separable for Descartes; it's just that their separability is a consequence of the (different) fact that they are really distinct.
One of the puzzles that the latter view addresses but that the earlier view does not is that Descartes holds that God brings about what we clearly and distinctly perceive but says (in his proof of real distinction) that God can bring about whatever we clearly and distinctly perceive. Presumably, if Descartes holds that our clear and distinct perceptions are veridical, a clear and distinct perception of mind apart from body should not tell us that mind and body can exist apart from each other. The latter view allows for the veridicality of our clear and distinct perception by understanding our clear and distinct perception of the apartness of mind and body as entailing their ontological independence. However, the view does not resolve the problem of why Descartes says that God can bring about whatever we clearly and distinctly perceive. How we proceed here is a function of the extent to which we appeal to the rest of Descartes' system in determining his views on a particular issue. The rest of Descartes' system entails that God has made things as we clearly and distinctly perceive them. Even more puzzling is that in Fourth Replies Descartes says that his reason for mentioning God's power in the Sixth Meditation proof of real distinction is to remind his reader that our clear and distinct perceptions are veridical (AT 7:226, CSM 2:159).
The interpretive issue of reading Descartes' particular views in light of his systematic commitments is especially pressing when it comes to his view that mind and body are really distinct. If Descartes holds that potential being is strictly speaking nothing, and if his parsimonious ontology and his commitment to divine simplicity bar possibilities from his system, it is not clear what to make of the possibility of mind and body existing in separation. One view might be that Descartes is committed to the reality of this possibility and that, with his commitment to other possibilities, this commitment is part of a pattern of Descartes' helping himself to entities that his system does not allow. That is, it might be the case that Descartes wants his system to be rich enough to posit possibilities and that, when it isn't, he posits them anyway. It also might be the case that Descartes' conclusion that mind and body can exist apart just reflects that when he draws the conclusion he has not yet proven that anything material exists. If he is adhering to his rule of affirming only what he clearly and distinctly perceives, he should not say that mind and body are actually apart -- that is, are actually substances -- until he has proven that body actually exists. The claim that mind and body can exist apart might be tracking just this. His claim that God can make mind and matter into separate substances might just be a reminder to us that God has enough power to have done this even when it might seem impossible to us for such different substances to be united.
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First published: April 15, 2002
Content last modified: April 22, 2002