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While his first position was at Queen's College in New York, Davidson spent much of the early part of his career (1951-1967) at Stanford University. He has subsequently held positions at Princeton (1967-1970), Rockefeller (1970-1976), and the University of Chicago (1976-1981). Since 1981 he has taught at the University of California, Berkeley. Davidson has also been the recipient of a number of award and fellowships and has been a visitor at many universities around the world. He has been married, since 1984, to Marcia Cavell.
Although directed against the Wittgensteinian-inspired view that reasons cannot be causes, Davidson's argument nevertheless effectively redeploys a number of Wittgensteinian notions. Two ideas play an especially significant role in the Davidsonian account -- ideas that are also, in one form or another, important in Davidson's thinking elsewhere. The first of these ideas is the notion of a primary reason -- the pairing of a belief and a desire (or pro-attitude) in the light of which an action is explained. Thus, my action of flipping the light switch can be explained by reference to my having the belief that flipping the switch turns on the light in combination with my having the desire to turn on the light (for most explanations explicit reference to both the belief and the desire is unnecessary). An action is thus rendered intelligible through being embedded in a broader system of attitudes attributable to the agent -- through being embedded, that is, in a broader framework of rationality. The second idea is that of action under a description (a phrase originally appearing in G. E. M. Anscombe's Intention, published in 1959). As with the concept of a primary reason the idea here is simple enough: one and the same action is always amenable to more than one correct description. This idea is especially important, however, as it provides a means by which the same item of behaviour can be understood as intentional under some descriptions but not under others. Thus my action of flipping the light switch can be redescribed as the act of turning on the light (under which it is intentional) and also as the act of alerting the prowler who, unbeknown to me, is lurking in the bushes outside (under which it is unintentional). Generalising this point we can say that the same event can be referred to under quite disparate descriptions: the event of alerting the prowler is the same event as my flipping the light switch which is the same event as my moving of my body (or a part of my body) in a certain way.
Davidson treats the connection between reason and action (where the reason is indeed the reason for the action) as a connection that obtains between two events (the agent's believing and desiring on the one hand and her acting on the other) that can be variously described. The connection is both rational, inasmuch as the belief-desire pair (the primary reason) specifies the reason for the action, but it is also causal, inasmuch as the one event causes the other if it is indeed the reason for it. It is precisely because the reason is causally related to the action that the action can be explained by reference to the reason. Indeed, where an agent has a number of reasons for acting, and yet acts on the basis of one reason in particular, there is no way to pick out just that reason on which the agent acts other than by saying that it is the reason that caused her action.
Understood as rational the connection between reason and action cannot be described in terms of any strict law. Yet inasmuch as the connection is also a causal connection, so there must exist some law-like regularity, though not describable in the language of rationality, under which the events in question fall (an explanation can be causal, then, even though it does not specify any strict law). Davidson is thus able to maintain that rational explanation need not involve explicit reference to any law-like regularity, while nevertheless also holding that there must be some such regularity that underlies the rational connection just inasmuch as it is causal. Moreover, since Davidson resists the idea that rational explanations can be formulated in the terms of a predictive science, so he seems committed to denying that there can be any reduction of rational to non-rational explanation.
Davidson holds that events are particulars such that the same event can be referred to under more than one description. He also holds that events that are causally related must be related under some strict law. However, since Davidson takes laws to be linguistic entities, so they can relate events only as those events are given under specific descriptions. Thus, as was already evident in Davidson's approach to the theory of action, the same pair of events may instantiate a law under one description, but not under others. There is, for example, no strict law that relates, under just those descriptions, the formation of ice on the surface of a road to the skidding of a car on that road, and yet, under a different description (a description that will employ a completely different set of concepts), the events at issue will indeed be covered by some strict law or set of laws. But while nomological relations between events (relations involving laws) depend on the descriptions under which the events are given, relations of causality and identity obtain irrespective of descriptions -- if the icing-up of the road did indeed cause the skid, then it did so no matter how the events at issue are described. (The form of description -- whether mental or physical -- is thus irrelevant to the fact that a particular causal relation obtains). It follows that the same pair of events may be related causally, and yet, under certain descriptions (though not under all), there be no strict law under which those events fall. In particular, it is possible that a mental event -- an event given under some mental description -- will be causally related to some physical event -- an event given under a physical description -- and yet there will be no strict law covering those events under just those descriptions. My wanting to read Tolstoy, for instance, leads me to take War and Peace from the shelf, and so my wanting causes a change in the physical arrangement of a certain region of space-time, but there is no strict law that relates my wanting to the physical change. Similarly, while any mental event will be identical with some physical event -- it will indeed be one and the same event under two descriptions -- it is possible that there will be no strict law relating the event as described in mentalistic terms with the event as physically described. In fact, Davidson is explicit in claiming that there can be no strict laws that relate the mental and the physical in this way -- there is no strict law that relates, for instance, wanting to read with a particular kind of brain activity.
Davidson's denial of the existence of any strict psycho-physical laws follows from his view of the mental as constrained by quite general principles of rationality that do not apply, at least not in the same way, to physical descriptions: normative considerations of overall consistency and coherence, for instance, constrain our own thinking about events as physically described, but they have no purchase on physical events as such. This does not mean, of course, that there are no correlations whatsoever to be discerned between the mental and the physical, but it does mean that the correlations that can be discerned cannot be rendered in the precise, explicit and exceptionless form -- in the form, that is, of strict laws -- that would be required in order to achieve any reduction of mental to physical descriptions. The lack of strict laws covering events under mental descriptions is thus an insuperable barrier to any attempt to bring the mental within the framework of unified physical science. However, while the mental is not reducible to the physical, every mental event can be paired with some physical event -- that is, every mental description of an event can be paired with a physical description of the very same event. This leads Davidson to speak of the mental as supervening on the physical in a way that implies a certain dependence of mental predicates on physical predicates: predicate p supervenes on a set of predicates S if and only if p does not distinguish any entities that cannot be distinguished by S (see Thinking Causes ). Put more simply, events that cannot be distinguished under some physical description cannot be distinguished under a mental description either.
On the face of it, anomalous monism appears a highly attractive way to think about the relation between the mental and the physical - inasmuch as it combines monism with anomalism so it seems to preserve what is important about physicalism while nevertheless retaining the ordinary language of so-called folk-psychology (the language of beliefs and desires, actions and reasons). In fact anomalous monism has proved to be a highly contentious position drawing criticism from both physicalists and non-physicalists alike. The nomological conception of causality (the second of the three principles defended in Mental Events) has often been seen as something for which Davidson fails to supply any real argument (a criticism he has attempted to address in Laws and Cause ); the Davidsonian account of supervenience has been viewed as incompatible with other aspects of his position and sometimes as simply mistaken or confused; and, perhaps the most serious and widespread criticism, anomalous monism has been seen as making the mental causally inert. These criticisms have not, however, gone unanswered (see especially Thinking Causes), and while Davidson has modified aspects of his position, he has continued to hold to, and to defend, the basic theses first made explicit in Mental Events.
A characteristic feature of Davidson's approach to such ontological questions has been to focus on the logical structure of sentences about the entities at issue rather than on those entities as such. Davidson's approach to events, for instance, is grounded in an analysis of the underlying logical form of sentences about events; in the case of causal relations, in an analysis of the logical form of sentences that express such relations (see Causal Relations [1967a]); and in his approach to action also, Davidson's approach involves an analysis of the logical form of sentences about actions (see The Logical Form of Action Sentences [1967b]). This reflects a more general commitment on Davidson's part to the inseparability of questions of ontology from questions of logic. This commitment is spelt out explicitly in The Method of Truth in Metaphysics (1977) and it provides a further point of connection between Davidson's work in the philosophy of action, event and mind and his work on questions of meaning and language.
Davidson's thinking about semantic theory is developed on the basis of a holistic conception of linguistic understanding (see Truth and Meaning [1967c]). Providing a theory of meaning for a language is thus a matter of developing a theory that will enable us to generate, for every actual and potential sentence of the language in question, a theorem that specifies what each sentence means. On this basis a theory of meaning for German that was given in English might be expected to generate theorems that would explicate the German sentence Schnee ist weiss as meaning that snow is white. Since the number of potential sentences in any natural language is infinite, a theory of meaning for a language that is to be of use to creatures with finite powers such as ourselves, must be a theory that can generate an infinity of theorems (one for each sentence) on the basis of a finite set of axioms. Indeed, any language that is to be learnable by creatures such as ourselves must possess a structure that is amenable to such an approach. Consequently, the commitment to holism also entails a commitment to a compositional approach according to which the meanings of sentences are seen to depend upon the meanings of their parts, that is, upon the meanings of the words that form the finite base of the language and out of which sentences are composed. Compositionality does not compromise holism, since not only does it follow from it, but, on the Davidsonian approach, it is only as they play a role in whole sentences that individual words can be viewed as meaningful. It is sentences, and not words, that are thus the primary focus for a Davidsonian theory of meaning. Developing a theory for a language is a matter of developing a systematic account of the finite structure of the language that enables the user of the theory to understand any and every sentence of the language.
A Davidsonian theory of meaning explicates the meanings of expressions holistically through the interconnection that obtains among expressions within the structure of the language as a whole. Consequently, although it is indeed a theory of meaning, a theory of the sort Davidson proposes will have no use for a concept of meaning understood as some discrete entity (whether a determinate mental state or an abstract idea) to which meaningful expressions refer. One important implication of this is that the theorems that are generated by such a theory of meaning cannot be understood as theorems that relate expressions and meanings. Instead such theorems will relate sentences to other sentences. More particularly, they will relate sentences in the language to which the theory applies (the object-language) to sentences in the language in which the theory of meaning is itself couched (the meta-language) in such a way that the latter effectively give the meanings of or translate the former. It might be thought that the way to arrive at theorems of this sort is to take as the general form of such theorems s means that p where s names an object-language sentence and p is a sentence in the meta-language. But this would be already to assume that we could give a formal account of the connecting phrase means that, and not only does this seem unlikely, but it also appears to assume a concept of meaning when it is precisely that concept (at least as it applies within a particular language) that the theory aims to elucidate. It is at this point that Davidson turns to the concept of truth. Truth, he argues, is a less opaque concept than that of meaning. Moreover, to specify the conditions under which a sentence is true is also a way of specifying the meaning of a sentence. Thus, instead of s means that p, Davidson proposes, as the model for theorems of an adequate theory of meaning, s is true if and only if p (the use of the biconditional if and only if is crucial here as it ensures the truth-functional equivalence of the sentences s and p, that is, it ensures they will have identical truth-values). The theorems of a Davidsonian theory of meaning for German couched in English would thus take the form of sentences such as "Schnee ist weiss is true if and only if snow is white."
The formal structure that Tarski articulates here is identical to that which Davidson explicates as the basis for a theory of meaning: a Tarskian truth theory can generate, for every sentence of the object-language, a T-sentence that specifies the meaning of each sentence in the sense of specifying the conditions under which it is true. What Davidson's work shows, then, is that satisfaction of Tarski's Convention T can be seen as the basic requirement for an adequate theory of meaning.
A Tarskian truth theory defines truth on the basis of logical resources that are no more than those available within first-order quantificational logic. Moreover, it also defines truth extensionally, that is, it defines truth in terms of the objects that satisfy expressions -- in terms, we might say, of the objects that fall under those expressions -- rather than in terms of meanings, descriptions or other intensional entities. Both these features represent important advantages for a Davidsonian approach (Davidson's rejection of determinate meanings as having a significant role to play in a theory of meaning already involves a commitment to an extensional approach to language). However, these features also present certain problems. Davidson wishes to apply the Tarskian model as the basis for a theory of meaning for natural languages, but such languages are far richer than the well-defined formal systems for which Tarski originally developed his approach. In particular natural languages contain features that seem to require resources beyond those of first-order logic or of any purely extensional analysis. Examples of such features include indirect or reported speech (Galileo said that the earth moves), adverbial expressions (Flora swam slowly where slowly modifies Flora swam) and non-indicative sentences such as imperatives (Eat your eggplant!). An important part of Davidson's work in the philosophy of language has been to show how such apparently recalcitrant features of natural language can indeed be analysed so as to make them amenable to a Tarskian treatment. In On Saying That (1968) and Quotation (1979b) he addresses the question of indirect speech; in Moods and Performances (1979a) he deals with non-indicative utterances; and in Adverbs of Action (1985a) he takes up the problem of adverbial modification. As in Davidson's analysis of actions and events, the notion of logical form plays an important part in his approach here -- the problem of how to apply a Tarskian truth theory to natural language is shown to depend on providing an analysis of the underlying logical form of natural language expressions which renders them in such a way that they fall under the scope of a purely extensional approach employing only the resources of first-order quantificational logic.
There is, however, another more general problem that affects Davidson's appropriation of Tarski. While Tarski uses the notion of sameness of meaning, through the notion of translation, as the means to provide a definition of truth -- one of the requirements of Convention T is that the sentence on the right hand side of a Tarskian T-sentence be a translation of the sentence on the left - Davidson aims to use truth to provide an account of meaning. But in that case it seems that he needs some other way to constrain the formation of T-sentences so as to ensure that they do indeed deliver correct specifications of what sentences mean. This problem is readily illustrated by the question of how we are we to rule out T-sentences of the form "Schnee ist weiss is true if and only if grass is green." Since the biconditional if and only if ensures only that the sentence named on the left will have the same truth value as the sentence on the right, so it would seem to allow us to make any substitution of sentences on the right so long as their truth value is identical to that on the left. In one respect this problem is met by simply insisting on the way in which T-sentences must be seen as theorems generated by a theory of meaning that is adequate to the language in question as a whole (see Truth and Meaning). Since the meaning of particular expressions will not be independent of the meaning of other expressions (in virtue of the commitment to compositionality the meanings of all sentences must be generated on the same finite base), so a theory that generates problematic results in respect of one expression can be expected to generate problematic results elsewhere, and, in particular, to also generate results that do not meet the requirements of Convention T. This problem can also be seen, however, as closely related to another important point of difference between a Tarskian truth theory and a Davidsonian theory of meaning: a theory of meaning for a natural language must be an empirical theory -- it is, indeed, a theory that ought to apply to actual linguistic behaviour -- and as such it ought to be empirically verifiable. Satisfaction of the requirement that a theory of meaning be adequate as an empirical theory, and so that it be adequate to the actual behaviour of speakers, will also ensure tighter constraints (if such are needed) on the formation of T-sentences. Indeed, Davidson is not only quite explicit in emphasising the empirical character of a theory of meaning, but he also offers a detailed account that both explains how such a theory might be developed and specifies the nature of the evidence on which it must be based.
The basic problem that radical interpretation must address is that one cannot assign meanings to a speaker's utterances without knowing what the speaker believes, while one cannot identify beliefs without knowing what the speaker's utterances mean. It seems that we must provide both a theory of belief and a theory of meaning at one and the same time. Davidson claims that the way to achieve this is through the application of the so-called principle of charity (Davidson has also referred to it as the principle of rational accommodation) a version of which is also to be found in Quine. In Davidson's work this principle, which admits of various formulations and cannot be rendered in any completely precise form, often appears in terms of the injunction to optimise agreement between ourselves and those we interpret, that is, it counsels us to interpret speakers as holding true beliefs (true by our lights at least) wherever it is plausible to do (see Radical Interpretation ). In fact the principle can be seen as combining two notions: a holistic assumption of rationality in belief (coherence) and an assumption of causal relatedness between beliefs -- especially perceptual beliefs -- and the objects of belief (correspondence) (see Three Varieties of Knowledge ). The process of interpretation turns out to depend on both aspects of the principle. Attributions of belief and assignments of meaning must be consistent with one another and with the speaker's overall behaviour; they must also be consistent with the evidence afforded by our knowledge of the speaker's environment, since it is the worldly causes of beliefs that must, in the most basic cases, be taken to be the objects of belief (see A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge ). Inasmuch as charity is taken to generate particular attributions of belief, so those attributions are, of course, always defeasible. The principle itself is not so, however, since it remains, on the Davidsonian account, a presupposition of any interpretation whatsoever. Charity is, in this respect, both a constraint and an enabling principle in all interpretation -- it is more than just a heuristic device to be employed in the opening stages of interpretative engagement.
If we assume that the speaker's beliefs, at least in the simplest and most basic cases, are largely in agreement with our own, and so, by our account, are largely true, then we can use our own beliefs about the world as a guide to the speaker's beliefs. And, provided that we can identify simple assertoric utterances on the part of a speaker (that is, provided we can identify the attitude of holding true), then the interconnection between belief and meaning enables us to use our beliefs as a guide to the meanings of the speaker's utterances -- we get the basis for both a rudimentary theory of belief and a rudimentary account of meaning. So, for example, when the speaker with whom we are engaged uses a certain sequence of sounds repeatedly in the presence of what we believe to be a rabbit, we can, as a preliminary hypothesis, interpret those sounds as utterances about rabbits or about some particular rabbit. Once we have arrived at a preliminary assignment of meanings for a significant body of utterances, we can test our assignments against further linguistic behaviour on the part of the speaker, modifying those assignments in accordance with the results. Using our developing theory of meaning we are then able to test the initial attributions of belief that were generated through the application of charity, and, where necessary, modify those attributions also. This enables us, in turn, to further adjust our assignments of meaning, which enables further adjustment in the attribution of beliefs, ... and so the process continues until some sort of equilibrium is reached. The development of a more finely tuned theory of belief thus allows us to better adjust our theory of meaning, while the adjustment of our theory of meaning in turn enables us to better tune our theory of belief. Through balancing attributions of belief against assignments of meaning, we are able to move towards an overall theory of behaviour for a speaker or speakers that combines both a theory of meaning and of belief within a single theory of interpretation.
Davidson's commitment to the indeterminacy that follows from his holistic approach has lead some to view his position as involving a form of anti-realism about the mind and about beliefs, desires and so forth. Davidson argues, however, that the indeterminacy of interpretation should be understood analogously with the indeterminacy that attaches to measurement. Such theories assign numerical values to objects on the basis of empirically observable phenomena and in accordance with certain formal theoretical constraints. Where there exist different theories that address the same phenomena, each theory may assign different numerical values to the objects at issue (as do Celsius and Fahrenheit in the measurement of temperature), and yet there need be no difference in the empirical adequacy of those theories, since what is significant is the overall pattern of assignments rather than the value assigned in any particular case. Similarly in interpretation, it is the overall pattern that a theory finds in behaviour that is significant and that remains invariant between different, but equally adequate, theories. An account of meaning for a language is an account of just this pattern.
Although the indeterminacy thesis has sometimes been a focus for objections to Davidson's approach, it is the more basic thesis of holism as developed in its full-blown form in the account of radical interpretation (and particularly as it relates to meaning) that has often attracted the most direct and trenchant criticism. Michael Dummett has been one of the most important critics of the Davidsonian position (see especially Dummett, 1975). Dummett argues that Davidson's commitment to holism not only gives rise to problems concerning, for instance, how a language can be learnt (since it seems to require that one come to understand the whole of the language at one go, whereas learning is always piecemeal), but that it also restricts Davidson from being able to give what Dummett views as a properly full-blooded account of the nature of linguistic understanding (since it means that Davidson cannot provide an account that explicates the semantic in terms of the non-semantic). More recent criticisms have come from Jerry Fodor, amongst others, whose opposition to holism (not only in Davidson, but in Quine, Dennett and elsewhere) is largely motivated by a desire to defend the possibility of a certain scientific approach to the mind (see especially, Fodor and LePore, 1992).
Davidson's denial of rule-based conventions as having a founding role in linguistic understanding, together with his emphasis on the way in which the capacity for linguistic understanding must be seen as part as part of a more general set of capacities for getting on in the world, underlie Davidson's much-discussed account of metaphor and related features of language (see What Metaphors Mean [1978b]). Davidson rejects the idea that metaphorical language can be explained by reference to any set of rules that govern such meaning. Instead it depends on using sentences with their literal or standard meanings in ways that give rise to new or unexpected insights -- and just as there are no rules by which we can work out what a speaker means when she utters an ungrammatical sentence, makes a pun or otherwise uses language in a way that diverges from the norm, so there are no rules that govern the grasp of metaphor.
Identifying the content of attitudes is a matter of identifying the objects of those attitudes, and, in the most basic cases, the objects of attitudes are identical with the causes of those same attitudes (as the cause of my belief that there is a bird outside my window is the bird outside my window). Identifying beliefs involves a process analogous to that of triangulation whereby the position of an object is determined by taking a line from each of two already known locations to the object in question -- the intersection of the lines fixes the position of the object (this idea first appears in Rational Animals ). Similarly, the objects of propositional attitudes are fixed by looking to find objects that are the common causes, and so the common objects, of the attitudes of two or more speakers who are capable of observing and responding to one another's behaviour. In Three Varieties of Knowledge, Davidson develops the metaphor of triangulation into the idea of a three-way conceptual interdependence between knowledge of oneself, knowledge of others and knowledge of the world. Just as knowledge of language cannot be separated from our more general knowledge of the world, so Davidson argues that knowledge of oneself, knowledge of other persons and knowledge of a common, objective world form an interdependent set of concepts no one of which is possible in the absence of the others.
The way in which the Davidsonian rejection of scepticism does indeed derive quite directly from Davidson's adoption of a holistic, externalist approach to knowledge, and to attitudinal content in general, has sometimes been obscured by Davidson's presentation of his argument against scepticism through the employment (for the first time in Thought and Talk) of the rather problematic notion of an omniscient interpreter. Such an interpreter would attribute beliefs to others and assign meanings to their utterances, but would nevertheless do so on the basis of his own, true, beliefs. The omniscient interpreter would therefore have to find a large amount of agreement between his own beliefs and the beliefs of those he interprets -- and what was agreed would also, by hypothesis, be true. This argument disappears from Davidson's later discussions in which the idea of triangulation comes much more to the fore.
A feature of both the triangulation argument, and the Davidsonian account of radical interpretation, is that the attribution of attitudes must always proceed in tandem with the interpretation of utterances -- identifying content, whether of utterances or of attitudes, is indeed a single project. An inability to interpret utterances (that is, an inability to assign meanings to instances of putative linguistic behaviour) will thereby imply an inability to attribute attitudes (and vice versa). A creature that we cannot interpret as capable of meaningful speech will thus also be a creature that we cannot interpret as capable of possessing contentful attitudes. Such considerations lead Davidson to deny that non-linguistic animals are capable of thought -- where thought involves the possession of propositional attitudes such as beliefs or desires (see especially Thought and Talk). This does not mean that such animals have no mental life at all, nor does it mean that we cannot usefully use mental concepts in explaining and predicting the behaviour of such creatures. What it does mean, however, is that the extent to which we can think of such creatures as having attitudes and a mental life like our own is measured by the extent to which we can assign determinate propositional content to the attitudes we would ascribe to those creatures. A further consequence of this view is that the idea of an untranslatable language -- an idea often found in association with the thesis of conceptual relativism -- cannot be given any coherent formulation. Inability to translate counts as evidence, not of the existence of an untranslatable language, but of the absence of a language of any sort (see On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme )
Since Davidson rejects both sceptical and relativist positions, while nevertheless insisting of the indispensability of an irreducibly basic concept of objective truth, Davidson cannot be easily situated with respect to the realist/anti-realist controversy that, until quite recently, was a major concern of many anglo-american philosophers. The Davidsonian position has, nevertheless, been variously assimilated, at different times and by different critics, to both the realist and the anti-realist camp. Yet realism and anti-realism are equally unsatisfactory from a Davidsonian point of view, since neither is compatible with the holistic and externalist character of knowledge and belief. Realism makes truth inaccessible (inasmuch as it admits the sceptical possibility that even our best-confirmed theories about the world could all be false), while anti-realism makes truth too epistemic (inasmuch as it rejects the idea of truth as objective). In this respect, and as he himself makes clear (see The Structure and Content of Truth), Davidson does not merely reject the specific premises that underlie the realist and anti-realist positions, but views the very dispute between them as essentially misconceived. This reflects a characteristic feature of Davidson's thinking in general (and not just as it relates to realism and anti-realism), namely its resistance to any simple classification using the standard philosophical categories of the day.
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First published: May 29, 1996
Content last modified: November 27, 2002