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Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
Notes to Aristotle's Metaphysics


1. This crucial idea is put forward at Posterior Analytics 71b32; Prior Analytics 68b35-7; Physics A.1, 184a16-20; Metaphysics Z.3, 1029b3-12; Topics Z.4, 141b2-142a12.)

2. This inverse tree-like structure was first noticed in the 3rd century C.E. by Porphyry: “Substance is itself a genus, under this is body, and under body is living body, under which is animal. Under animal is rational animal, under which is man. Under man are Socrates and Plato and individual (kata meros) men” (Isagoge 4, 21-25). This so-called “tree of Porphyry” later found its way, with illustrations, into medieval discussions of Aristotle.

3. Although Aristotle himself never puts it this way, one might think of each category itself as a genus. This is certainly what Porphyry thought (see note 2). See also Owen 1965b. Note, however, that if a category is a genus, it is a maximally general one — it cannot be a species of some higher genus. For the union of all the categories contains everything that there is — i.e., all of the beings — and Aristotle insists that being is not a genus (Posterior Analytics 92b14, Metaphysics B.3, 998b22).

Copyright © 2000, 2001 by
S. Marc Cohen

First posted: October 8, 2000
Last modified: September 29, 2001