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When scholars talk of constitutionalism, however, they normally mean something that rules out Rex's case. They mean not only that there are rules creating legislative, executive and judicial powers, but that these rules impose limits on those powers. Often these limitations are in the form of individual or group rights against government, rights to things like free expression, association, equality and due process of law. But constitutional limits come in a variety of forms. They can concern such things as the scope of authority (e.g. in a federal system, provincial or state governments may have authority over health care and education while the federal government's jurisdiction extends to national defence and transportation); the mechanisms used in exercising the relevant power (e.g. procedural requirements governing the form and manner of legislation); and of course civil rights (e.g. in a Charter or Bill of Rights). Constitutionalism in this richer sense of the term is the idea that government can/should be limited in its powers and that its authority depends on its observing these limitations. In this richer sense of the term, there is no "constitution" in Rex's society because the rules defining his authority impose no such limits. Compare a second state in which Regina has all the powers possessed by Rex except that she lacks authority to legislate on matters concerning religion. Suppose further that Regina also lacks authority to implement, or to adjudicate on the basis of, any law which exceeds the scope of her legislative competence. We have here the seeds of constitutionalism as that notion has come to be understood in Western legal thought.
In discussing the history and nature of constitutionalism, a comparison is often drawn between Thomas Hobbes and John Locke who are thought to have defended, respectively, the notion of a constitutionally unlimited sovereign (e.g. Rex) versus that of a sovereign limited by the terms of a social contract containing substantive limitations on her authority (e.g. Regina). But an equally good focal point is the English legal theorist John Austin who, like Hobbes, thought that the very notion of limited sovereignty is incoherent. For Austin, all law is the command of a sovereign, and so the notion that the sovereign could be limited by law requires a sovereign who is self-binding, who commands him/her/itself. But no one can "command" himself, except in some figurative sense, so the notion of limited sovereignty is, for Austin (and Hobbes), as incoherent as the idea of a square circle. Though this feature of Austin's theory has some plausibility when applied to the British Parliamentary system, where Parliament is often said to be "supreme" and constitutionally unlimited, it faces serious difficulty when applied to most other constitutional democracies such as one finds in the United States and Germany, where it is clear that the powers of government are legally limited by a constitution. Austin's answer was to say that sovereignty may lie with the people, or some other person or body whose authority is unlimited. Government bodies -- e.g. Parliament or the judiciary -- can be limited by constitutional law, but the sovereign -- i.e. "the people" -- remains unlimited. Whether this provides Austin with an adequate means of dealing with constitutional democracies is highly questionable. For Austin's sovereign is a determinate individual or group of individuals whose commands to others constitute law. But if we identify the commanders with "the people", then we have the paradoxical result identified by H.L.A. Hart -- the commanders are commanding the commanders. In short, we lapse into incoherence.
Though sovereignty and government are different notions, it does seem possible for them to apply to the same individual or body. It is arguable that Hobbes insisted on the identification of sovereign and government insofar as he seemed to require a (virtually) complete transfer of all rights and powers from sovereign individuals to a political sovereign whose authority was to be absolute, thus rendering it possible to emerge from the wretched state of nature in which life is "solitary, poor, nasty, brutish and short." In Hobbes' theory, supreme sovereignty must reside in the supreme governmental person or body who enjoys unlimited power and authority to rule the commonwealth. Anything less than unlimited government would, given human nature and the world we inhabit, destroy the very possibility of stable government. So even if "sovereignty" and "government" are different notions, this neither means nor implies that the two could not apply to one and the same individual(s).
Consider Regina once again. Were she entitled, at her discretion, to remove (and perhaps later reinstate) the constitutional restriction preventing her from legislating on religious matters, then it is questionable whether she could sensibly be said to be "bound" by this requirement. On the other hand, were there a constitutional rule or convention specifying that Regina is entitled to remove this restriction only if she succeeds in convincing two thirds of her subjects to vote for the change, then we might meaningfully speak of constitutional limitation. Of course this constitutional meta-rule or convention is itself subject to change or elimination -- a fact which raises a host of further puzzles. For example, does such an act require application of the very rule in question -- i.e. two third's majority vote -- or are "the people," as sovereign, at liberty to change or expunge it at their pleasure? If we accept the distinction between government and sovereignty urged above, as well as the proposition that sovereignty cannot be self-limiting, (X cannot limit X) then we seem led to the conclusion that the constitutional meta-rule -- and hence the constitutional regime of which it is an integral part -- both exist at the pleasure of the people. Entrenchment may be an essential element of constitutional regimes, but constitutions cannot be entrenched against the actions of "the sovereign people" at whose pleasure they exist.
Why would one think that constitutional norms must be written rules, as opposed to more informal conventions or social rules? One possible reason is that unwritten rules are sometimes less precise and therefore more open to "interpretation," gradual change, and ultimately avoidance, than written ones. If this were true, then an unwritten rule could not, as a practical matter, serve adequately to limit government power. But this need not be the case. Long standing social rules and conventions are often clear and precise, as well as more rigid and entrenched than written ones, if only because their elimination, alteration or re-interpretation typically requires widespread changes in traditional attitudes, beliefs and behaviour.
Marbury v Madison settled this question in the affirmative as a matter of American law, and most nations follow Marbury (and Montesquieu) in accepting the practical necessity of some such arrangement. But it is not clear that the arrangement truly is practically necessary, let alone conceptually so. Bishop Hoadly notwithstanding, there is nothing nonsensical in the suggestion that X might be bound by an entrenched rule, R, whose interpretation and implementation is left to X. What R actually requires is not necessarily identical with what X thinks or says that it requires, any more than what the American Constitution requires is necessarily identical with what the American Supreme Court says that it requires. This is so even when there is no superior institution to correct X's judgment, or that of the American Supreme Court, when they go wrong. That constitutional limits can sometimes be interpreted so as to avoid their effect, and no recourse be available to correct mistaken interpretations and abuses of power, does not, then, imply the absence of constitutional limitation. But does it imply the absence of effective limitation? Perhaps so, but even here there is reason to be cautious in drawing general conclusions. There is a long-standing tradition within the British Parliamentary system according to which Parliament is alone in being able not only to create, but also to interpret and implement its own constitutional limits. And whatever its faults, there is little doubt that Parliament typically acts responsibly in observing its own constitutional limits.
If, on the other hand, one views a constitution as a "living tree", which by its nature grows and adapts to contemporary circumstances and beliefs, and whose authority resides in its justice, or in the consent, commitment or sovereignty of "the people now," not "the people then," then one will be far less likely to find such appeals persuasive, let alone conclusive. One inclined towards the living tree conception will tend to spurn appeals to textual meaning and authors' intentions as attempts to impose the dead hand of the (possibly distant) past upon contemporary society and practice. Government must be limited in power, but the terms of these limitations should be allowed to evolve and adapt in light of changing circumstances and political beliefs. Despite its undoubted appeal to some, the living tree conception faces tough questions: is viewing a constitution as a "living tree", malleable in the hands of contemporary interpreters -- particularly judges -- consistent with its status as foundational law, and with the entrenchment, stability and protection from unwarranted state power which seem to be crucial, if not essential, aspects of the very idea of constitutionally limited government? Different theories of constitutional interpretation split on how they answer this important question.
Textualism appeals to many, but especially those who accept the fixed view of the constitution, coupled with a belief that a constitution is, principally, one important device through which citizens are protected from unwarranted state power, including unwarranted judicial power. Requiring that judges interpret constitutional provisions in light of the meaning of the constitution's text (particularly the "original meaning" it bore at the time of his adoption) respects the role of the founders in fixing, on behalf of the community, the basic framework of government and the limits within which state power is to be exercised. Political decisions about that proper framework and its constituent limits have, on this theory, already been made in a proper forum by those in whose hands such decisions were rightly placed. Their decisions have been communicated and should not, lest stability and legitimacy be threatened, be subject to continuous revisiting and review, particularly by (typically unelected) judges who lack the authority enjoyed by the constitution's authors. The discovery of textual meaning is (it is thought) a largely factual matter, requiring none of the moral and political reasoning appropriately undertaken by the founders. If constitutional change is required, the constitution itself sets procedures through which such changes can be affected. Should these prove ineffective, and yet change still be warranted, then the people, as the sovereign power underlying constitutional democracies, have the authority to abandon the constitution, through revolution, peaceful or not, and to substitute something else. But so long as the constitution remains in force, the semantic content of its rules must be taken as governing all matters of constitutional law.
Despite its obvious appeal, Textualism -- or as it is sometimes called, "strict constuctionism" -- faces a number of difficulties. First, semantic content is not always fully determinate or stable from one generation to the next. This is especially true of words and phrases like "equality," "due process of law," "fundamental justice," "free and democratic society," "freedom of religion" and so on. These seem to lack the determinate and relatively stable semantic content of phrases like "five year term" or "two-thirds majority." The evaluative concepts expressed by the former are highly contestable politically, perhaps even "essentially contestable," and cannot therefore serve the role suggested by the fixed view.
Textualism faces a further difficulty. Even when the meaning of a word or phrase used in a constitution is plain for all to see, it is not always the case that it is considered dispositive. For example, taken in terms of both its original and (perhaps different) contemporary meaning, the First Amendment of the American Constitution is clearly violated by a whole host of American laws, e.g., those proscribing incitement, perjury and libel. Taken literally the First Amendment renders unconstitutional any law which in any way restricts freedom of speech. If so, then it is unconstitutional in the United States to punish untruthful witnesses, prevent primary school teachers from uttering vicious racial slurs against their minority students, or convict those who incite crowds to violence. But such actions have never been understood to violate the First amendment, leading to the inevitable conclusion that more than semantic meaning governs its interpretation and application. And this is generally, if not universally, true of modern states and their constitutions. But if more than meaning governs, what else counts? The most obvious choice, especially for those attracted to the fixed view, are the "intentions" of the framers. In response to the suggestion that the American First Amendment prohibits laws against perjury, a defender of the fixed view is likely to reply: "But that can't possibly be what the framers had in mind -- what they intended -- in choosing the words they did." This leads us to a second type of interpretive theory, Originalism, which focusses, not on word meaning, but on the intentions of those by whose actions the constitution's various provisions came into existence.
Whatever its precise contours, an Originalist theory is, like Textualism, likely to rest on the fixed view of a constitution. To be sure, the constitution's rules are fixed by the authors' intentions in deciding as they did, and not by the semantic content of the words chosen to communicate those intentions. But they are fixed nonetheless, and must, as a result, not be revisited and revised lest the authority and stability of the constitution be threatened. The intentions of those by whose authority a constitution is made must always govern its interpretation, not the new value judgments and decisions of contemporary judges (or any other interpreters) asking the very same questions the founders intentions were supposed to have settled.
Originalism faces a number of difficulties, some shared with Textualism. For example, original intentions are often unclear, if not completely indeterminate, leaving the interpreter with the need to appeal to other factors. Original intentions can vary from one author to the next, and can range from the very general to the highly specific. At one end of the spectrum are the various, and sometimes conflicting goals and values the authors of a provision intended their creation to achieve. At the other end are the very specific applications the authors might have had in mind when they chose the provision they did. Did the intended applications of an equality provision encompass equal access to the legal system by all groups within society? Or only something more specific like equal access to fairness at trial? Did they perhaps include equal economic and social opportunities for all groups within society? Different authors might have "intended" all, none, or some of these applications when they chose the equality provision. And as with the general goals and values underlying a provision, there is room for inconsistency and conflict. Constitutional authors, no less than legislators, union activists, or the members of a church synod, can have different goals and applications in mind and yet settle on the same set of words. In light of this fact, it is often unhelpful to rely on original intentions when interpreting a constitution.
The Hypothetical Intent Theory faces difficulties too. First, the theory presupposes that we can single out one, consistent set of values, goals and applications attributable to the authors, in terms of which we are to ask the question: What would they have wanted to have done given these (intended) values, goals and applications? But as we have already seen, the authors of a constitution invariably have different things in mind when they agree on a constitutional text. Second, even if we could single out, at some appropriate level of generality, a set of goals, values and applications from which our hypothetical inquiry is to proceed, it is unlikely that there will always be a uniquely correct answer to the question of what the authors would have intended in these cases which they did not anticipate and could not possibly have imagined. What would an 18th century founder, firmly in favour of freedom of speech, have thought about child pornography on the internet? Thirdly, and perhaps most importantly, we are left with the question of why it much matters what a long dead group of individuals might have wanted done were they apprised of what we now know. The main appeal of the original intent theory is that it appears to tie constitutional interpretation to historical decisions actually made by individuals with authority to decide questions concerning the proper limits of government power. If we are now to consider, not what they did decide, but what they might have decided had they known what we now know, then the question naturally arises: Why not just forget this theoretically suspect, hypothetical exercise and make the decisions ourselves? There is some plausibility in the claim that the decision should be made in light of the very general goals and values probably intended by the authors -- if, that is, one could discover what these were and if they could all be rendered consistent. But why should we wish to perpetuate their possibly misguided views about the appropriate ways in which to secure these goals and values? Unless we reject completely the idea that there might be moral progress, or the idea that any such progress must always be dismissed for the sake of a fixedness allegedly guaranteed by adherence to authors' intent, there seems little reason to believe that we should be so tied. To think otherwise might well be to allow the dead hand of the past to govern the affairs of today.
True enough, it might be replied. But the alternative is one which undermines the very point of constitutions. If we view a constitution as a living tree whose limitations are constantly open to revisiting and revision in light of changing times and improved moral/political understanding, then it can no longer function as a stable instrument whose very point and purpose is to limit the power of government -- particularly, though not exclusively, arbitrary judicial power. Arguments of political morality may be necessary to frame a constitution, but if judges and other contemporary interpreters are allowed to construe it in light of how they choose to understand those limits, then the possibility of limitation vanishes. But does it? One theorist who thinks not is Ronald Dworkin, whose theory of constitutional interpretation attempts to do justice to both these points of view.
A crucial element in Dworkin's constitutional theory is his general claim that the law of a community includes more than any explicit rules and decisions authoritatively adopted in accordance with accepted procedures. It does, of course, include many such rules and decisions and these can be found, paradigmatically, in statute books, judicial decisions and, of course, written constitutions. These are often termed "positive law." But the positive law in no way exhausts the law according to Dworkin. Most importantly, for our purposes, it in no way exhausts that part of law we call "the constitution." In Dworkin's view, a constitution includes the principles of political morality which provide the best explanation and moral justification -- i.e. the best interpretation -- of whatever limits have been expressed in positive law. Hence, constitutional interpretation must always invoke a theory of political morality. One concerned to interpret the limits upon government power and authority imposed by a constitution must look to an interpretive theory which provides the positive constitutional law with its morally best explanation and justification.
The development of an interpretive theory of the constitution is, Dworkin acknowledges, an extremely difficult task, and people of good will and integrity will reasonably disagree about which theory is best. There is no mechanical, morally neutral test to apply, only the competing interpretations of those whose task it is to interpret. This does not mean, however, that attempting to evaluate theories is foolish, or that there really is no such thing as a best theory since there is no mechanical way of discovering it. The presence of disagreement, controversy, and uncertainty in constitutional cases, does not entail that there are no right answers to the questions posed, and no uniquely correct theory which determines what those answers are and hence what the constitution actually requires. The presence of such factors entails only that interpreters must, as they must do in all interpretive enterprises, including the arts, the sciences, and the law, exercise judgment in fashioning their interpretive theories. Dworkin goes so far as to argue that in a mature legal system there almost always is a best constitutional theory, and judges (and legislators) are duty-bound to try their best to discern and implement its requirements in making their decisions.
There are, for our purposes, three important implications of Dworkin's theory of constitutional interpretation. First, original intentions and semantic meaning at best set the stage for the debates in political morality which constitutional cases both require and licence. They seldom, if ever, settle matters. Second, constitutional cases require the kind of decision-making which is, on the Originalist and Textualist theories, properly undertaken only by those who have already fixed the standards contained within the constitution -- i.e. its authors or framers. The kind of morally neutral decision-making, under standards set by other responsible agents, to which the Originalist and Textualist theories aspire, is simply impossible on Dworkin's theory. Dworkin's theory requires wholesale rejection of the fixed view.The constitution is not a finished product handed down in a form fixed till such time as its amending formula is invoked successfully or a revolution occurs. Rather it is a work in progress requiring continual revisiting and reworking as our theories concerning its limits are refined and improved. It is, in short, a living tree.A third, related implication of Dworkin's theory is that judges in constitutional cases are not merely agents of the authors in carrying out their explicit decisions. On the contrary, they are partners with the authors in an ongoing project, one which requires participants, both then and now, to engage in the kind of moral decision-making which, on the fixed view, settled matters when the constitution was adopted (and/or amended). The limits to government power are, on Dworkin's theory, essentially contestable, ad infinitum. If there is a correct theory of a constitution, it requires, for its development and elaboration, an interpreter of super-human powers of moral, political and legal reasoning. In short, it requires Dworkin's judge Hercules. But Hercules is a product of Dworkin's imagination, and so the project of interpreting the contestable terms of constitutions is an ongoing one, requiring each and every interpreter to provide her own best, and undoubtedly imperfect, interpretation of the limits placed upon government by her constitution. The latter is never fixed.
So critical theorists are highly skeptical of constitutional practice and theories which applaud constitutionalism as a bulwark against oppression. As we saw at the outset, a key element in the idea of constitutionalism is that government can/should be limited in its powers and that its authority depends on observance of those limits. We further noted that the authority of constitutions in liberal democracies is generally thought to lie in "the people." One important implication of critical theory is that the concept of " the people" is as much a fabrication as is Dworkin's Hercules. Instead of "we the people", western societies are comprised of various groups competing either for domination (e.g., white males and the wealthy) or for recognition and the elimination of oppression (e.g. the poor, women, and racial minorities). The law, including constitutional law, is a powerful tool which has, historically, been utilized by dominant groups to secure and maintain their superior status. As such, a constitution is anything but the protection from unwarranted power that its champions have heralded over the centuries. What is taken to be the plain meaning of the word "equality" is what the dominant group understands it to be. What is taken to be the obvious historical intentions of the framers is whatever intentions fit the ideologies of the dominant groups. What is taken to be the best moral theory underlying the constitution is nothing more than a rationalization of current social structures, all of which systematically oppress the interests of women, minorities and the poor.Critical theories represent a serious challenge not only to conventional theories and established practices of constitutional interpretation, but to the very idea of constitutionalism itself -- the idea that government can and should be limited in ways which serve to protect us from unwarranted state power. According to originalists and textualists, the constitution protects us from judges and other officials by restricting them to morally neutral decisions about historical intentions and semantic meanings. According to Dworkin, it is Hercules' best moral theory of the constitution which serves as the bulwark against oppression. One crucial feature of Hercules' theory is that it is often at odds with received opinion, in particular with the self-serving convictions and prejudices of the various dominant groups within society. Following Hercules' moral theory of the constitution will lead a judge to protect the rights of oppressed groups from the power of dominant groups, especially when that power has the sanction of legislation. But the ordinary judge is not, critical theorists will insist, identical with Hercules. On the contrary, he is more often than not himself a member of the dominant group (e.g. wealthy, white males), and shares the social background, education, perspective, and values of that group. As a result, his conceptions of the relevant contested concepts (e.g., equality or freedom of expression) will be their conceptions -- i.e. conceptions which serve the interests of the dominant groups against whom the constitution is meant to serve as protection. But if semantic meaning, intentions and Hercules' best theory are all at the mercy of dominant ideologies, then the kind of protections heralded by the idea of constitutionalism may be a myth, and a harmful one at that. So what is the solution according to critical theorists? The proffered solutions vary considerably from one critical theorist to the next, depending on how radical or skeptical the theorist tends to be. A revolutionary communist might advocate the complete overthrow of constitutional, democratic government, while many liberal feminists are content to work within existing constitutional systems to eradicate the vestiges of patriarchy which have survived recent feminist movements. But all seem to agree that progress can be made only if the myths surrounding constitutional protection -- the constraining force of meaning, intention, and objective moral theory -- are all exposed, and that the true political forces at work in constitutional practice are acknowledged and dealt with openly. Whether the idea of constitutionalism can survive the lessons of critical theory is a very good question.
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First published: January 10, 2001
Content last modified: January 10, 2001