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1. As Pearl readily acknowledges, his work draws on a long tradition in econometrics of interpreting equations that express causal claims as claims about the outcomes of hypothetical experiments - see, e.g., Haavelmo, 1944.
2. For a related distinction, see Hitchcock, forthcoming.
3. More accurately, the
interventionist account of type causation diverges from what seems to
be the natural way of extending Lewis' theory to such causes.
Consider a simple example discussed in Woodward, forthcoming.
C is a deterministic direct (type) cause of E but
also deterministically causes E indirectly by means of
n causal routes that go through
Consider the counterfactual (1) "If
,Cn had not
occurred, E would not have occurred". As explained above,
any counterfactual theory will need to employ such counterfactuals to
capture the notion of direct cause or causation along a route. On the
interventionist account of the relationship between causal claims and
counterfactuals, (1) is false, since under the assumption of the
antecedent of (1), C will still occur and will cause
E. Intuitively, this the correct assessment of (1). Under
Lewis' theory, we have a choice between two different possible
worlds that realize the antecedent of (1). In the first C
occurs and each of the n links between C and
broken. This requires n distinct miracles. In the second
world, C fails to occur and hence
fail to occur. This second world has less perfect match with the
actual world than the first world, but involves only one miracle. At
least for large n, Lewis' similarity ordering tells us
that this second world is closer to the actual world. Thus (1) comes
First published: August 17, 2001
Content last modified: August 17, 2001