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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Manipulability and Causation


1. As Pearl readily acknowledges, his work draws on a long tradition in econometrics of interpreting equations that express causal claims as claims about the outcomes of hypothetical experiments - see, e.g., Haavelmo, 1944.

2. For a related distinction, see Hitchcock, forthcoming.

3. More accurately, the interventionist account of type causation diverges from what seems to be the natural way of extending Lewis' theory to such causes. Consider a simple example discussed in Woodward, forthcoming. C is a deterministic direct (type) cause of E but also deterministically causes E indirectly by means of n causal routes that go through C1,…,Cn. Consider the counterfactual (1) "If C1,…,Cn had not occurred, E would not have occurred". As explained above, any counterfactual theory will need to employ such counterfactuals to capture the notion of direct cause or causation along a route. On the interventionist account of the relationship between causal claims and counterfactuals, (1) is false, since under the assumption of the antecedent of (1), C will still occur and will cause E. Intuitively, this the correct assessment of (1). Under Lewis' theory, we have a choice between two different possible worlds that realize the antecedent of (1). In the first C occurs and each of the n links between C and C1,…,Cn are broken. This requires n distinct miracles. In the second world, C fails to occur and hence C1,…,Cn also fail to occur. This second world has less perfect match with the actual world than the first world, but involves only one miracle. At least for large n, Lewis' similarity ordering tells us that this second world is closer to the actual world. Thus (1) comes out true.

Copyright © 2001 by
James Woodward

First published: August 17, 2001
Content last modified: August 17, 2001