# Arthur Prior

*First published Mon Oct 7, 1996; substantive revision Tue Nov 30, 1999*

Arthur Prior (1914-1969) undertook pioneering work in intensional logic at a time when modality and intensional concepts in general were under attack. He invented tense logic and was principal theoretician of the movement to apply modal syntax to the formalisation of a wide variety of phenomena. Prior and Carew Meredith devised a version of the possible worlds semantics several years before Kripke published his first paper on the topic. An iconoclast and a resourceful innovator, Prior inspired many to undertake work in intensional logic.

- Work on Tense Logic
- Work on Modal Logic
- Prior's Life
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## Work on Tense Logic

Prior's most significant achievement was undoubtedly the invention and development of tense logic. His earliest mention of a logic of time-distinctions is to be found in the penultimate chapter of his unpublished manuscript*The Craft of Formal Logic*(completed in 1951). Following von Wright in ‘Deontic Logic’ he remarks that there are other groups of modal predicates to be set alongside the ordinary or ‘alethic’ modes of necessity and possibility. Prior refers to these non-alethic modalities as ‘quasi-modals’. After noting that Peter of Spain classified adverbial distinctions of time as modes he says (p. 750):

That there should be a modal logic of time-distinctions has been suggested in our own day by Professor Findlay.Findlay's paper ‘Time: A Treatment of Some Puzzles’ had appeared in the

*Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy*in 1941. Prior became aware of it as a result of its appearance in Flew's 1951 collection

*Essays on Logic and Language*, which arrived in New Zealand just as Prior was writing the final chapters of

*The Craft.*The suggestion Prior refers to is barely more than a passing comment: "[O]ur conventions with regard to tenses are so well worked out that we have practically the materials in them for a formal calculus", wrote Findlay. He continued in a footnote:

The calculus of tenses should have been included in the modern development of modal logics. It includes such obvious propositions as thatx present ↔ (x present) present;also such comparatively recondite propositions as thatx future ↔ (x future) present ↔ (x present) future;

(x).(x past) future; i.e., all events, past, present and future,willbe past.

Prior's first paper on the logic of tenses, ‘Three-Valued Logic
and Future Contingents’, appeared in the *Philosophical
Quarterly* for 1953. In 1949 he had learned from Geach's review of
Julius Weinberg's *Nicolaus of Autricourt: A Study in 14th Century
Thought* that for the scholastics an expression like
‘Socrates is sitting down’ is complete, in the sense of
being assertable as it is, and is true at certain times, false at
others. Prior had been brought up on the view -- prevalent even today
-- that such an expression is incomplete until a time-reference is
supplied, and hence that one cannot speak of the truth-value of the
expression as altering with the passage of time. This was a crucial
discovery for Prior: the idea that propositions which are subject to
tense-inflections are liable to be true at one time and false at
another was to become central to his philosophy. In a summary of his
mature views on temporal realism composed nearly two decades later he
wrote:

Certainly there are unchanging truths, but there are changing truths also, and it is a pity if logic ignores these, and leaves it … to comparatively informal ‘dialecticians’ to study the more ‘dynamic’ aspects of reality. (Prior 1996a: 46.)

Geach's review sent Prior to the sources, and he found that the ‘Socrates is sitting down’ example is not only in the scholastics but in Aristotle. Moreover, he discovered that Aristotle speaks of some propositions about the future - namely those about such events as are not already predetermined - as being neither true nor false when they are uttered, on the ground that there is as yet no definite fact with which they can accord or conflict. Prior quotes Aristotle's argument for believing that there are such events (De Interpretatione, ch.9): if there were not "there would be no need to deliberate or take trouble, on the supposition that if we should adopt a certain course, a certain result would follow, while, if we did not, the result would not follow" (1953: 232-3). This appealed to Prior, once a Barthian Calvinist but now on the side of indeterminism and freewill. There can be no doubt that Prior's interest in tense logic was bound up with his belief in the existence of real freedom (see, for example, Prior 1996b).

Over thirty years earlier, inspired by these same passages of
Aristotle, Łukasiewicz had devised a three-valued calculus whose
third value, ½, attached to propositions referring to future
contingencies (Łukasiewicz 1920). Prior's 1953 article
‘Three-Valued Logic and Future Contingents’ is an
exposition and defence of Łukasiewicz's system (which he had read
about in Lewis and Langford's *Symbolic Logic* and in Jordan's
monograph *The Development of Mathematical Logic and of Logical
Positivism in Poland Between the Two Wars*). Prior thought, at this
stage, that the logic of tensed propositions could be three-valued and
that of tenseless propositions two-valued (1967: 16).

In sum, three-valued logic does seem to bring new precision to our handling of statements with tenses (as opposed to the fundamentally tenseless propositions of the common systems); and we may say that Łukasiewicz has, by means of it, done for Aristotle's chapter on ‘future contingents’ what he has done elsewhere for the Aristotelian theory of the syllogism. (Prior 1953: 325.)

However, the Łukasiewicz system is far from being the
‘calculus of tenses’ at which Findlay had hinted. The
system contains explicit syntactic representations of the alethic
modalities but there is no syntactic representation of
tense. Moreover, the simple addition of another truth value is hardly
the means by which to do justice to Prior's key insight that
propositions subject to tense-inflection can *change* in truth
value with the passage of time: ‘Socrates is sitting down’
can be true at one time, false at another, and adding a third value
does not help represent this change. It was some months before Prior
realised that the use of off-the-shelf modal syntax was all that was
required for the representation of this dynamical feature of tensed
propositions. It was simply a matter of taking seriously the idea that
he had discussed in *The Craft*: tense is a species of modality.

In 1953 Prior read of the work of the Megarian logician Diodorus
Chronos in Benson Mates' book *Stoic Logic*. Prior later wrote of
Diodorus that he "seems to have been an ancient Greek W.V. Quine, who
regarded the Aristotelian logic of possibility and necessity with some
scepticism, but offered nevertheless some ‘harmless’
senses that might be attached to modal words" (1967: 16). Diodorus
defined the possible as what is or will be true: according to
Diodorus, what actually happens is all that *can* happen. Prior
found this deterministic definition uncongenial and set himself the
task of locating a fallacy in the argument that Diodorus used to
support it, the so-called Master Argument:

The aim of the Master Argument, as I conceive it, was to refute the Aristotelian view that while it is now beyond the power of men or gods to affect the past, there are alternative futures between which choice is possible. Against this, Diodorus held that the possible is simply what either is or will be true. (1962a: 138; see also 1967: 33.)

Consideration of the Master Argument brought together three of Prior's great interests: indeterminism, modal logic, and the logic of time. In the course of his reflections on the argument, Findlay's footnote pushed its way to the front of his mind. His wife Mary remembers "his waking me one night, coming and sitting on my bed, and reading a footnote from John Findlay's article on time, and saying he thought one could make a formalised tense logic." His first explorations of this calculus of tenses appeared in his article ‘Diodoran Modalities’, completed by early 1954 and published in 1955. (‘Diodoran’ is Prior's term, ‘Diodorean’ is Mates's. In 1958 Prior switched to the latter.) In it he wrote:

I here propose to do something a little different, namely to employ the ordinary propositional variables ‘p’, ‘q’, ‘r’ etc., for ‘propositions’ in the Diodoran sense [i.e. propositions which ‘may be true at one time and false at another’] and to use certain operators which take such propositions as arguments, and which form functions taking such propositions as values. I shall use ‘Fp’ for ‘It will be the case that p’. (1955b: 205.)

The axioms and rules of the calculus that Prior sets out in this
article owe much to von Wright's 1951 axiomatisation of Lewis' modal
system S4 (*An Essay in Modal Logic*, Appendix II). Von Wright
obtains S4 by adding the following axioms and rules to the classical
propositional calculus (Lp is defined as -M-P):

W1. p → MpSubstituting his new operator F for M throughout the axioms produced, in the case of W1, a clear falsehood and in the case of W2 and W3, formulae which he found ‘obvious enough’. The result of substituting F into RE also made good sense to him. To deal with RL he introduced a tense-prefix G by means of a definition paralleling von Wright's definition of L, viz. Gp=-F-p; he read G as ‘it will be always be the case that’. Thus his 1953/54 calculus of tenses was the system produced by adding the F-analogues of W2, W3 and RE, and the G-analogue of RL, to the classical propositional calculus. (Prior remarks that an operator P may be introduced for ‘It has been the case that p’ but states no axioms or rules concerning it.) He shows that if, following Diodorus, Mp is defined as pvFp, von Wright's three modal axioms and two rules are all derivable in his calculus.W2. M(pvq) ↔ (Mp)v(Mq)

W3. MMp → Mp

RE. If X ↔ Y is a thesis, so is MX ↔ MY

RL. If X is a thesis so is LX.

In a matchless piece of philosophical reconstruction Prior expresses the conclusion of the Master Argument, that what neither is nor will be true is not possible, as (-p&-Fp) → -Mp and derives it in his calculus from Diodorus' premisses, Pp → -M-Pp and -Mq → (L(p → q) → -Mp), together with two ‘broad assumptions about time, likely to have been taken for granted both by Diodorus and by his main opponents’: p → HFp and (-p&-Fp) → P-Fp. So the Master Argument is indeed valid. The fallacy, Prior tells us, lies with the second ‘broad assumption’, (-p&-Fp) → P-Fp (which says: when anything neither is nor will be the case, it has been the case that it will not be the case). This, Prior tells us, is not true if p refers to a future contingency (and thus has the truth value ½ or ‘indeterminate’). Where p is indeterminate both Fp and -Fp are indeterminate, so the consequent of the disputed formula, P-Fp, is false. -p must also be indeterminate (for if the negation of p were determinate p could not be indeterminate). Thus the antecedent of the disputed formula, -p&-Fp, is indeterminate, since both its conjuncts are indeterminate. According to the Łukasiewicz truth-table, an indicative conditional with a false consequent and an indeterminate antecedent is not true but indeterminate.

→ 1 ½ 0 1 1 ½ 0 ½ 1 1 ½ 0 1 1 1

Thus Prior is able to "deny that propositions of the form [(-p & -Fp) → P-Fp] are in all cases true".

This reasoning of Prior's is persuasive only if one accepts the
Łukasiewicz truth-table. Yet are there not indicative
conditionals with false consequents and indeterminate antecedents that
are *true*? For example, let Fp be ‘I will kill
myself’, and let us suppose that Fp is indeterminate (since I
have not yet decided). So PFp is false: there has as yet been no time
at which Fp is true. Yet it seems excessively harsh always to withhold
the value True from the indicative conditional ‘If Fp then
PFp’ (harsh given, at any rate, that temporal succession is
transitive and that atypical moments such as the first moment of time
are not under consideration). The difficulty is that in the
conditional form a statement that is actually indeterminate in value,
Fp, is supposed *true*. If Fp is now true then the present moment
lies in an epoch throughout which it is the case that p's future truth
is determined. Unless the moment of utterance happens to be the very
first moment of this epoch there are past moments at which Fp is true,
so PFp is now true. So, given some suitable assumption concerning such
epochs, which for the present purposes may be chosen ad libitum (for
example, it will suffice to assume that such epochs are always open
intervals in continuous linear time), it is the case that if Fp is
true then PFp is true. The claim that the conditional ‘if Fp
then PFp’ is indeterminate simply because its antecedent happens
to be so (and its consequent false) cannot be sustained in the present
situation, for what the above reasoning shows is that (under the
assumption) the combination antecedent True, consequent False cannot
arise.

At bottom what this indicates, of course, is that the two-valued equivalence between -pvq and p → q does not extend to the three-valued case. -pÃq may be indeterminate and yet, as in the present example, there be no principled reason for withholding the value True from p → q. Łukasiewicz's idea that propositions about the future may be assigned a third truth-value is not as straightforward as it may seem. Prior himself later came to see that "[t]he truth-functional technique seems simply out of place" where indeterminate propositions are concerned (1967: 135). It was the treatment of conjunction that particularly troubled Prior. According to the Łukasiewicz truth-table, p&q is indeterminate where p and q are both indeterminate, yet as Prior remarks, if q is the negation of an indeterminate p then p&q is not indeterminate even though both its constituents are. The proposition ‘There both will and won't be a sea battle tomorrow’ is, Prior says, "plain false".

The Master Argument for determinism continued to exercise Prior for the rest of his life, and some of the most useful and mathematically most interesting parts of his work were inspired by his thoughts on it. To choose just one example, from computer science, the calculi that Prior developed in response to the idea that the Master Argument is defeated if time is conceived as branching into the future have become useful for describing and verifying the behaviour of concurrent and distributed processing systems.

The tense calculus that Prior worked out in ‘Diodoran Modalities’ was hardly complete. For one thing there were no axioms or rules for the past tense operator P, and for another the calculus' two axioms, FFp → Fp and F(pvq) ↔ (Fp)v(Fq), had been chosen in an almost haphazard manner, by transforming certain axioms of a calculus designed for a rather different purpose. Prior duly set about expanding his calculus. He worked fast, and in August 1954 he presented a system of far greater sophistication in his Presidential Address to the second New Zealand Congress of Philosophy, held in Wellington. (Prior himself had organised the first Congress in Christchurch the previous year.)

His first step was to add two additional axioms concerning futurity, Gp → Fp and Fp → FFp. The former is the tense-analogue of Lp → Mp, a thesis whose derivation involves von Wright's axiom W1 (which is false under a tense-logical interpretation). The second of the new axioms is the converse of one of the original axioms. Prior remarks that it is suggested by ‘common notions on the subject of time’. Next he made a simplification which drew on a recent proof by Sobociński that von Wright's weakest system M is equivalent to Feys' system T: by taking G as undefined and defining F as -G-, he was able to replace the somewhat unwieldy axiom F(pvq) ↔ (Fp)v(Fq) by G(p → q) → (Gp → Gq) (Sobociński 1953).

This calculus of ‘pure futurity’ can be transformed into
a calculus of ‘pure pastness’ by replacing F by P and G by
H (‘It has always been the case that’) throughout the
axioms, rules and definition. (Charles Hamblin was later to describe
this process and its reverse as producing the
‘mirror-image’ of what one starts with.) Like the alethic
systems, both these ‘pure’ calculi are
*monomodal*. That is, each contains only one undefined modal
operator. Prior wanted a ‘full tense calculus in F and P’:
a *bimodal* logic (i.e. a logic containing two undefined modal
operators). To obtain the bimodal system it was not enough to simply
bundle together the futurity axioms and rules with their mirror
images, for the two tense operators would then remain independent of
one another. Some *interactive* axioms, "laws which relate to the
interaction of pastness and futurity", were also required. Prior chose
p → GPp and p → HFp. He found the first of these in William
of Ockham's *Tractatus de Praedestinatione* and the second was
one of the formulae he himself had used in his reconstruction of the
Master-Argument. Thus Prior constructed the first multimodal system.

Prior honoured Findlay by proving one of the propositions stated
in his footnote as the first theorem of the full tense calculus: all
events, past, present and future, will be past. In tense-logical
notation this is (pvPpvFp) → FPp, a formula that Prior was later
to refer to simply as Findlay's law. (Prior describes Findlay's own
suggested symbolisation of the proposition, (x).(x past) future, as
‘unfortunate’, since "the formula suggests that
*everything* will have been the case (even permanent falsehoods)"
(1967: 9).)

In ‘Diodoran Modalities’ Prior was content to describe FFp → Fp as ‘obvious enough’. By the time of the Wellington Congress his thinking had moved forward considerably. In a strikingly original section of a strikingly original paper he set out what he called the l-calculus (he was later to prefer the term ‘U-calculus’). In the l-calculus the propositions of the tense calculus are treated as predicates expressing properties of dates, the latter being represented by name-variables x, y, z. The concatenation ‘px’ is read as ‘p at x’. ‘l’ is a binary relation taking dates as arguments and is read ‘is later than’. Using an arbitrary date z to represent the time of utterance, Fp is equated with (x)(lxz & px) (‘p at some time later than z’), and Pp with (x)(lzx & px) (‘p at some time earlier than z’). Gp and Hp are equated with the universal quantifications (x)(lxz → px) and (x)(lzx → px), respectively. Prior's key idea was that by imposing various conditions on the relation l, analogues of the axioms of the tense calculus can be derived in the l-calculus. (It was this idea that he and Carew Meredith were to exploit two years later in devising the possible worlds semantics for modal logic.)

Prior discovered that FFp → Fp and its mirror-image require for
their derivation the condition lxy → (lyz → lxz), asserting
that the later-than relation is transitive. Fp → FFp and its
mirror-image require the condition lxz → (Ey)(lxy&lyz), which
asserts that ‘between any two dates there is another
date’. Gp → Fp requires the condition that ‘there is
a date later than any given date’, (Ex)lxz (mutatis mutandis for
the mirror-image). Prior notes that no conditions are required for the
derivation in the l-calculus of the two interactive axioms p →
GPp and p → HFp nor for the axioms G(p → q) → (Gp
→ Gq) and H(p → q) → (Hp → Hq): in the case of
these formulae the standard machinery of truth-functional and
quantificational logic suffices for their derivation (this applies
also to the two rules of the calculus). It was these latter formulae
that Lemmon later took as axioms for his minimal tense logic
*K _{t}*, a system making no assumptions concerning
contingent properties of the later-than relation.

Prior closes this section with a warning against regarding this
interpretation of the tense calculus within the l-calculus as "a
metaphysical explanation of what we mean by *is*, *has been*
and *will be*": the l-calculus is not "metaphysically
fundamental". His reason is that F(Socrates is sitting down) means
‘It is *now* the case that it will be the case that
Socrates is sitting down’, and there is no genuine way of
representing the indexical ‘now’ in the l-calculus (the
free variable z is ‘a complete sham’). He continues: "If
there is to be any ‘interpretation’ of our calculi in the
metaphysical sense, it will probably need to be the other way round;
that is, the l-calculus should be exhibited as a logical construction
out of the PF-calculus rather than *vice versa*." This idea of
the primacy of the tense calculus over the l-calculus - or, as he was
later to put it, of McTaggart's A-series over the B-series - was to
become a central and distinctive tenet of his philosophy. Prior's
thesis is perhaps even more radical in its application to modal logic:
the language of possible worlds is to be interpreted in terms of a
language with modal operators and not - as is popularly held - *vice
versa*. These issues form the theme of his final book *Worlds,
Times and Selves* (edited by Kit Fine).

The text of the Wellington address was not published until 1958 (in
the journal *Franciscan Studies*, under the title ‘The
Syntax of Time-Distinctions’). It was the 1956 John Locke
lectures and the ensuing book *Time and Modality* (published in
1957) that brought Prior's discoveries in tense and modal logic before
a wider audience. A number of logicians - notably Thomas, Geach,
Lemmon, Meredith and Kripke - took an immediate interest in Priorean
modal logic, in particular his Diodorean system and his system Q, a
multivalued logic admitting the existence of contingent beings. Less
immediate attention was paid to his tense logic. The bibliography of
the subject in Prior's 1968 volume *Papers on Time and Tense*
reveals that up until 1965 the only publications in the field were
either by Prior himself or were reviews of his work (chiefly of
*Time and Modality*). Yet a momentum was slowly gathering.

At a colloquium on modal and many-valued logics held in Helsinki in
1962 Hintikka proposed a tense-logical construal of his possible
worlds semantics, maintaining that ‘if we do not want to tie our
logic to old-fashioned physics, we are undoubtedly wiser if we … no
longer require that the alternativeness relation (in this case it
could perhaps be more appropriately termed "futurity relation") effect
a linear ordering’ (1963: 76). (Prior had happily tied his 1954
l-relation to ‘old-fashioned physics’. He made it clear
that he did not think much of the view of time embodied in twentieth
century physics (1996b: 49-51).) A pupil of von Wright, Hintikka had
been stimulated by the latter's proposals for the wide application of
modal logic (see the next section) and had come to appreciate the
possibility of applying modal notions to the study of the logic of
time before he read of Prior's sophisticated work in *Time and
Modality* (which he reviewed in 1958). Hintikka was perhaps the
first to stress the importance of a semantical approach to the
tenses. During the early 1960s Hintikka travelled regularly between
Helsinki and California. His ideas on tense influenced a number of
logicians working in California, in particular Dana Scott.

Also in 1962, Scott gave a lecture on tense logic in Amsterdam. Among his audience was Hans Kamp, then an undergraduate. Scott's work on tense logic was one aspect of his study of the semantics of natural language, which he pursued in close collaboration with Richard Montague. Scott was aware of Prior's work, and was also influenced in his understanding of tense by Reichenbach, who had been a powerful figure at UCLA until his death in 1953. (Prior himself was critical of Reichenbach's analysis of the tenses, and described it as having been ‘in some ways a hindrance rather than a help to the construction of a logic of tenses’ (Prior 1967: 13, Reichenbach 1948).) Scott's tense logic was rather different in style from Prior's. Scott established the completeness and decidability of various axiomatic tense logics. He also showed that the temporal predicate logic of the reals is non-axiomatisable. His work in tense logic is cited widely but remains unpublished. Prior learned of Scott's work in a letter from Lemmon dated January 1964. (Lemmon had left Oxford in 1963 for Claremont, near Los Angeles. Scott was then at Stanford.)

In 1965 Prior visited California for several months, as Flint
Professor of Philosophy at UCLA. For the first time Prior found
himself among a group of enthusiasts for tense logic. Shortly after
the visit ended he was to write: "I suppose that California is the
most logically mature place in the world, and now that the logic of
tenses is pursued so widely and so vigorously there, its raw
pioneering days can be considered over" (1967: vi). When Prior arrived
at UCLA Nino Cocchiarella was just completing a Ph.D. thesis on
quantified modal and tense logic under Montague's supervision
(‘Tense and Modal Logic: A Study in the Topology of Temporal
Reference’). Cocchiarella's interest in the philosophy of time
had initially been aroused by Reichenbach's work on space and time but
it was his acquaintance with Prior's *Time and Modality* that
swept him into tense-logical research. (Only later did he learn of
Scott's work.) Prior's visit coincided with Hans Kamp's arrival at
UCLA as a graduate student. Kamp attended Prior's lectures on tense
logic in his first semester and became deeply interested in the
subject. These lectures led more or less directly to the topic of
Kamp's Ph.D. thesis, written under Montague's supervision and entitled
‘On Tense Logic and the Theory of Order’ (1968). In Kamp's
work the development of tense logic achieved a new level of formal
sophistication. Segerberg, too, had just arrived in California, to
study under Scott at Stanford. (Segerberg had become interested in
tense logic in Finland in 1964 at a series of summer seminars given by
von Wright, who was independently pursuing a tense logic that had
arisen from his study of the logic of action and which was later shown
to be equivalent to a system Prior had discussed in *Time and
Modality* (Prior 1957: 23-4; see von Wright 1965 and Segerberg
1967, 1989).) In December of 1965 Scott delivered his famous talk to
the Hume Society at Stanford entitled ‘The Logic of
Tenses’. A multilith of Scott's handwritten notes for this talk
has been circulating ever since among tense logicians. Four days later
Prior himself addressed the Society, again on tense logic. It was in
this fecund atmosphere that Prior completed the manuscript of his book
*Past, Present and Future*, which remains to this day one of the
most important references in the field.

The years 1965-7 saw the publication of work in tense logic by Åqvist, Bull, Clifford, Cocchiarella, Garson, Geach, Hamblin, Luce, Makinson, Rescher, Segerberg, von Wright - and, of course, Prior. In a little over a decade Prior's invention had become an internationally pursued branch of logic.

Prior always had a firm belief that his tense logic would one day find useful application in other disciplines (possibly in mathematical physics, he thought). When the outside demand for tense logic did come it was from computer science. An early and influential application was by Pnuelli, who employed tense logic in formal reasoning about the behaviour of concurrent programs (Pnuelli 1977). (A concurrent program is one that governs the behaviour of a number of interacting processors running in parallel.) Pnuelli is sometimes mistakenly credited with having originated tense logic but in fact he first learned of it from the classic volume ‘Temporal Logic’ by Rescher and Urquhart (1971) (Ohrstrom and Hasle 1995: 344). This volume is dedicated to Prior and is an elegant introduction to his work.

Prior would not have been completely surprised to learn how useful
tense logic is proving to be in computer science. He himself took
little interest in computing beyond including material on elementary
boolean circuit theory in his undergraduate lectures, but a number of
the logicians with whom he was in touch were more deeply involved (Dov
Gabbay and Dana Scott, for instance). Through others Prior knew
something of the potential. He wrote "There are practical gains to be
had from this study too, for example in the representation of
time-delay in computer circuits" (1996a: 46). In *Past, Present and
Future* he remarked concerning logics of discrete time that their
usefulness "does not depend on any serious metaphysical assumption
that time *is* discrete; they are applicable in limited fields of
discourse in which we are concerned only with what happens next in a
sequence of discrete states, e.g. in the workings of a digital
computer" (1967: 67). Other logics from the group that he and von
Wright pioneered are also finding computational applications, for
example epistemic logic in Artificial Intelligence and knowledge-base
engineering, and the logic of action in programming theory.

It is noteworthy that two of the major forces in the genesis of
these software technologies were a love of ancient and medieval logic
and a concern to make conceptual room for freedom of the human
will. Only people who know little of the history of ideas will find
any incongruity here. Would that those who now control and administer
the funding of university research were less unaware of the oblique
ways in which idea gives rise to idea.

## Work on Modal Logic

Prior's own interest in modal logic arose chiefly from his study of the ancients. His earliest written piece on modal logic, the penultimate chapter of his manuscript*The Craft of Formal Logic*(completed in 1951) is largely historical in nature, with discussions of Aristotle, Peter of Spain, John Wallis, the

*Port Royal Logic*, Isaac Watts'

*Logick*, Hume and Mill on natural necessity, de Morgan, Whately, Aldrich. One of his conclusions, significant for his later work, is that "[t]here is everything to be said … for the … view that we may not only use devices developed in the study of quantity to throw light on modality, but also

*vice versa*" (p.747). One of the most distinctive features of his mature philosophy was the view that quantification over possible worlds and instants is to be interpreted in terms of modality and tense, which constitute primitive notions - a view which he held in tandem with the belief that the study of such quantifications could usefully illuminate the study of modality and tense (as in his own U-calculi, described below). The chapter contains brief comparisons of the symbolic notations of Łukasiewicz, Feys and Lewis, but Prior makes very little use of the symbols he describes. At one point he explains that symbolic notation can be used to good advantage to bring out the difference between ‘Everything has something which is F to it’ and ‘There is something which is F to everything’. Probably Prior was just beginning to appreciate the power of the new symbolism to express the subtle distinctions demanded by his subject matter.

Early in 1951 Prior read von Wright's article ‘Deontic
Logic’, and the penultimate chapter of *The Craft *contains
a cameo discussion of this topic. Von Wright's influence is also clear
in the paper Prior read in August of that same year to the AAP
Conference in Sydney, entitled ‘The Ethical Copula’. Here
Prior discusses and defends the parallel von Wright drew in
‘Deontic Logic’ between moral words and modal words. No
doubt Prior found in deontic logic a significant connection between
his existing interest in ethics and his fast-developing interest in
modal logic.

Prior's reading of von Wright reinforced in his mind an idea that he
had come across in Peter of Spain, Isaac Watts and the *Port Royal
Logic*, an idea that was to be of considerable importance for his
own future work. What von Wright calls the ‘alethic’ modes
- necessity, possibility, impossibility and contingency - are members
of an extended group of concepts that includes the epistemic modes
(‘it is known that’, ‘it is not known to be false
that’, etc.), the doxastic modes (for example ‘it is
believed that’), and the deontic modes (such as ‘it is
permitted that’ and ‘it is obligatory that’). In
*The Craft* Prior also lists Watts' ‘it is written
that’ and ‘it is said that’, noting that "one could
think of innumerable others" (p.749). Later von Wright was to draw
attention to what may be called the agentive modes: ‘the agent
brings it about that’, ‘the agent makes it true
that’, and the like (von Wright 1963). Prior introduces the
collective term ‘quasi-modals’ for the non-alethic modes
(p.749) and remarks, accurately, that "there is a hint of a large
field here" (p.752). He was later to refer to his own tense operators
as quasi-modal operators (1968: 138). By the time he wrote *Formal
Logic* he was advocating the study of "the general modal form
‘It is -- that p’; … as a distinct propositional form",
observing that "this field has not been much cultivated" (1955a:
218). Between them Prior and von Wright pioneered the now much
investigated field of general intensional logic, as it may be called,
in which the syntax, and latterly the semantics, developed for the
study of the alethic modalities is used in the analysis of a wide
range of quasi-modal concepts. Von Wright's deontic logic and Prior's
tense logic were the first major successes in this field. Another has
been the logic of action or the logic of the agentive modes.

Prior was convinced that no satisfactory metalinguistic analysis can
be given of sentences having the general modal form ‘It is --
that p’. In *Formal Logic* he writes "It is quite plain,
for example, that I am not talking about the sentence ‘Socrates
is dead’; when I say ‘I wish that Socrates were
dead’; " (1955a: 219). In *Time and Modality* he reiterates
the point, now in connection with the tenses: "‘Professor Carnap
will be flying to the moon’; … is quite obviously a statement
about Professor Carnap, and quite obviously not a statement about the
statement ‘Professor Carnap is flying to the moon’" (1957:
8). What, then, is the semantic value of an expression replacing p in
a sentence of the general modal form ‘It is -- that p’?
Certainly not a truth value, as is the case with the standard
extensional propositional calculus, for substituting a different
expression with the same truth value into the sentence of the form
‘It is -- that p’ may alter the truth value of the latter
sentence. Prior's answer - and in a sense it amounts to a rejection of
the question - is that modal functions take propositions as arguments,
but propositions are logical constructions. All sentences containing
the word ‘proposition’ - including such sentences as
‘A modal operator expresses a function from propositions to
truth values’ - mean no more and no less than sentences which
contain neither that word nor an equivalent. In essence Prior's view
is that there are intensional contexts but no intensions. For the last
six years of his life Prior worked on a book that was to give
systematic expression to his views on propositions. The incomplete
manuscript, which Prior had entitled *Objects of Thought*, was
published posthumously in 1971.

Of the four technical papers that marked the explosive beginning of
Prior's career as a formal logician in 1952, two concern modal
logic. ‘Modality De Dicto and Modality De Re’ is a
discussion of this distinction as it appears in Aristotle, Ockham and
Peter of Spain together with a comparison of these earlier views with
those of von Wright in *An Essay on Modal Logic*. ‘In What
Sense is Modal Logic Many-Valued?’ proposes an interpretation of
Łukasiewicz's four-valued matrices for modal logic. This paper
marked the beginning of Prior's study of Łukasiewicz's work on
modality. Thereafter he read Łukasiewicz widely - even material
in Polish, of which he said "the symbols are so illuminating that the
fact that the text is incomprehensible doesn't much matter". In the
Preface to *Time and Modality* he wrote "[W]hile I differed
radically from the late Professor Łukasiewicz on the subject of
modal logic, my debt to him will be obvious on almost every page".

Prior's detailed contributions to the development of modal logic are legion. At least one aspect of his work has not received the recognition it deserves. Prior and his collaborator Carew Meredith invented crucial elements of the possible worlds semantics for propositional modal logic several years ahead of Kripke, including the all-important binary relation which opens the way to modelling systems of different strengths. (Meredith was a lecturer in mathematics at Trinity College, Dublin, whose interest in logic was stimulated by the arrival of Łukasiewicz in Dublin shortly after the war.)

The invention is foreshadowed in the penultimate chapter of *The
Craft*.

For the similarity in behaviour between signs of modality and signs of quantity, various explanations may be offered. It may be, for example, that signs of modality are just ordinary quantifiers operating upon a peculiar subject-matter, namely possible states of affairs … It would not be quite accurate to describe theories of this sort as ‘reducing modality to quantity’. They do reduce modalAs sources for this idea Prior cites John Wallis (a seventeenth century logician) and the account of logically necessary and logically impossible propositions given by Wittgenstein in thedistinctionsto distinctions of quantity, but the variables to which the quantifiers are attached retain something modal in their signification - they signify ‘possibilities’, ‘chances’, ‘possible states of affairs’, ‘possible combinations of truth-values’, or the like. (pp. 736-7.)

*Tractatus*(p.737). Interestingly, he mentions Carnap only in a footnote: "Professor Carnap has a similar definition of logical necessity in terms of what he calls ‘state-descriptions’" (ibid). Prior does not refer to, and presumably had not at that time read, Carnap's 1946 paper ‘Modalities and Quantification’, which attempted a semantics for quantified S5 in terms of state-descriptions. (A state-description is a class of sentences satisfying certain conditions. Each state-description represents a possible state of affairs.) Carnap too cites the

*Tractatus*account of modal propositions as his inspiration (1946: 47). Prior goes on to defend his account of modality as quantification over possible states of affairs against various alternatives, for example the Andersonian account, according to which ‘Every table here is necessarily brown’ means ‘There is a property which every table here in fact possesses, and of which it is true that everything that possesses it is in fact brown’. (John Anderson, Professor at the University of Sydney, was a leading figure in the development of philosophy in Australasia.)

In 1956 Prior wrote up his and Meredith's formal work on what he
later described (1962a: 140) as the ‘logic of
world-accessibility’, in a paper entitled ‘Interpretations
of Different Modal Logics in the "Property Calculus"’ (Meredith
and Prior 1996). It carries the attribution ‘C.A.M., August
1956; recorded and expanded A.N.P.’. Prior circulated the paper
in mimeograph form. He mentions it in *Past, Present and Future*
(1967: 42-5) and in his 1962 articles ‘Possible Worlds’
and ‘Tense-Logic and the Continuity of Time’. This paper
is one of the earliest to employ a binary relation between possible
states of affairs in order to discriminate between S5 and weaker
systems. (Carnap's 1946 paper concerned only S5 and contained no such
relation.)

The property calculus is essentially a variation of Prior's 1954 l-calculus described above. In the l-calculus tense-modal propositions are treated as predicates expressing properties of dates, and quantification theory is supplemented with various special axioms for a binary relation ‘l’ taking dates as arguments. In the modal version of the calculus sentences of modal logic are treated as if they express properties of certain objects a, b, c, etc. Objects are related by a binary relation U. (Prior and Meredith supply no account of what a formula of form ‘Uab’ might express.) The following definitions of necessity L and possibility M are given (‘pa’ indicates that object a has the property expressed by the sentence p):

(Lp)a = (b)(Uab → pb)The calculus consists of ordinary quantification theory supplemented by these definitions, together with certain axioms governing the relation U, and the following clauses:(Mp)a = (b)(Uab & pb).

(-p)a = -(pa)It is implied that a modal proposition A is to be called a theorem of the calculus if and only if Aa is provable for an arbitrarily chosen object a.(p → q)a = (pa) → (qa).

Axioms for U are selected from a list containing (amongst others):

1. Uaa (U is reflexive)(Axiom 2 is also present in the l-calculus.) Prior and Meredith establish that the distribution principle L(p → q) → (Lp → Lq) is a theorem in the absence of any special axioms for U; that Lp → p is a theorem if axiom 1 is imposed; that axiom 2 gives the S4 principle Lp → LLp; and that 2 together with 3 give the S5 principle MLp → Lp. (Their approach is proof-theoretic in its basic orientation and they offer no completeness results.) In 1962a and 1962b Prior extends the approach to systems between S4 and S5 and systems independent of S4 between T and S5.2. Uab → (Ubc → Uac) (U is transitive)

3. Uab → Uba (U is symmetrical).

As previously remarked, the idea that the variables of quantification
of the calculus should range over possible states of affairs or
possible worlds is present in *The Craft*. In 1960, following a
suggestion by Geach, Prior began thinking of U as a relation of
*accessibility* between worlds. Prior tells us that Geach cashed
out the notion of ‘reaching’ one world from another in
terms of ‘some dimension-jumping vehicle dreamed up by science
fiction’ (1962b: 36; see also 1962a: 140). (Geach referred to
the whole business as ‘Trans World Airlines’.) With this
interpretation of U to hand, the property calculus can be viewed as
treating (Lp)a - or ‘Necessarily-p in world a’ - as short
for ‘p is true in all worlds accessible from a’. Lemmon,
in a draft of material intended for his and Dana Scott's projected
book ‘Intensional Logic’, mistakenly credits Geach with
the idea that the binary relation ‘may be intuitively thought of
as a relation between possible worlds’. In a letter to Scott,
written after Lemmon's death in 1966, Prior remarked: "What Geach
contributed was not the interpretation of [U] as a relation between
worlds (God knows when *that* started), but the interpretation of
[U] as a relation of accessibility". When Prior says "God knows when
*that* started" he is presumably referring to the idea that the
‘objects’ of the calculus be regarded as possible
worlds. Prior was right to think that the history of this idea is a
tangled one. Priority is often assigned to Leibniz, but scholars have
now traced the idea back to Duns Scotus and William of Ockham
(Knuuttila 1993).

It seems that the binary relation first made its appearance in a 1951 article by Jonsson and Tarski, ‘Boolean Algebras with Operators’. In their Theorem 3.14 they establish that every closure algebra is isomorphic to an algebraic system formed by a set and a reflexive and transitive relation between its elements; their Theorem 3.5 considers also a symmetry condition. In hindsight these theorems (which explicitly concern boolean algebras, of course) can be viewed as in effect a treatment of all the basic modal axioms and corresponding properties of the accessibility relation. Concerning this article Saul Kripke has remarked:

Had they known they were doing modal logic, they would have had the completeness problem for many of the modal propositional systems wrapped up, and some powerful theorems. Mathematically they did this, but it was presented as algebra with no mention of semantics, modal logic, or possible worlds, let alone quantifiers. When I presented my paper at the conference in Finland in 1962, I emphasized the importance of this paper. Tarski was present, and said that he was unable to see any connection with what I was doing!

During the next eight years the binary relation was reinvented by a number of logicians. Prior, in his address to a conference in Wellington in 1954, seems to have been the first to use the binary relation in an explicitly tense-modal context. Other landmarks were an address by Montague to a conference held at UCLA in 1955, Prior and Meredith's property calculus of 1956, and Kanger (1957), Hintikka (1957, 1961) and Kripke (1959a, 1959b, 1963). Kripke was familiar with Kanger's work involving the binary relation at the time he obtained his own results. Kanger himself had read the 1951 paper by Jonsson and Tarski and he describes his results as similar to theirs (Kanger 1957: 39). My forthcoming paper ‘Possible Worlds: the Pre-Kripkean Era’ gives a fuller account of the history of the possible worlds semantics.

It was through reading Prior's paper ‘Modality and
Quantification in S5’ in 1956 that Kripke first became
interested in modal logic. He was at this time still a schoolboy,
working on logic in almost complete isolation in Omaha, Nebraska. In
1958 he read *Time and Modality* and was impressed by the
parallel Prior drew between tense and the alethic modalities. (At
almost exactly the same time Prior was reading Kripke's first paper,
‘A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic’, in his capacity
as referee for *The Journal of Symbolic Logic*.) Kripke suspects
that it was his reading of *Time and Modality* that first
interested him in the problem of treating variable domains (a constant
domain is assumed in ‘A Completeness Theorem in Modal
Logic’). Kripke worked on Prior's idea that variable domains
might lead to truth-value gaps even at the level of propositional
logic, although he did not pursue this approach in his published
material. (This idea was the motivation for Prior's system Q.) Kripke
thinks it probable that it was Prior's work on many-valued matrices in
*Time and Modality* which gave him the idea that a possible
worlds model can be converted to a many-valued matrix (an idea he
developed in his 1963 paper ‘Semantical Analysis of Modal Logic
I: Normal Modal Propositional Calculi’).

Kripke wrote to Prior (September 3, 1958) pointing out an error in
*Time and Modality*: contrary to Prior's claim, the Diodoran
matrix (1957: 23) is not characteristic of S4. In his letter Kripke
gave a characteristic matrix for S4 involving the idea that in a
non-deterministic universe time branches into the future. He wrote:

[I]n an indetermined system, we perhaps should not regard time as a linear series, as you have done. Given the present moment, there are several possibilities for what the next moment may be like - - and for each possible next moment, there are several possibilities for the moment after that. Thus the situation takes the form, not of a linear sequence, but of a ‘tree’.This is essentially no more than a tensed interpretation of Kripke's relational semantics for S4, as he himself points out in the letter. Prior was excited by the letter and passed it on to Ivo Thomas and John Lemmon. Kripke wrote again on October 13, 1958. (The letters may still be seen in the Bodleian Library, Oxford. They are discussed in Ohrstrom and Hasle (1993).)

## Prior's Life

In 1932, at the age of 17, Arthur Prior left his home town, sleepy Masterton in the North Island of New Zealand, and enrolled at the University of Otago. The son of a doctor, Prior's initial intention was to study medicine. He was soon beckoned away by philosophy, in which he gained a B.A. in 1935. It was John Findlay, then Professor of Philosophy at Otago, who introduced Prior to logic. A contemporary of Gilbert Ryle and William Kneale, Findlay himself had studied at Graz and at Oxford; his influential book*Meinong's Theory of Objects*was published during Prior's second year at Otago. Under Findlay's direction Prior cut his teeth on W.E. Johnson's classic text

*Logic*and studied the 18

^{th}century British moralists. It was Findlay who first interested Prior in the history of logic. In 1949 Prior wrote of him ‘I owe to his teaching, directly or indirectly, almost all that I know of either Logic or Ethics’ (1949: xi) and he was later generously to describe Findlay as ‘the founding father of modern tense-logic’ (1967: 1).

Prior's M.A. thesis, in which he criticised subjectivist and
formalist approaches to logic, was awarded only a second by the
external examiner. Fortunately Findlay knew a budding logician when he
saw one and secured Prior an assistant lectureship at Otago. During
1937 Prior gave courses on logic, ethics, and probability theory. In
December of that year his first published paper - arguing that a
nation is a logical construction out of individuals - appeared in the
*Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy*.

At this point Prior temporarily abandoned his academic career and
spent three bohemian years wandering in Britain and Europe. He
returned to New Zealand at the end of 1940, and on emerging from the
air force in 1945 he applied for a vacant lectureship at Canterbury
University College in Christchurch. By now he had a further three
articles in the *Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy
*(‘Can Religion be Discussed?’, ‘The Meaning of
Good’ and ‘The Subject of Ethics’) and with a strong
recommendation from Findlay Prior got the job. He started work in
February 1946. (The vacancy Prior filled was created by the departure
from New Zealand of Karl Popper. Prior and Popper were never
colleagues. Apart from Prior's attendance at some of Popper's Workers'
Educational Association lectures in 1943 there was no contact between
the two men.)

At Canterbury Prior was thrown entirely on his own
resources, being as he put it "the only philosopher about the
place". He bore the responsibility for providing a broad and balanced
philosophy curriculum, yet his own formal education in philosophy had
stopped short nine years previously. Prior's one recourse in the face
of isolation was to read, and read he did. In logic he began by
returning to W.E. Johnson. Next came J.N. Keynes's *Studies and
Exercises in Formal Logic* and then (in his own phrase) he got
stuck into *Principia Mathematica*. He learned a lot about the
history of the subject from Peirce, whom he found "unexpectedly
magnificent". An important discovery, in 1950, was Bochenski's
*Precis de Logique Mathematique*. Prior was fascinated by the
‘very neat symbolic notation’ due to Łukasiewicz, and
before long he turned his back completely on the more usual
Peano-Russell notation. Bochenski was later to describe Prior as even
more of a ‘CCCC-logician’ than he was himself. (In
Łukasiewicz's parenthesis-free notation Cpq is written for
‘If p then q’, Kpq for ‘Both p and q’, Apq for
‘Either p or q’, Epq for ‘If and only if p then
q’, Np for ‘Not p’.) Łukasiewicz's own
*Aristotle's Syllogistic* and Tarski's *Introduction to
Logic* soon followed. By now the logic bug had well and truly
bitten. Prior saw from the work of the Poles that formal precision is
possible in philosophy and this delighted him. The upshot of Prior's
reading for the curriculum was that his students learned Aristotelian
and medieval logic, using Polish notation and with Bochenski's
*Precis de Logique Mathematique* as a text. "Despite the language
difficulty, I have found this a first-class textbook to accompany
lectures to New Zealand students", he declared (1952c: 35).

An exuberant, playful man of seemingly inexhaustible vitality, Prior made an excellent teacher. He had no trace of pomposity or pretension. His students appreciated the friendly welcome they would receive at his home, not to mention his relaxed attitude toward the administrative paraphernalia of roll-taking and the like. In those days Canterbury University College was a formal, stuffy place and Prior was a breath of fresh air for his students. In a milieu where jacket and tie were the norm even in a sweltering New Zealand summer, Prior would lecture in baggy khaki shorts and roman sandles. Jim Wilson recalls the friendly informality of Prior's first-year classes:

The strained precision of clock time was alien to him, so he was usually late for his own lectures (or anyone else's for that matter - he was very egalitarian about it). But he almost always turned up eventually, thinning hair blown vertical by his dash on his bike when he remembered the time. He would pull cycle clips off his trousers and plonk an ancient shopping bag on the desk in front of him. Out of this bag would come … a cabbage, a bunch of carrots, a loaf of bread, a bottle of milk … until, always at the bottom, he would find the book he was looking for. Back into the bag went the rest of the goodies, then he would look up at us, apologise for being late if he was more than usually so, and ask: "Now where were we last time?" Someone in the front row would consult her or his notes - Arthur couldn't as he never had any - and would say "You were just dealing with such and such." "Ah yes, thank you" Arthur would respond, and forthwith launch into an extempore exposition which followed on perfectly from the previous session and was beautifully structured and clear even though he was just thinking along with us. And of course we could stop him and ask for clarification or elaboration at any time, without in the slightest affecting the overall structure and direction of his thoughts.Soon after his discovery of

*Precis de Logique Mathematique*Prior wrote to Bochenski in Fribourg and then, a little later, to Łukasiewicz in Dublin. He was excited to receive replies. "We are, all of us, very isolated, being few and scattered", wrote Bochenski. "It is a real pleasure to hear that a Colleague so far away is interested in the same problems you are working at and that he finds one's little writings may be of some use." Thus began Prior's voluminous correspondence with logicians the world over. There were other ways, too, in which his isolation lessened. In 1951 he met and became friends with John Mackie and Jack Smart, at a conference in Sydney. This was Prior's first experience of being among a large gathering of philosophers and Mary Prior describes the conference as his ‘entry into a wider world’. In the same year George Hughes was appointed to the Victoria University of Wellington. Prior and Hughes had to make the most of their all-too-infrequent meetings, sometimes talking until the birds woke. Prior was fortunate in having a number of excellent students during these early years, among them Jonathan Bennett, Ronald Butler and (a little later) Robert Bull. For Prior they were oases in the desert. In 1952 he gained an assistant lecturer, Sandy Anderson. The following year philosophy became a department in its own right and Prior was made Professor.

1949 saw the publication of Prior's first book, a slim but potent
volume entitled *Logic and the Basis of Ethics*. It was published
by the Clarendon Press and soon became prominent in Oxford. Austin
liked it and Ryle approved of "Prior's complete lack of
mugwumpery". In the Introduction Prior explains that by the
‘logic of ethics’ he means "not a special kind of logic,
nor a special branch of logic, but an application of it", and the book
is a vigorous examination of the arguments of each side in the
naturalism/anti-naturalism debate.

*Logic and the Basis of Ethics* contains no symbolism, and
Prior's phrase ‘the logic of ethics’ is little more than a
battle cry. The few technical concepts that are introduced all pertain
to syllogistic logic. It was not until 1952 that Prior began
publishing papers in symbolic logic - four of them, suddenly, in the
same year. At the unusually late age of 38 Prior had become a formal
logician. He wrote these papers while completing the manuscript of
what was intended to be his second book, *The Craft of Formal
Logic*. (The manuscript of *The Craft of Formal Logic* is
deposited in the Bodleian Library, Oxford.) This began life in 1949 as
a Dictionary of Formal Logic, but at the advice of the Clarendon Press
Prior soon switched to a more orthodox format. His logical interests
veered sharply while he was writing *The Craft*. To sixteen
chapters on the logic of categoricals, hypotheticals, terms and
relations are added, almost as an afterthought, one on modal logic and
one on the axiomatic method. Prior finished the manuscript in December
1951 and sent it to the Clarendon Press; fourteen months later they
wrote agreeing to publish the book if Prior would both shorten it and
give greater emphasis to modern logic. He undertook to make the
changes but ended up writing a completely different book. This was
finally published in 1955 with the title *Formal Logic*; it ran
into a second edition in 1962. Parts of *The Craft* not absorbed
into the later work were published posthumously under the title *The
Doctrine of Propositions and Terms*.

Steeped in Polish notation and the axiomatic method, *Formal
Logic* typifies Prior's mature work. It teaches, enthusiastically
yet without fuss, that there was life - fascinating life - before the
here and now of logic. What Prior once wrote admiringly of
Łukasiewicz is no less true of Prior himself: ‘having done
very distinguished work as a mathematical logician in the modern
style, [he] is at the same time interested in the history of his
subject … and contrives both to use modern techniques to bring out
more clearly what the ancients were driving at, and to learn from the
ancients useful logical devices which the moderns have in general
forgotten’ (1952c: 37).

After Findlay, Łukasiewicz was the greatest single influence on
Prior's development as a logician. Prior's 1952 review article
‘Łukasiewicz's Symbolic Logic’ is one of the first
papers in which he makes extensive use of symbolism. (He discusses
Łukasiewicz's book *Aristotle's Syllogistic From the Standpoint
of Modern Formal Logic* (published in 1951) and two articles,
‘The Shortest Axiom of the Implicational Calculus of
Propositions’ and ‘On Variable Functions of Propositional
Arguments’.) Prior seems to have first learned of
Łukasiewicz's work through Bochenski's writings (Bochenski was a
pupil of Łukasiewicz). Łukasiewicz had devised an axiomatic
treatment of Aristotle's reduction of the imperfect syllogistic moods
to those of the first figure, which Prior encountered in Bochenski's
*Precis de Logique Mathematique* (published in 1949). This
enchanted Prior. He was taking his students through the derivations as
early as 1951, and he summarises Łukasiewicz's system in the
final chapter of *The Craft. *Throughout this chapter he makes
extensive use of Łukasiewicz's symbolic notation. It was
Łukasiewicz's axiomatic treatment of traditional logic that fully
brought home to Prior the power of modern symbolic methods. Moreover
it was probably his reading of Łukasiewicz that made clear to him
the fundamental importance of propositional logic. "It seems that
Aristotle did not suspect the existence of another system of logic
besides his theory of the syllogism", Łukasiewicz had written,
"[y]et he uses intuitively the laws of propositional logic …" (1951:
49). (Łukasiewicz's axiomatisation of the syllogistic
incorporates his own three-axiom formalisation of propositional logic
(1951: 80).) In his review Prior quotes approvingly Łukasiewicz's
assertion that "the logic of the Stoics, the inventors of the ancient
form of the propositional calculus, was much more important than all
the syllogisms of Aristotle" (1951: 131). In *The Craft*
propositional logic is barely mentioned until the final chapter,
whereas *Formal Logic* begins with a thorough introduction to the
subject. On page 3 of *Formal Logic *Prior states that the logic
of propositions is "basic, and the rest of logic built upon
it". Prior's interest in economical bases for propositional and pure
implicational logics, initially aroused by his study of Peirce, was
stimulated by Łukasiewicz's article ‘The Shortest Axiom of
the Implicational Calculus of Propositions’ and the opening
chapters of *Formal Logic* draw heavily on Łukasiewicz's
work in this area.

In 1954 Gilbert Ryle visited New Zealand. He brought Prior an
invitation to visit Oxford and deliver the John Locke lectures. Prior
arranged a twelve month leave of absence from Canterbury and arrived
in Oxford at the beginning of 1956. Rather quickly a small group began
to form around him: Ivo Thomas, John Lemmon, Peter Geach. (These
meetings with Prior were Lemmon's first introduction to modal logic.)
Hughes summarises the news of him that was arriving back home: "this
wild colonial boy just hit Oxford and started to gather around him the
main people [interested in] logic, and he started to organise a lot of
parties, almost, for the serious doing of logic." Prior kitted out his
tiny rented flat with a toyshop blackboard and held open house. On
Mondays during Hilary and Trinity terms Prior lectured on modal logic,
his great passion, and on tense logic, his great invention. The
lectures were published the following year, under the title *Time
and Modality*.

In the summer break following the John Locke lectures Prior organised
a Logic Colloquium in Oxford. In Britain in the 1950s logic was deeply
out of fashion and its practitioners were isolated and somewhat
demoralised. As Prior wrote shortly after the Colloquium "There
*are* logicians in England and Ireland; but it must be admitted
that they are somewhat scattered, and so far as I could gather they
had never had any general get-together" (1956b: 186). Prior's
Colloquium brought together Lemmon, Thomas, Geach, M. Kneale,
W.C. Kneale, Lewy, Smiley, Bennett, Lejewski, M.W. Dick, Faris,
Nidditch, Carew Meredith, David Meredith, and others. It was all a
huge success, and the Colloquium became a regular fixture. Through his
John Locke lectures, the Colloquium, and his numerous visits around
the country, Prior helped to revitalise British logic. The group he
left behind saw similarities between themselves and the close-knit
group of researchers that existed in Warsaw before 1939.

Prior's heart may have been heavy as he journeyed back to New Zealand. After twelve months of logical companionship on a grand scale, life at Canterbury must have seemed a bleak prospect. He was seething with enthusiasm for logic and threw himself once more into a massive correspondence, but it could no longer satisfy him. Prior pined. When the offer arrived of a newly established second chair at the University of Manchester he snatched it up. Prior left New Zealand in December 1958.

He was at Manchester for seven years. In 1966 Anthony Kenny recommended him for a fellowship at Balliol. The move would mean a drop in both status and salary, not to mention an increase in teaching, but Prior did not hesitate. His sabbatical in Oxford had been one of his happiest years. ‘This is the good life’, he told George Hughes once he was settled in at Balliol. He felt he simply belonged. Prior soon built up a reputation for being one of the best teachers in Oxford - though his students were sometimes surprised to be given eighteenth century moralists to read instead of books by the currently fashionable.

Just before his departure from Manchester Prior told Tom Richards, a visiting New Zealander, that he was going to Oxford with a mission. Prior's own work was an exemplary fusion of philosophy and logic, and he went to Oxford with the intention of interesting the mathematical logicians in philosophy and the philosophers in mathematical logic. The time was right; and Prior spared no energy in preaching his message:

[F]ormal logic and general philosophy have more to bring to one another than is sometimes supposed. I do not mean by saying this to underrate the work of those who have explored the properties of symbolic calculi without any concern as to what they might be used to mean … Nor do I mean to underrate what recent philosophers have done in the way of exploring the obstinate and intricate ‘logic’ embedded in common discourse, even when they have not derived or sought to derive anything like a calculus from it … But these activities are, or can be, related to one another very much as theory and observation are in the physical sciences; and I must confess to a hankering after well-constructed theories which much contemporary philosophy fails to satisfy. (1957: vii.)

Prior did not live to enjoy the *entente cordiale* between
philosophy and logic that he helped usher in. His health began to let
him down during his second year at Balliol. He was found to have both
angina pectoris and polymyalgic rheumatism. During the autumn of 1969
the rheumatism grew steadily worse. He was at this time on sabbatical
at the University of Oslo. The pain left him with no zest for work. He
dutifully gave his weekly seminars and spent the remainder of his time
brooding savagely on how painful it was to do such elementary things
as put on a coat. His hosts made him an appointment with a
rheumatologist, who prescribed cortisone. In a letter written a few
days later, and a few days before his heart failed, Prior described
himself as one of the miracles of modern medicine. "I've been sleeping
well … running up and down stairs … I can stand on one
leg and put a sock on the other (first time for months) …
they've got me cured now and I'm fine."

## Bibliography

### Works by Prior

- 1937. ‘The Nation and the
Individual’.
*Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy*, vol.15, pp.294-8. - 1942. ‘Can Religion be Discussed?’.
*Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy*, vol.20, pp.141-51. - 1944. ‘The Meaning of Good’.
*Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy*, vol.22, pp.170-4. - 1945. ‘The Subject of Ethics’.
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## Other Internet Resources

- Foundations of Temporal Logic -- The WWW-site for Arthur Prior, by Per Hasle and Peter Øhrstrøm