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Contractarianism, which stems from the Hobbesian line of social contract thought, holds that persons are primarily self-interested, and that a rational assessment of the best strategy for attaining the maximization of their self-interest will lead them to act morally (where the moral norms are determined by the maximization of joint interest) and to consent to governmental authority. Contractualism, which stems from the Kantian line of social contract thought, holds that rationality requires that we respect persons, which in turn requires that moral principles be such that they can be justified to each person. Thus, individuals are not taken to be motivated by self-interest but rather by a commitment to publicly justify the standards of morality to which each will be held. Where Gauthier or economist James Buchanan are the paradigm Hobbesian contractarians, Rawls or Thomas Scanlon would be the paradigm Kantian contractualists. The rest of this entry will specifically pertain to the contractarian strain wherever the two diverge.
In contemporary normative contractarian theories, that is, theories that attempt to ground the legitimacy of government or theories that claim to derive a moral ought, the initial position represents the starting point for a fair, impartial agreement. While contractualists justify the requirement of a fair, impartial agreement by reasons external to the contract itself, contractarians hold that the success of the contract in securing cooperative interaction itself requires that the starting point and procedures be fair and impartial.
Some points of controversy among contractarians concern the role of the initial situation in the theory: is it to be considered an actual historical situation, a possible historical moment, or is the contract situation completely hypothetical? Hume ("Of the Original Contract," pp.470-1) raised the decisive objection to any normative moral or political theory based on a historical contract: the consent of one's ancestors do not bind oneself. But Ronald Dworkin has raised similar concerns about a hypothetical contract: a hypothetical agreement, he objects, is no agreement at all. Hypothetical contract contractarians such as Gauthier counter that the point of the contract device is not to directly bind the contractors, but rather to provide a kind of thought experiment by which to discover the requirements of practical rationality. That is, they argue that if one is rational, and among rational others in circumstances in which agreement is both possible and beneficial, then rationality requires that one abide by the terms of the contract. While mainstream contractarian theories are hypothetical contract theories, a recent interesting and powerfully subversive use of contractarianism (Mills,1997; Pateman, 1989 -- see section on Subversion of Contractarianism below) reads the contract situation as historical agreements to erect and maintain white supremacy and patriarchy or male dominance. These latter contractarian theories are not justifications of the status quo, of course, but rather condemnations, and therefore do not face Hume's objection. Other questions that divide contemporary contractarians include: What are the ideal conditions and who are the ideal contractors that will make obligatory the outcomes of the contract for actual persons? What is the content of the hypothetical agreement?
The second element of a contractarian theory is the rationality of the contractors. First, contractarian (as opposed to contractualist) theories usually take persons to be self-interested in order to justify rules of morality or justice. This is because persons are assumed to have given preferences and interests, that do not necessarily include the well being of others, which is taken to be a moral preference and as such not prior to morality. Such preferences are called (by Gauthier, following the economist Wicksteed) "non-tuistic" preferences. Secondly, persons are presumed to want the benefits of social interaction if they can be had without sacrifice of individual self-interest. (See Feminist Perspectives on the Self (Section 1. Critique) for a critique of this conception of the rational person.) These two aspects of the contractarian individual in part imply what Rawls called the "circumstances of justice": the conditions under which rules for justice could be both possible and necessary. Justice, and so a social contract, is only possible where there is some possibility of benefit to each individual from cooperation. Social contract theories take individuals to be the best judges of their interests and the means to satisfy their desires. For this reason, there is a close connection between liberalism and contractarianism. However, that is not to say that all contractarian thought is liberal. Hobbes, for example, argued in favor of what Jean Hampton has called the "alienation contract," that is, a contract on the part of a people to alienate their rights to adjudicate their own disputes and self-defense to a sovereign, on the grounds that that was the only way to keep the peace given the nature of the alternative, which he famously characterized as life that would be "solitary, poore, nasty, brutish, and short." Thus, given a bad enough initial situation, contractarianism may lead to the legitimation of totalitarianism. Another point of criticism that arises from the characterization of the parties to the contract is that they must be able to contribute to the social product of interaction, or at least to threaten to destabilize it. This is because each individual has to be able to benefit from the inclusion of all those included. But this obviously leaves many, such as the severely disabled(though not the more able disabled -- see Silvers, 1998), outside the realm of justice, an implication that some find completely unacceptable. (Kittay, 1999)
Social contract theories also require some rules to guide the formation of agreement. Since they are prior to the contract, there must be some source of prior moral norms, whether natural, rational, or conventional. The first rule that is normally prescribed is that there must be no force or fraud in the making of the agreement. No one is to be "coerced" into agreement by the threat of physical violence. The reasoning for this is quite straightforwardly prudential: if one is allowed to use violence, then there is no real difference between the "contract" arrived at and the state of nature for the threatened party, and hence no security in the agreement. However, there is a fine line between being coerced by the threat of violence to giving up one's rights and being convinced by the threat of penury to make an unfavorable agreement. For this reason contractarians like Gauthier are able to argue for a fair and impartial starting point for bargaining that will lead to secure and stable agreements. The second rule of contract is that each individual who is a legitimate party to the contract must agree to the rules of justice, which is the outcome of the contract.
The contractarian element of the theory comes in the derivation of the moral norms. According to Gauthier, the compliance problem -- the problem of justifying rational compliance with the norms that have been accepted -- must always drive the justification of the initial situation and the conduct of the contracting situation. Gauthier likens the contract situation to a bargain, in which each party is trying to negotiate the moral rules that will allow them to realize optimal utility, and then he argues in favor of a bargaining solution that he calls "maximin relative concession." The idea of maximin relative concession is that each bargainer will be most concerned with the concessions that she makes from her ideal outcome relative to the concessions that others make. If she sees her concessions as reasonable relative to the others, considering that she wants to ensure as much for herself as she can while securing agreement (and thereby avoiding the zero-point: no share of the cooperative surplus) and subsequent compliance from the others, then she will agree to it. What would then be the reasonable outcome? Gauthier argues that it is the outcome that minimizes the maximum relative concessions of each party to the bargain.
Equally important to the solution as the procedure is the starting point from which the parties begin. For Gauthier there is no veil of ignorance -- each party to the contract is fully informed of their personal attributes and holdings. But Gauthier argues that the initial position must have been arrived at non-coercively if compliance to the agreement is to be secured. He thus adopts what he calls the "Lockean proviso" (modeled after Locke's description of the initial situation of his social contract): that one cannot have bettered himself by worsening others. In sum, the moral norms that rational contractors will adopt (and comply with), according to Gauthier, are those norms that would be reached by the contractors beginning from a position each has attained through her own actions which have not worsened anyone else, and adopting as their principle for agreement the rule of maximin relative concession.
This critique has an analog for Gauthier's theory, in that Gauthier must also claim that without the contract individuals will be stuck in some socially sub-optimal situation that is bad enough to motivate them to make concessions to each other for some agreement, yet the reason for their inability to cooperate without the contract cannot continue to operate after the contract is made. Gauthier's proposed solution to this problem is to argue that individuals will choose to dispose themselves to be constrained (self-interest) maximizers rather than straightforward (self-interest) maximizers, that is, to retrain themselves not to think first of their self-interest, but rather to dispose themselves to keep their agreements, provided that they find themselves in an environment of like-minded individuals. But this solution has been found dubitable by many commentators. (See Vallentyne, 1991)
Hampton also objects to the contemporary contractarian assumption that interaction is merely instrumentally valuable. She argues that if interaction were only valuable for the fruits of cooperation that it bears for self-interested cooperators, then it would be unlikely that those cooperators could successfully solve the compliance problem. In short, they are likely not to be able to motivate morality in themselves without some natural inclination to morality. Interestingly, Hampton agrees with Gauthier that contractarianism is right to require any moral or political norms to appeal to individuals self-interest as a limitation on self-sacrifice or exploitation of any individual.
In an important article, "On Being the Object of Property," African-American law professor Patricia Williams offers a critique of the contract metaphor itself. Contracts require independent agents who are able to make and carry out promises without the aid of others. Historically, while white men have been treated as these pure wills of contract theory, Blacks and women have been treated as anti-will: dependent and irrational. Both ideals are false; whole people, she says, are dependent on other whole people. But by defining some as contractors and others as incapable of contract, whole classes of people can be excluded from the realm of justice. This point has been taken up by other critics of contractarianism, such as Eva Kittay (1999) who points out that not only are dependents such as children and disabled people left out of consideration by contractarian theories, but their caretakers' needs and interests will tend to be underestimated in the contract, as well.
Several of the critiques surveyed above, then, center on the questions: who is allowed to be a party to the contract, and how are those who are excluded from the contract to be treated? On the normative contractarian view, it is only rational to include all of those who can both benefit and reciprocate benefits to others. Normative contractarianism, then, on the assumption that non-whites and women can both benefit and reciprocate benefits to others, shows the sexual and racial contracts to be fundamentally irrational. Disability rights activists, however, would still have a serious complaint to lodge against normative contractarianism, since it is surely the case that there are persons who cannot reciprocate benefits to others. Such persons would be, on the normative contractarian view, beyond the scope of the rules of justice.
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First published: June 18, 2000
Content last modified: June 18, 2000