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The Epistemic Closure Principle

Most of us think we can always enlarge our knowledge base by accepting things that are entailed by (or logically implied by) things we know.  The set of things we know is closed under entailment (or under deduction or logical implication), which means roughly that we know anything that follows from what we know. However, some theorists deny that knowledge is, in fact, closed under entailment, and the issue remains controversial. One might speak of two main camps: those who take closure as a firm datum -- as obvious enough to rule out any understanding of knowledge that undermines closure; and those who want to resolve the controversy by analyzing knowledge and working out the implications for closure. The matter is important, not just because of its bearing on the analysis of knowledge, but also because some theorists say that rejecting the closure principle is the key to defeating skepticism.

1. Is Knowledge Closed Under Entailment?

Precisely what is meant by the claim that knowledge is closed under entailment? One response is that the following straight principle of closure of knowledge under entailment is true:

If person S knows p, and p entails q, then S knows q.

However, the straight principle is obviously false, since we can know one thing, p, but fail to see that p entails q, or for some other reason fail to believe q. Since knowledge entails belief (according to nearly all theorists), we fail to know q. A less obvious worry is that we might reason badly in coming to believe that p entails q. Perhaps we think that p entails q because we think everything entails everything, or because we have a warm tingly feeling between our toes.

Obviously, the straight principle needs qualifying, but this should not concern us so long as the qualifications are natural given the idea we are trying to capture, namely, that we can extend our knowledge by recognizing, and accepting thereby, things that follow from our knowledge. The qualifications embedded in the following principle seem natural enough:

If S knows p, and believes q by recognizing that p entails q, then S knows q.

If we continue in this way, qualifying the closure principle to handle counterexamples, can we finally devise a version that is true?

1.1 Tracking and Closure

Perhaps, but Fred Dretske, Robert Nozick and others have made a powerful case for rejecting any such principle, however qualified. They attack the closure principle on the basis of a distinctive analysis of knowledge -- what Nozick calls the tracking theory. To know p is to track the fact that p; simplifying greatly, the claim is that S tracks (and hence knows) p if and only if there is a reason R such that (a) S's belief p is based on the fact that R holds, and (b) if p were false, R would not hold. Somewhat surprisingly, it turns out that we can track a fact, believe a second fact by seeing, correctly, that it follows from the first, yet fail to track the second fact. The main reason is that the following inference is invalid:

1. If p were false then R would not hold (i.e., we track p)

2. p entails q.

3. So if q were false then R would not hold (i.e., we track q).

Consider one of Dretske's own illustrations: suppose you are in an ordinary zoo standing in front of a cage marked ‘zebra’. There is, in fact, a zebra there, in plain sight, and you believe z: the animal in the cage in front of you is a zebra. You believe z on the basis of R, your having zebra-like sensory impressions. You track the fact that z; if the animal were not a zebra, you would have different sensory impressions -- R would not hold. But now notice that z entails not-m: the animal in the cage is not a mule that is cleverly disguised to look like a zebra. Seeing this, you believe not-m. Your basis for believing not-m is your having zebra-like sensory impressions, together with the recognition that these support the belief z and that not-m follows from z. Nonetheless, you fail to track the fact that not-m, for if the animal were a cleverly disguised mule, you would still have zebra impressions, leading you to believe z and ultimately not-m.

As Dretske and Nozick point out, we will probably reject the closure principle if we equate knowledge with tracking. However, many theorists prefer to argue in the other direction: they have assumed, somewhat in the style of G. E. Moore (1959), that the closure principle, suitably qualified, is obviously true, so any argument to the contrary must be flawed. Hence it is the tracking account that must be rejected.

1.2 Indication, Safety, and Closure

Sosa (1999, 2001) and Luper (1984, 1987b) sustain the closure principle by replacing (b) of the tracking account with its contraposition -- namely, R would hold only if p were true. When this condition is met, S's belief p has a property that Sosa calls safety; alternatively, one might say that R indicates that p is true. Suppose that S knows p if and only if S bases the belief p on a reason R that indicates that p is true. Then knowledge is closed, since R indicates that a proposition p is true only if R also indicates that p's consequences are true. For the following inference (via strengthening the consequent) is valid:

1. R would hold only if p were true (i.e., R indicates p)

2. p entails q

3. So R would hold only if q were true (i.e., R indicates q).

1.3 Reliabilism and Closure

According to the reliabilist theory of knowledge, S knows p if and only if S's true belief p is caused or sustained by a reliable belief-formation mechanism. Is the reliabilist committed to closure? The answer depends on precisely how the relevant notion of reliability is understood. One of the first reliabilist theories, offered by Alvin Goldman, is very similar to the tracking view, for Goldman argued that knowing p entails having the capacity to discriminate between the situation in which p is true, on the one hand, and alternative situations (in which p is false) that might arise given the circumstances at hand. If we understand reliability as tracking theorists do, we will reject closure. But there are other versions of reliabilism, which sustain closure. For example, the indicator account is a type of reliabilism. Also, we could say that a true belief p is reliably formed if and only if based on an event that usually would occur only if p (or a p-type belief) were true. Any event that, in this sense, reliably indicates that p is true will also reliably indicate that p's consequences are true.

1.4 Internalism and Closure

Reliabilists adopt externalist accounts of knowledge: they say that factors outside of a subject's perspective can help determine whether she knows things. Other theorists embrace internalism: the view that only factors internal to a subject's perspective can affect the epistemic status of her beliefs. Will internalists accept the principle of closure? The answer is not obvious, since there is no agreed-upon internalist account of knowledge. However, almost all internalists will agree that knowledge entails justified true belief. (Some externalists will accept this too, usually after giving justification an externalist analysis, say in terms of reliable indication.) Assuming they are correct, then the issue of closure rests on whether or not justification is itself closed under entailment. Is it? The matter is not settled. Some argue that justification is not closed, using counterexamples like Dretske's own zebra case: because the zebra is in plain sight, you seem fully justified in believing z, but it is not so clear that you are justified in believing not-m, even if you deduce this belief from z. Your zebra-like experiences constitute good evidence for z, but are they good evidence for not-m? The following principle seems questionable:

If E is evidence for p, and p entails q, then E is evidence for q.

But even if we reject this principle (of the transmissibility of evidence or justification), it does not follow that justification is not closed under entailment, as Peter Klein pointed out. For closure of justification, all that is necessary is that when, given all of our relevant evidence E, we are justified in believing p, we also have sufficient justification for p's consequences. Our justification for p's consequences need not be E. Instead, it might be p itself, which is, after all, a justified belief. And since p entails its consequences, it is sufficient to justify them. Moreover, any good evidence we have against a consequence of p counts against p itself, preventing us from being justified in believing p in the first place, so if we are justified in believing p, considering all our evidence, pro and con, we will not have overwhelming evidence against propositions entailed by p. (A similar move could be defended against the tracking theorists when they deny the closure of knowledge: if we track p, and believe q by deducing it from p, then we track q if we take p as our basis for believing q.) Looked at in this way, the following principle of closure of justification seems correct:

If, considering all of S's evidence, S is justified in believing p, and S believes q by deducing it from p, then S is justified (on the basis of p, or alternatively, on the basis of p plus the deduction itself) in believing q.

However, to avoid paradox, it must be understood that our principle applies only to the implications of individual propositions, not to conjunctions of propositions. We are not always justified in believing the conjunction of claims that are individually justified. To see why, notice that if the chances of winning a lottery are sufficiently remote, then I am justified in believing that ticket 1 will lose. I am also justified in believing that ticket 2 will lose, and that 3 will lose, and so on. However, I am not justified in believing the conjunction of these propositions. If I were, I would justifiably believe that no ticket will win. Yet I know that some ticket will.

2. Is Denying Closure the Key to Resolving the Issue of Skepticism?

According to tracking theorists, we can account for the appeal of skepticism and explain where it goes wrong if we accept their view of knowledge and reject the principle of closure of knowledge. Rejecting closure is therefore the key to resolving skepticism. Given the importance of insight into the problem of skepticism, they would seem to have a good case for denying closure. Let us consider the story they present, and some worries about its acceptability.

2.1 Tracking and Skepticism

According to tracking theorists, skepticism is appealing because skeptics are partially right. They are correct when they say that we do not know that skeptical hypotheses fail to hold. For example, I do not know not-biv: I am not a brain in a vat on a planet far from earth being deceiving by alien scientists. For I do not track not-biv: if biv were true, I would still have the experiences that lead me to believe that biv is false. Skeptics are also correct when they point out that not-biv is entailed by all sorts of commonsense claims, such as h: I am in San Antonio. Having gotten this far, skeptics appeal to the principle of closure, and argue that since I would know not-biv if I knew h, then I must not know h after all. But this is precisely where skeptics go wrong: having accepted the tracking view -- as they do when they deny that we know skeptical hypotheses are false -- skeptics cannot appeal to the principle of closure, which is false on the tracking theory. We track (hence know) the truth of ordinary knowledge claims yet fail to track (or know) the truth of things that follow, such as that incompatible skeptical hypotheses are false.

One problem with this story is that it cannot come to terms with all types of skepticism. There are two main forms of skepticism (and various sub-categories): regress (or Pyrrhonian) skepticism, and indiscernability (or Cartesian) skepticism. At best, Dretske and Nozick have provided a way of dealing with indiscernability skepticism, not regress skepticism.

Another worry about the tracking theorist's account of indiscernability skepticism is that it forces us to give up the principle of closure. Given the intuitive appeal of this principle, some theorists have looked for alternative ways of explaining skepticism. Consider two possibilities, one offered by advocates of the indicator theory and one by contextualists.

2.2 Indication and Skepticism

Advocates of the indicator theory (Sosa 1999, Luper 1987b, 2001) accept the gist of the tracking theorist explanation of the appeal of skepticism but retain the principle of closure. The reason skepticism tempts us is that we tend to confuse the tracking account with the indicator account. After all, the tracking condition -- if p were false, R would not hold -- closely resembles the indication condition -- R would hold only if p were true. When we run the two together, we sometimes apply the tracking account and conclude that we do not know that skeptical scenarios do not hold. Then we shift back to the indicator account, and go along with skeptics when they appeal to the principle of entailment, which is sustained by the indicator account, and conclude that ordinary knowledge claims are false. But skeptics are wrong when they say we do not know that skeptical hypotheses are false. Roughly, we know skeptical possibilities do not hold since (given our circumstances) they are remote.

2.3 Contextualism and Skepticism

Contextualists, such as Stewart Cohen (1988, 1999), Keith DeRose (1995) and David Lewis (1996), offer yet another way of explaining skepticism without denying closure. According to contextualists, whether it is correct for a judge to attribute knowledge to someone depends on that judge's context, and the standards for knowledge differ from context to context. When the man on the street judges knowledge, the applicable standards are relatively modest. But an epistemologist takes all sorts of possibilities seriously that are ignored by ordinary folk, and so must apply quite stringent standards in order to reach correct assessments. What passes for knowledge in ordinary contexts does not qualify for knowledge in contexts where heightened criteria apply. Skepticism is explained by the fact that the contextual variation of epistemic standards is easily overlooked. Skeptics note that in the epistemic context it is inappropriate to grant anyone knowledge. However, skeptics assume -- falsely -- that what goes in the epistemic context goes in all contexts. They assume that since those who take skepticism seriously must deny anyone knowledge, then everyone, regardless of context, should deny anyone knowledge. Yet people in ordinary contexts are perfectly correct in claiming that they know all sorts of things.

Furthermore, the closure principle is correct, contextualists say, so long as it is understood to operate within given contexts, not across contexts. That is, so long as we stay within a given context, we know the things we deduce from other things we know. But if I am in an ordinary context, knowing I am in San Antonio, I cannot come to know, via deduction, that I am not a brain in a vat on a distant planet, since the moment I take that skeptical possibility seriously, I transform my context into one in which heightened epistemic standards apply. When I take the vat possibility seriously, I must wield demanding standards that rule out my knowing I am not a brain in a vat. By the same token, these standards preclude my knowing I am in San Antonio. Thinking seriously about knowledge undermines our knowledge.


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knowledge: analysis of | skepticism | skepticism: ancient

Copyright © 2001 by
Steven Luper

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First published: December 31, 2001
Content last modified: December 31, 2001