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Jean Piaget's (1933 ) well-known theory of cognitive development suggests that prior to age 11 or 12, most children are not capable of philosophical thinking. This is because, prior to this time, children are not capable of thinking about thinking, the sort of meta-level thinking that characterizes philosophical thinking. This formal operational level of cognitive development includes analogical reasoning about relationships, such as: Bicycle is to handlebars as ship is to rudder, with steering mechanism being the similar relationship. (Goswami, p. xxi). However, there is a growing body of psychological research suggesting that Piaget's account seriously underestimates children's cognitive abilities. (Astington, 1993; Gopnik, et.al.)
Philosopher Gareth Matthews goes further and argues at length that Piaget failed to see the philosophical thinking manifest in the very children he studied. Matthews (1980) provides a number of delightful examples of very young children's philosophical puzzlement. For example:
Matthews acquired many of his anecdotes from friends who knew of his interest in the philosophical thinking of children. It is not uncommon for attentive adults to encounter such examples.
However, it might be objected that more than such anecdotes are needed to show that children are capable of serious philosophical thinking. What is needed is evidence that children are capable of sustained philosophical discussion. Matthews (1984) provides illustrations of this, too. Meeting with a group of 8-11 year olds, he used the following example to develop a story for discussion:
Ian (six year old) found to his chagrin that the three children of his parents' friends monopolized the television; they kept him from watching his favorite program. Mother, he asked in frustration, why is it better for three children to be selfish than one? (Pp. 92-3)
This generated a lively discussion in which children commented on the inconsiderateness of the three visiting children, the desirability of working out a solution that would satisfy all four children, the importance of respecting people's rights, and how one might feel if he or she were in Ian's place. Matthews then posed a possible utilitarian approach: What about this argument, that if we let the three visitors have their way, three people will be made happy instead of just one? One reply was that it would not be fair for three people to get what they want at the expense of a fourth. This triggered a discussion of fairness that addressed more specific concerns about the relative ages of the children, whether they are friends, siblings, or strangersand what types of television programs are involved.
No doubt, part of the explanation of the children's ability and willingness to carry on an extended discussion of Ian's circumstance is that they have faced similar challenges. Still, the children exhibited a rather sophisticated conceptual grasp of the issues at hand, which is what one might expect from children once they are invited to reflect on their own experiences.
Stories about those roughly their own age can provide opportunities for children to discuss ideas that are most important to them. Consider this example from Matthew Lipman's novel Lisa (1983 ). Harry and his friend Timmy go to a stamp club to trade stamps. Afterward they stop for ice cream cones, but Timmy discovers he has no money. Harry offers to buy him one, and Timmy says he will buy Harry a cone next time. As they are leaving the store, one of their classmates trips Timmy. Timmy then knocks the tripper's books off the table. After running away from the scene, Timmy and Harry talk about what has happened:
I couldn't let them get away with it, Timmy remarked when they saw that they weren't being pursued and could slow down to a walk. He didn't have to stick his foot out. Then he added, Of course, I didn't have to do what I did either. But, like I said before, turnabout is fair play.
Somehow," Harry thought, it isn't quite the same thing. But he couldn't figure out why. I don't know, he said finally to Timmy. The purpose of your stamp club is to exchange stamps. So when you give someone stamps, you're supposed to give something back. Just like if someone lends me money, I'm supposed to give it back. But if someone pulls a dirty trick on you, should you do the same thing to him? I'm not so sure.
But I had to get even, Timmy protested. I couldn't let him get away with it, tripping me like that for no reason.
A bit later they met Lisa and Laura. Harry told the girls what had happened and why he was puzzled. It reminds me, remarked Lisa, of last year when we were learning about how some sentences could be turned around and would stay true, while others, when you turned them around, would become false.
Yeah, Harry agreed, but there we found a rule. What's the rule here? Lisa tossed her long hair so that it hung over her right shoulder. It looks like there are times when it is right to give back what we got and other times when it is wrong. But how do we tell which is which? (Lisa, pp. 23-4)
This passage is an invitation to explore the moral nuances of reciprocity, or returning in kind. What might a group of 10-11 year-olds have to say about this? Here is a sampling from a 30 minute discussion of the Lisa passage by a group of fifth graders. (Pritchard 1996) Although the group had been discussing philosophical ideas once a week after school for the past several months, this was an impromptu discussion of this passage. With little prompting from the teacher, the students raised and vigorously pursued the following questions:
Thoughtful and insightful discussions like this are not unusual for children who are given the opportunity to have them. This discussion was prompted by a children's novel. However, students' regular classroom materials, works of art, thought experiments, or even the daily newspaper can be used to trigger philosophical discussions of moral concerns.
Even if one concedes that children are quite capable of engaging in extended discussions of moral concepts related to their own experiences, what about philosophical ideas less related to their practical affairs? Here is an illustration that begins with logic and ends up in metaphysics.
The true sentence, All oaks are trees becomes false when reversed. So does, All carrots are vegetables. Can we say that every true sentence beginning with all becomes false when reversed?
At least as early as the 3rd grade, children easily find exceptions. What about All tigers are tigers, many will ask. Others may respond that this is a boring sentence, offering something like All rabbits are hares, or All mothers have children as alternatives. With relatively little encouragement, they can come up with good definitions of geometric figures and differentiate them from proposed definitions that cannot be reversed. For example, All squares are rectangles is true, but it becomes false when reversed. All squares are rectangles with equal sides, however, can be reversed.
Although the study of logic is traditionally regarded as a part of philosophy, skeptics might not find the reflections of children on rules of logic terribly interesting philosophically. (Of course, some might say this about elementary logic in the college classroom, as well.) It is not that different from basic math and grammar, they might object. Whether or not this is a fair assessment, for many children it is but a short step from logic to metaphysics. Here is an example from a 4th grade class that had just been asked whether true sentences beginning with all always become false when reversed. (Pritchard 1996) reversed. After the usual All tigers are tigers and All rabbits are hares were suggested, a student asked, How about All answers have questions and All questions have answers? Fortunately, the teacher paused to explore this with the class. Do all answers have questions? he asked. Of course, replied the students, otherwise we would not say that we have an answer.
The teacher continued, How about the other sentence? Do you think that all questions have answers? What followed was a flood of responses:
During the course of discussing these questions, the students seemed to be struggling to move from questions that are difficult, if not impossible, to answer because of our practical limitations (e.g., not being certain that a particular grain of sand has not already been counted) to questions that in principle are unanswerable. Finally, with a mischievous grin on his face, one of the students asked, Will time end? The problem, he explained, is that if time did end, no one would be able later to confirm that this was so.
Here is another illustration of how quickly a discussion of logic can move to a discussion of deep philosophical issues. (Pritchard, 1985) This is a group of 5th graders considering the sentence, All people are animals. One of the students offered this as another example of a true sentence that becomes false when reversed. Jeff objected that All people are animals is not true. Chip proceeded to develop a taxonomy that relegated people, along with elephants and tigers, under the heading of mammals, mammals under animals, and animals under living things. Jeff continued to object.
Chip: Jeff, what are people? Just tell me, what are people? You can't answer that, can you?
Jeff: Yes, I can.
Chip: What are you?
Jeff: A person.
Chip: What's a person?
Jeff: A living somebody.
Chip: A living somebody could be a whale.
Jeff: I said, somebody, not an animal .
Chip: You can check every single book out there in the librarywell, every one that's about us .
Larry: I want to know why everyone's getting so huffy about a little subject.
Rich: We're thinking! That's what we're here for.
Amy: Does anyone have an encyclopedia in here so we can look up either animals, mammals, or persons?
Jeff: We're all humans. So, if this Mars guy saw us, he would say, Hey, look, there's some human beings. He wouldn't say, Hey, look, there's some animals down there.
Mike: Martians, if there are any, would say, Hey, look at those weird looking creatures, or something like that. They wouldn't know what we are. They don't know anything about us. [Returning now to Jeff's original distinction, Mike continues.] If it's a person, you say, somebody. If it's an animal you say, something. Somebody is a human body.
Chip: There's living life, okay? Then you branch off from there. You have animals plants, and whatever the other stuff isyou know, molecules and things like that. Now you go to the animals and you branch offmammals, amphibians, reptiles, and whatever there is. Then you branch off and you have all these special humans. Is that right so far, Jeff?
Jeff: Just go on.
Chip: Well, I just want to know if you agree so far.
Jeff: Just go on. Go on. I'm not going to change my mind. That's all . I'm not an animal. I'm a person, and I'm going to stay that way.
Chip: You're a type of animal.
Jeff: I'm not going to walk up to Dr. Jekyl and say, Hey, change me into an animal .
Amy: People are a type of animal, like a bird is. That's different than like an elephant is. A bird's different than an elephant. And we're different than a bird. Mike says we don't call our dog a person or somebody. But someone might be real close to their pet and consider it part of the family.
The discussion continued for several more minutes. As the group dispersed, one student remarked to another, If we want to, we could argue for hours! For days, replied the second. Meeting weekly after school in the local public library, this group of children returned the next week with an encyclopedia to settle the matter. After several minutes of discussion, the teacher asked the students if they thought everything in the encyclopedia is true.
Emily: Some things we're not sure of; and the encyclopedia could put down every word about how the solar system was formed, and it would probably say there was big dust that spun around like a top. But we're not sure about that. And, so, that could be wrong.
The teacher asked whether, in such cases, the encyclopedia says, We're not sure?
Mike: It'll say hypothesiswhich is a guess.
Kurt: It'll say we're not sure yet.
So, the discussion retained its philosophical vitality. This particular group continued to meet for the entire school year, discussing a wide range of philosophical topics, including: the relationship between the mind and the brain, differences (and similarities) between dreams and reality, knowledge of other minds, self-knowledge, and relationships between evidence and knowledge.
Given an already crowded curriculum and growing pressure to provide quantifiable evidence of student mastery of the standard subjects of history, literature, math, and science, teachers may question the suitability of adding philosophy to the curriculum. Where is time to be found for the give-and-take of philosophical discussions? Adding philosophy to the mix, they might object, only makes matters worse. Not only is it yet another subject, it is one that is unfamiliar to most teachers, and they may fear that bringing in philosophy, with its continual questioning, will actually interfere with students' mastery of the subjects already in the curriculum. Given the unsettling nature of much philosophical inquiry, they may feel vulnerable as teachers because they are not confident of their own answers to the questions posed.
Adding to this problem is increasing pressure on teachers to demonstrate that their students are performing at satisfactory levels in the standard subjects. Standardized tests are commonly used as the measure of student achievement. Marked by definitive, unambiguous questions and answers, these tests do not place a premium on philosophical reflection. Since student performance is typically linked to school funding, this is not something teachers can take lightly, however skeptical they might be about the educational value of preparing their students to perform well on standardized tests.
In response, Matthew Lipman (1991) and others who advocate bring philosophy into the schools emphasize ways in which philosophy can enhance the entire educational experience of students. The aim is more than simply the introduction of one more subject in the schools. By inviting students to reflect on relationships among different areas of inquiry and to make sense of their educational experiences as a whole, philosophy can add to the meaningfulness of students' education as a whole. In addition, philosophy can make important contributions to another area of concern that cuts across the curriculum, critical thinking.
As the Vietnam War escalated in the mid-1960's, so did heated arguments about the wisdom and morality of the war and society's ills in general. Matthew Lipman became dismayed at the quality of argumentation employed by presumably well-educated citizens. Convinced that the teaching of logic should begin long before college, he tried to figure out a way to do this that would stimulate the interest of 10-11 year olds. Leaving Columbia University for Montclair State College, he launched his efforts with his first children's novel, Harry Stottlemeier's Discovery(1974). Lipman's concerns about the level of critical thinking in society in general, and the schools in particular, were not his alone. By the 1970's the hue and cry for teaching critical thinking in the schools was, if not clear, at least loud; and it has continued largely unabated to the present.
What is meant by critical thinking? Characterizations range in complexity from Robert Ennis's admirably brief, reasonable reflective thinking that is focused on deciding what to believe or do (Ennis) to a complex statement by group of 46 panelists convened by the American Philosophical Association's Committee on Pre-College Philosophy to employ the Delphi Method of striving for consensus:
We understand critical thinking to be purposeful, self-regulatory judgment which results in interpretation, analysis, evaluation, and inference, as well as explanation of the evidential, conceptual, methodological, criteriological, or contextual considerations upon which that judgment is based . The ideal critical thinking is habitually inquisitive, well-informed, trustful of reason, open-minded, flexible, fair-minded in evaluation, honest in facing personal biases, prudent in making judgments, willing to reconsider, clear about issues, orderly in complex matters, diligent in seeking relevant information, reasonable in the selection of criteria, focused in inquiry, and persistent in seeking results which are as the subject and the circumstances of inquiry permit. (Facione 1989)
Lipman was a member of this panel, and it is clear that his novels and teacher's manuals all strive to meet these objectives. His briefer depiction of critical thinking is that it involves judgments based on criteria, or reasons. Criteria, he says, can be appraised in terms of megacriteria such as reliability, relevance, strength, coherence, and consistency. (Lipman 1991, p. 119) Critical thinking, he adds, is characterized as thinking that (1) facilitates judgment because it (2) relies on criteria, (3) is self-correcting, and (4) is sensitive to context. (Lipman 1991, p. 116)
Picking up on the idea that critical thinking is sensitive to context, critics challenge the notion that critical thinking can be usefully taught independently of specific disciplinary areas. (McPeck) While conceding that there are some generic features of critical thinking that cut across disciplines, they maintain that even these features acquire their meanings only in specific contexts that vary across disciplines (such as history, sociology, biology, chemistry). However, unless the different disciplines ask questions about their own basic assumptions and their relationships to one another, critical thinking within those disciplines will overlook important questions that need attention. Philosophy does ask such questions about other disciplines, as well as about itself.
Lipman's hope is that philosophy will acquire a central place in the K-12 curriculum, thus enabling students to develop their critical thinking skills through philosophical questioning. At the same time, he claims, philosophy can help students make better sense of their educational experiences. By seeking to develop comprehensive perspectives, philosophy attempts to understand connections. A curriculum that divides students's education into discrete, self-contained disciplines without encouraging philosophical questions about the nature of those disciplines and their relationships to one another invites a fragmented view of education.
Short of the ambitious program Lipman has in mind for the schools, there are more modest, but worthwhile, ways of bringing philosophical inquiry into the already existing disciplinary structure in the schools. Teachers can invite their students to reflect on philosophical aspects of their subjects of study. At the same time they study history, students can take some time to ask questions about the extent to which historical accounts can be objectiveand questions about what objectivity might mean, and why it is or is not important to seek it. Similar questions can be asked about the natural and social sciences, including questions about the extent to which science is, or ought to be, value-free. (see Goldfarb and Pritchard, in the Other Internet Resources section below). In fact, if room for such questions is not encouraged, one might well ask to what extent critical thinking itself is encouraged.
The educational movement known as Philosophy for Children got its start in the early 1970s with the publication of Matthew Lipman's philosophical novel for children, Harry Stottlemeier's Discovery. In 1970 Harry made its entry into the Montclair Public Schools in New Jersey. By the mid-70s the Institute for the Advancement of Philosophy for Children (IAPC) was formally in place at Montclair State College (now Montclair State University). The media quickly picked up on reports of significant improvements in the reading and critical thinking skills of middle school children who were involved in IAPC programs. Subsequently, IAPC has produced materials consisting of children's novels with accompanying teachers' workbooks for the entire K-12 curriculum. Thousands of children in New Jersey, across the United States, and even around the world have been introduced to IAPC educational programs.
An unassuming 96 page novel for middle-school children, Harry Stottlemeier's Discovery features Harry and his 5th grade classmates. Adults occasionally enter in, but the primary philosophical work is the children's. Harry and his friends discover several basic concepts and rules of Aristotelean logic; and they puzzle over questions about the nature of thought, mind, causality, reality, knowledge and belief, right and wrong, and fairness and unfairness. The story does not introduce any of the special vocabulary of philosophy (not even the word philosophy itself makes an appearance). Philosophical inquiry is initiated by the children in the story rather than adults.
What is Harry Stottlemeier's discovery? Harry's readers might ask. This question is not directly answered. However, one candidate stands out among the many things that Harry discovers in the course of exploring questions about logic, knowledge, reality, and the mind. Harry and his classmates are asked to write a paper on the topic, The Most Interesting Thing in the World. Entitled Thinking, Harry's essay begins:
To me, the most interesting thing in the whole world is thinking. I know that lots of other things are also very important and wonderful, like electricity, and magnetism and gravitation. But although we understand them, they can't understand us. So thinking must be something very special.
After writing several more paragraphs, Harry puts his paper aside. Later he thinks, In school, we think about math, and we think about spelling, and we think about grammar. But who every heard of thinking about thinking? So, he adds one more sentence to his paper: If we think about electricity, we can understand it better, but when we think about thinking, we seem to understand ourselves better.
Without using the word philosophy, either here or anywhere else in Harry, Lipman shows Harry engaged in serious philosophical thought, thinking about thinking. This, we might say, reveals Harry's discovery of the joys of philosophical thinking. But there is more. Harry also notices that, as interesting and important as thinking about thinking is, it seems to have no special place in school. Finally, although his paper begins in the first person, it quickly moves to we and focuses on what might be accomplished with others in the classroom.
One of the more attractive features of Philosophy for Children for many teachers is that it promotes the idea of the classroom as a community of inquiry in which students openly and respectfully exchange ideas. Each student is regarded as having the potential to make valuable contributions to the topics under consideration. Students are encouraged to develop good listening skills, responsiveness to what others say, willingness to try to supports one's own ideas with good reasons, and openness to the possibility that one should modify one's beliefs in light of new considerations. In short, the classroom is designed to reinforce the student's potential for reasonableness. This involves more than being able to engage in skillful reasoning. As Laurance J. Splitter and Ann M. Sharp put it (Splitter and Sharp, p. 6):
Reasonableness is primarily a social disposition: the reasonable person respects others and is prepared to take into account their views and their feelings, to the extent of changing her own mind about issues of significance, and consciously allowing her own perspective to be changed by others. She is, in other words, willing to be reasoned with.
Teachers who look favorably on the idea that the classroom should be a community of inquiry nevertheless may resist the idea that philosophy should be the centerpiece for discussion. Other subjects, they might contend, lend themselves well to forming the sort of collaborative learning environment that can fairly be called a community of inquiry. Philosophy for Children advocates need not deny this; however, they can point to the success IAPC has had in showing how well suited philosophy is for promoting the reasonableness of children in a community of inquiry.
One reason for resistance is that it may be thought that philosophy is, at best, a suitable subject for relatively few students at the pre-college level. Since philosophy traditionally has been taught only at the college level in the United States, it might be thought that it can be suitable for only a small segment of students at pre-college levelsthe two percent of students who are classified as gifted and talented. However, Philosophy for Children programs have shown themselves to be remarkably successful in drawing virtually all students in the classroom together in inquiry. Teachers are often surprised, and pleased, to see many of their most reticent, underachieving students actively join in the discussion of philosophical ideas.
Nevertheless, because they lack background in the formal study of philosophy, many teachers are reluctant to encourage the philosophical thinking of their students. Their fears, however, are exaggerated. Familiarity with some of the standard philosophical literature might be desirable, but it is not necessary for bringing Philosophy for Children into the classroom. What is required is the ability to facilitate philosophical discussion. For this, it is much more important that teachers have some philosophical curiosity themselves than a familiarity with academic philosophical literature. Like their students, teachers unfamiliar with the discipline of philosophy may nevertheless have an aptitude for philosophical thinkingor at least a knack for recognizing when others are engaged in philosophical thought.
Facilitating a Philosophy for Children discussion does not mean dominating it; it is important for teachers to allow their students to develop their own ideas. Teachers are not expected to provide, or even have, answers to all the questions. They can share puzzlement with their students, be open to unexpected but suggestive responses to the questions they and their students pose, and take pleasure in observing the exchanges students have with each other. This means shedding the traditional role of teacher as lecturer and answer-giver. Especially for teachers who are uncertain about what this entails, workshops like those offered by IAPC provide a good introduction to the pedagogy of Philosophy for Children.
IAPC's approach has been to prepare a set of novels with accompanying teacher's workbooks, and to prepare teachers to use these materials by conducting intensive workshops that themselves illustrate the proposed pedagogy. It is emphasized that the teacher's role in the classroom is to facilitate discussion rather than to present philosophical ideas didactically. The novels provide a stimulus for children to come up with their own questions and ideas. Typically, students first read aloud a few paragraphs of a novel. Then they suggest ideas prompted by their reading that they would find it interesting to explore together. The teacher's workbook contains hundreds of thinking exercises and activities that can help the students advance their inquiry. The teacher's aim should be to foster a community of inquiry in which students, insofar as possible, themselves initiate discussion and exchange ideas with each other rather than simply respond to teacher prompts. A robust discussion will find students not only stating their own ideas, but also supporting them with reasons and responding to the similarities and differences between their ideas and those of their classmates. This community of inquiry is intended to foster a respect for the ideas of others, as well as a respect for one's own.
For this to work, it must be possible for children in the classroom to engage in sustained philosophical discussion with others. As already noted, Gareth Matthew's writings provide ample evidence that many children of capable of having interesting, if not profound, philosophical thoughts. Less obvious, however, is children's ability to sustain and develop this with others. Anecdotes of young children spontaneously sharing a philosophical thought with an observant adult are not sufficient. Matthews' Dialogues With Children provides good evidence that children can go well beyond this. Transcripts of lengthy philosophical conversations of children found in Pritchard (1985, 1996) and issues of Thinking and Analytic Teaching should leave little doubt that children have this ability.
Admittedly, this is quite different from the approach of Jostein Gaarder's popular novel, Sophie's World, which introduces young readers to philosophy in a dialectical, but nevertheless didactic manner. (New York: Farrar, Straus and Giroux, 1994) Although Sophie is certainly an apt philosophy student, her older mentor clearly leads the way by introducing Sophie to the history of philosophy, which in turn is used to illuminate philosophical questions that confront her. As its subtitle A Novel About the History of Philosophy suggests, Sophie's World aims as much at acquainting its young (and older) readers with a working familiarity with the history of philosophy as at encouraging philosophical reflection itself. Philosophy for Children aims primarily at the latter, however much IAPC materials themselves might indirectly be informed by the history of philosophy. In any case, IAPC supporters might argue, the mentor/apprentice approach of Sophie's World tends to reinforce the idea that philosophy is primarily something passed down from adults rather than, as Gareth Matthews suggests, an important aspect of children's natural curiosity.
In 1985, as a reflection of the rapidly expanding international impact of philosophy for children, educators from around the world established the International Council for Philosophical Inquiry with Children (ICPIC). ICPIC sponsors an international conference every other year, with hosts including Australia, Austria, Brazil, England, Mexico, Spain, and Taiwan. Although retaining strong ties with IAPC, ICPIC members have established their own institutional structures and they have developed centers, associations, and programs independently of IAPC. In North America, there is the North American Association of Community of Inquiry, which meets every other year (years when ICPIC is not meeting). Australia and New Zealand are organized under the Federation of Australasian Philosophy for Children Associations (FAPCA), which meets annually. Philosophy for children endeavors can be found in colleges, universities, and associations in more than 20 countries around the world. (Sasseville)
In addition to IAPC materials, there is a great deal of children's literature with rich enough content to be used to facilitate interesting philosophical discussions. (See Matthews, 1980, 1984, 1994 and his regular contributions to IAPC's journal, Thinking.) There is also a growing body of philosophy for children educational materials being developed outside of IAPC. (See, e.g., Cam; DeHaan, MacColl, and McCutcheon; Fisher; Keen; Murris; Sprod, and White.) Thinking, Analytical Teaching, and Critical & Creative Thinking are three longstanding journals that are specifically devoted to the philosophical thinking of children. A new periodical, sponsored by the American Philosophical Association's Pre-College Philosophy Committee, is Questions: Philosophy for Young People, which features young people's writings on special philosophical topics. The first issue (Spring 2001) focused on children's rights.
Fortunately, the internet makes it possible to keep up with the latest developments around the world and communicate quickly with other educators interested in Philosophy for Children. See the Other Internet Resources section below for a useful list.
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First published: May 2, 2002
Content last modified: May 2, 2002