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Though the general point of view expressed in each work is the same, there are many subtle differences in organization and content as well. Clearly, one is a re-working of the other, and although no single piece of evidence shows conclusively what their order is, it is widely assumed that the Nicomachean Ethics is a later and improved version of the Eudemian Ethics. (Not all of the Eudemian Ethics was revised: its Books IV, V, and VI re-appear as V, VI, VII of the Nicomachean Ethics.) Perhaps the most telling indication of this ordering is that in several instances the Nicomachean Ethics develops a theme about which its Eudemian cousin is silent. Only the Nicomachean Ethics discusses the close relationship between ethical inquiry and politics; only the Nicomachean Ethics examines Solon's dictum that no man should be counted happy until he is dead; and only the Nicomachean Ethics gives a series of arguments for the superiority of the philosophical life to the political life. The remainder of this article will therefore focus on this work. [Note: Page and line numbers shall henceforth refer to this treatise.]
Although Aristotle is deeply indebted to Plato's moral philosophy, particularly Plato's central insight that moral thinking must be integrated with our emotions and appetites, and that the preparation for such unity of character should begin with childhood education, the systematic character of Aristotle's discussion of these themes was a remarkable innovation. No one had written ethical treatises before Aristotle. Plato's Republic, for example, does not treat ethics as a distinct subject matter; nor does it offer a systematic examination of the nature of happiness, virtue, voluntariness, pleasure, or friendship. To be sure, we can find in Plato's works important discussions of these phenomena, but they are not brought together and unified as they are in Aristotle's ethical writings.
Aristotle thinks everyone will agree that the terms "eudaimonia" ("happiness") and "eu zên" ("living well") designate such an end. The Greek term "eudaimon" is composed of two parts: "eu" means "well" and "daimon" means "divinity" or "spirit." To be eudaimon is therefore to be living in a way that is well-favored by a god. But Aristotle never calls attention to this etymology, and it seems to have little influence on his thinking. He regards "eudaimon" as a mere substitute for eu zên ("living well"). These terms play an evaluative role, and are not simply descriptions of someone's state of mind.
No one tries to live well for the sake of some further goal; rather, being eudaimon is the highest end, and all subordinate goals -- health, wealth, and other such resources -- are sought because they promote well-being, not because they are what well-being consists in. But unless we can determine which good or goods happiness consists in, it is of little use to acknowledge that it is the highest end. To resolve this issue, Aristotle asks what the ergon ("function," "task," "work") of a human being is, and argues that it consists in activity of the rational part of the soul in accordance with virtue (1097b22-1098a20). One important component of this argument is expressed in terms of distinctions he makes in his psychological and biological works. The soul is analyzed into a connected series of capacities: the nutritive soul is responsible for growth and reproduction, the locomotive soul for motion, the perceptive soul for perception, and so on. The biological fact Aristotle makes use of is that human beings are the only species that has not only these lower capacities but a rational soul as well. The good of a human being must have something to do with being human; and what sets humanity off from other species, giving us the potential to live a better life, is our capacity to guide ourselves by using reason. If we use reason well, we live well as human beings; or, to be more precise, using reason well over the course of a full life is what happiness consists in. Doing anything well requires virtue or excellence, and therefore living well consists in activities caused by the rational soul in accordance with virtue or excellence.
Aristotle's conclusion about the nature of happiness is in a sense uniquely his own. No other writer or thinker had said precisely what he says about what it is to live well. But at the same time his view is not too distant from a common idea. As he himself points out, one traditional conception of happiness identifies it with virtue (1098b30-1). Aristotle's theory should be construed as a refinement of this position. He says, not that happiness is virtue, but that it is virtuous activity. Living well consists in doing something, not just being in a certain state or condition. It consists in those lifelong activities that actualize the virtues of the rational part of the soul.
At the same time, Aristotle makes it clear that in order to be happy one must possess others goods as well -- such goods as friends, wealth, and power. And one's happiness is endangered if one is severely lacking in certain advantages -- if, for example, one is extremely ugly, or has lost children or good friends through death (1098a31-b6). But why so? If one's ultimate end should simply be virtuous activity, then why should it make any difference to one's happiness whether one has or lacks these other types of good? Aristotle's reply is that one's virtuous activity will be to some extent diminished or defective, if one lacks an adequate supply of other goods (1153b17-19). Someone who is friendless, childless, powerless, weak, and ugly will simply not be able to find many opportunities for virtuous activity over a long period of time, and what little he can accomplish will not be of great merit. To some extent, then, living well requires good fortune; happenstance can rob even the most excellent human beings of happiness. Nonetheless, Aristotle insists, the highest good, virtuous activity, is not something that comes to us by chance. Although we must be fortunate enough to have parents and fellow citizens who help us become virtuous, we ourselves share much of the responsibility for acquiring and exercising the virtues.
But perhaps Aristotle disagrees, and refuses to accept this argumentative burden. In one of several important methodological remarks he makes near the beginning of the Nicomachean Ethics, he says that in order to profit from the sort of study he is undertaking, one must already have been brought up in good habits (1095b4-6). The audience he is addressing, in other words, consists of people who already just, courageous, and generous; or, at any rate, they are well on their way to possessing these virtues. Why such a restricted audience? Why does he not address those who have serious doubts about the value of these traditional qualities, and who therefore have not yet decided to cultivate and embrace them?
Addressing the moral skeptic, after all, is the project Plato undertook in the Republic: in Book I he rehearses an argument to show that justice is not really a virtue, and the remainder of this work is an attempt to rebut this thesis. Aristotle's project seems, at least on the surface, to be quite different. He does not appear to be addressing someone who has genuine doubts about the value of justice or kindred qualities. Perhaps, then, he realizes how little can be accomplished, in the study of ethics, to provide it with a rational foundation. Perhaps he thinks that no reason can be given for being just, generous, and courageous. These are qualities one learns to love when one is a child, and having been properly habituated, one no longer looks for or needs a reason to exercise them. One can show, as a general point, that happiness consists in exercising some skills or other, but that the moral skills of a virtuous person are what one needs is not a proposition that can be established on the basis of argument.
This is not the only way of reading the Ethics, however. For surely we cannot expect Aristotle to show what it is about the traditional virtues that makes them so worthwhile until he has fully discussed the nature of those virtues. He himself warns us that his initial statement of what happiness is should be treated as a rough outline whose details are to be filled in later (1098a20-22). His intention in Book I of the Ethics is to indicate in a general way why the virtues are important; why particular virtues -- courage, justice, and the like -- are components of happiness is something we should be able to better understand only at a later point.
In any case, Aristotle's assertion that his audience must already have begun to cultivate the virtues need not be taken to mean that no reasons can be found for being courageous, just, and generous. His point, rather, may be that in ethics, as in any other study, we cannot make progress towards understanding why things are as they are unless we begin with certain assumptions about what is the case. Neither theoretical nor practical inquiry starts from scratch. Someone who has made no observations of astronomical or biological phenomena is not yet equipped with sufficient data to develop an understanding of these sciences. The parallel point in ethics is that to make progress in this sphere we must already have come to enjoy doing what is just, courageous, generous and the like. We must experience these activities not as burdensome constraints, but as noble, worthwhile, and enjoyable in themselves. Then, when we engage in ethical inquiry, we can ask what it is about these activities that makes them worthwhile. We can also compare these goods with other things that are desirable in themselves -- pleasure, friendship, honor, and so on -- and ask whether any of them is more desirable than the others. We approach ethical theory with a disorganized bundle of likes and dislikes based on habit and experience; such disorder is an inevitable feature of childhood. But what is not inevitable is that our early experience will be rich enough to provide an adequate basis for worthwhile ethical reflection; that is why we need to have been brought up well. Yet such an upbringing can take us only so far. We seek a deeper understanding of the objects of our childhood enthusiasms, and we must systematize our goals so that as adults we have a coherent plan of life. We need to engage in ethical theory, and to reason well in this field, if we are to move beyond the low-grade form of virtue we acquired as children.
There is another contrast with Plato that should be emphasized: In Book II of the Republic, we are told that the best type of good is one that is desirable both in itself and for the sake of its results (357d-358a). Plato argues that justice should be placed in this category, but since it is generally agreed that it is desirable for its consequences, he devotes most of his time to establishing his more controversial point -- that justice is to be sought for its own sake. By contrast, Aristotle assumes that if A is desirable for the sake of B, then B is better than A (1094a14-16); therefore, the highest kind of good must be one that is not desirable for the sake of anything else. To show that A deserves to be our ultimate end, one must show that all other goods are best thought of as instruments that promote A in some way or other. Accordingly, it would not serve Aristotle's purpose to consider virtuous activity in isolation from all other goods. He needs to discuss honor, wealth, pleasure, and friendship in order to show how these goods, properly understood, can be seen as resources that serve the higher goal of virtuous activity. He vindicates the centrality of virtue in a well-lived life by showing that in the normal course of things a virtuous person will not live a life devoid of friends, honor, wealth, pleasure, and the like. Virtuous activity makes a life happy not by guaranteeing happiness in all circumstances, but by serving as the goal for the sake of which lesser goods are to be pursued. Aristotle's methodology in ethics therefore pays more attention than does Plato's to the connections that normally obtain between virtue and other goods. That is why he stresses that in this sort of study one must be satisfied with conclusions that hold only for the most part (1094b11-22). Poverty, isolation, and dishonor are normally, impediments to the exercise of virtue and therefore to happiness, although there may be special circumstances in which they are not. The possibility of exceptions does not undermine the point that, as a rule, to live well is to have sufficient resources for the pursuit of virtue over the course of a lifetime.
All free males are born with the potential to become ethically virtuous and practically wise, but to achieve these goals they must go through two stages: during their childhood, they must develop the proper habits; and then, when their reason is fully developed, they must acquire practical wisdom (phronêsis). This does not mean that first we fully acquire the ethical virtues, and then, at a later stage, add on practical wisdom. Ethical virtue is fully developed only when it is combined with practical wisdom (1144b14-17). A low-grade form of ethical virtue emerges in us during childhood as we are repeatedly placed in situations that call for appropriate actions and emotions; but as we rely less on others and become capable of doing more of our own thinking, we learn to develop a larger picture of human life, our deliberative skills improve, and our emotional responses are perfected. Like anyone who has developed a skill in performing a complex and difficult activity, the virtuous person takes pleasure in exercising his intellectual skills. Furthermore, when he has decided what to do, he does not have to contend with internal pressures to act otherwise. He does not long to do something that he regards as shameful; and he is not greatly distressed at having to give up a pleasure that he realizes he should forego.
Aristotle places those who suffer from such internal disorders into one of three categories: (A) Some agents, having reached a decision about what to do on a particular occasion, experience some counter-pressure brought on by an appetite for pleasure, or anger, or some other emotion; and this countervailing influence is not completely under the control of reason. (1) Within this category, some are typically better able to resist these counter-rational pressures than is the average person. Such people are not virtuous, although they generally do what a virtuous person does. Aristotle calls them "continent" (enkratês). But (2) others are less successful than the average person in resisting these counter-pressures. They are "incontinent" (akratês). (The explanation of akrasia is a topic to which we will return in section 8.) In addition, (B) there is a type of agent who refuses even to try to do what an ethically virtuous agent would do, because he has become convinced that justice, temperance, generosity and the like are of little or no value. Such people Aristotle calls evil (kakos, phaulos). He assumes that evil people are driven by desires for domination and luxury, and although they are single-minded in their pursuit of these goals, he portrays them as deeply divided, because their pleonexia -- their desire for more and more -- leaves them dissatisfied and full of self-hatred.
It should be noticed that all three of these deficiencies -- continence, incontinence, vice -- involve some lack of internal harmony. (Here Aristotle's debt to Plato is particularly evident, for one of the central ideas of the Republic is that the life of a good person is harmonious, and all other lives deviate to some degree from this ideal.) The evil person may wholeheartedly endorse some evil plan of action at a particular moment, but over the course of time, Aristotle supposes, he will regret his decision, because whatever he does will prove inadequate for the achievement of his goals (1166b5-29). Aristotle assumes that that when someone systematically makes bad decisions about how to live his life, his failures are caused by psychological forces that are less than fully rational. His desires for pleasure, power or some other external goal have become so strong that they make him care too little or not at all about acting ethically. To keep such destructive inner forces at bay, we need to develop the proper habits and emotional responses when we are children, and to reflect intelligently on our aims when we are adults. But some vulnerability to these disruptive forces is present even in more-or-less virtuous people; that is why even a good political community needs laws and the threat of punishment. Clear thinking about the best goals of human life and the proper way to put them into practice is a rare achievement, because the human psyche is not a hospitable environment for the development of these insights.
Furthermore, every ethical virtue is a condition intermediate between two other states, one involving excess, and the other deficiency (1106a26-b28). In this respect, Aristotle says, the virtues are no different from technical skills: every skilled worker knows how to avoid excess and deficiency, and is in a condition intermediate between two extremes. The courageous person, for example, judges that some dangers are worth facing and others not, and experiences fear to a degree that is appropriate to his circumstances. He lies between the coward, who flees every danger and experiences excessive fear, and the rash person, who judges every danger worth facing and experiences little or no fear. Aristotle holds that this same topography applies to every ethical virtue: all are located on a map that places the virtues between states of excess and deficiency. He is careful to add, however, that the mean is to be determined in a way that takes into account the particular circumstances of the individual (1106a36-b7). The arithmetic mean between 10 and 2 is 6, and this is so invariably, whatever is being counted. But the intermediate point that is chosen by an expert in any of the crafts will vary from one situation to another. There is no universal rule, for example, about how much food an athlete should eat, and it would be absurd to infer from the fact that 10 lbs. is too much and 2 lbs. too little for me that I should eat 6 lbs. Finding the mean in any given situation is not a mechanical or thoughtless procedure, but requires a full and detailed acquaintance with the circumstances.
It should be evident that Aristotle's treatment of virtues as mean states endorses the idea that we should sometimes have strong feelings -- when such feelings are called for by our situation. Sometimes a only a small degree of anger is appropriate; but at other times, circumstances call for great anger. The right amount is not some quantity between zero and the highest possible level, but rather the amount, whatever it happens to be, that is proportionate to the seriousness of the situation. Of course, Aristotle is committed to saying that anger should never reach the point at which it undermines reason; and this means that our passion should always fall short of the extreme point at which we would lose control. But it is possible to be very angry without going to this extreme, and Aristotle does not intend to deny this.
The theory of the mean is open to several objections, but before considering them, we should recognize that in fact there are two distinct theses each of which might be called a doctrine of the mean. First, there is the thesis that every virtue is a state that lies between two vices, one of excess and the other of deficiency. Second, there is the idea that whenever a virtuous person chooses to perform a virtuous act, he can be described as aiming at an act that is in some way or other intermediate between alternatives that he rejects. It is this second thesis that is most likely to be found objectionable. A critic might concede that in some cases virtuous acts can be described in Aristotle's terms. If, for example, one is trying to decide how much to spend on a wedding present, one is looking for an amount that is neither excessive nor deficient. But surely many other problems that confront a virtuous agent are not susceptible to this quantitative analysis. If one must decide whether to attend a wedding or respect a competing obligation instead, it would not be illuminating to describe this as a search for a mean between extremes -- unless "aiming at the mean" simply becomes another phrase for trying to make the right decision. The objection, then, is that Aristotle's doctrine of the mean, taken as a doctrine about what the ethical agent does when he deliberates, is in many cases inapplicable or unilluminating.
A defense of Aristotle would have to say that the virtuous person does after all aim at a mean, if we allow for a broad enough notion of what sort of aiming is involved. For example, consider a juror who must determine whether a defendant is guilty as charged. He does not have before his mind a quantitative question; he is trying to decide whether the accused committed the crime, and is not looking for some quantity of action intermediate between extremes. Nonetheless, an excellent juror can be described as someone who, in trying to arrive at the correct decision, seeks to express the right degree of concern for all relevant considerations. He searches for the verdict that results from a deliberative process that is neither overly credulous or unduly skeptical. Similarly, in facing situations that arouse anger, a virtuous agent must determine what action (if any) to take in response to an insult, and although this is not itself a quantitative question, his attempt to answer it properly requires him to have the right degree of concern for his standing as a member of the community. He aims at a mean in the sense that he looks for a response that avoids too much or too little attention to factors that must be taken into account in making a wise decision.
Perhaps a greater difficulty can be raised if we ask how Aristotle determines which emotions are governed by the doctrine of the mean. Consider someone who loves to wrestle, for example. Is this passion something that must be felt by every human being at appropriate times and to the right degree? Surely someone who never felt this emotion to any degree could still live a perfectly happy life. Why then should we not say the same about at least some of the emotions that Aristotle builds into his analysis of the ethically virtuous agent? Why should we experience anger at all, or fear, or the degree of concern for wealth and honor that Aristotle commends? These are precisely the questions that were asked in antiquity by the Stoics, and they came to the conclusion that such common emotions as anger and fear are always inappropriate. Aristotle assumes, on the contrary, not simply that these common passions are sometimes appropriate, but that it is essential that every human being learn how to master them and experience them in the right way at the right times. A defense of his position would have to show that the emotions that figure in his account of the virtues are valuable components of any well-lived human life, when they are experienced properly. Perhaps such a project could be carried out, but Aristotle himself does not attempt to do so.
He often says, in the course of his discussion, that when the good person chooses to act virtuously, he does so for the sake of the "kalon" -- a word that can mean "beautiful," "noble," or "fine." (See for example 1120a23-4.) This term indicates that Aristotle sees in ethical activity an attraction that is comparable to the beauty of well-crafted artifacts, including such artifacts as poetry, music, and drama. He draws this analogy in his discussion of the mean, when he says that every craft tries to produce a work from which nothing should be taken away and to which nothing further should be added (1106b5-14). A craft product, when well designed and produced by a good craftsman, is not merely useful, but also has such elements as balance, proportion and harmony -- for these are properties that help make it useful. Similarly, Aristotle holds that a well-executed project that expresses the ethical virtues will not merely be advantageous but kalon as well -- for the balance it strikes is part of what makes it advantageous. The young person learning to acquire the virtues must develop a love of doing what is kalon and a strong aversion to its opposite -- the aischron, the shameful and ugly. Determining what is kalon is difficult (1106b28-33, 1109a24-30, and the normal human aversion to embracing difficulties helps account for the scarcity of virtue (1104b10-11).
So far from offering a decision procedure, Aristotle insists that this is something that no ethical theory can do. His theory elucidates the nature of virtue, but what must be done on any particular occasion by a virtuous agent depends on the circumstances, and these vary so much from one occasion to another that there is no possibility of stating a series of rules, however complicated, that collectively solve every practical problem. This feature of ethical theory is not unique; Aristotle thinks it applies to many crafts, such as medicine and navigation (1104a7-10). He says that the virtuous person "sees the truth in each case, being as it were a standard and measure of them" (1113a32-3); but this appeal to the good person's vision should not be taken to mean that he has an inarticulate and incommunicable insight into the truth. Aristotle thinks of the good person as someone who is good at deliberation, and he describes deliberation as a process of rational inquiry. The intermediate point that the good person tries to find is "determined by logos ("reason," "account") and in the way that the person of practical reason would determine it" (1107a1-2). To say that such a person "sees" what to do is simply a way of registering the point that the good person's reasoning does succeed in discovering what is best in each situation. He is "as it were a standard and measure" in the sense that his views should be regarded as authoritative by other members of the community. A standard or measure is something that settles disputes; and because good people are so skilled at discovering the mean in difficult cases, their advice must be sought and heeded.
Although there is no possibility of writing a book of rules, however long, that will serve as a complete guide to wise decision-making, it would be a mistake to attribute to Aristotle the opposite position, namely that every purported rule admits of exceptions, so that even a small rule-book that applies to a limited number of situations is an impossibility. He makes it clear that certain emotions (spite, shamelessness, envy) and actions (adultery, theft, murder) are always wrong, regardless of the circumstances (1107a8-12). Although he says that the names of these emotions and actions convey their wrongness, he should not be taken to mean that their wrongness derives from linguistic usage. He defends the family as a social institution against the criticisms of Plato (Politics II.3-4), and so when he says that adultery is always wrong, he is prepared to argue for his point by explaining why marriage is a valuable custom and why extra-marital intercourse undermines the relationship between husband and wife. He is not making the tautological claim that wrongful sexual activity is wrong, but the more specific and contentious point that marriages ought to be governed by a rule of strict fidelity. Similarly, when he says that murder and theft are always wrong, he does not mean that wrongful killing and taking are wrong, but that the current system of laws regarding these matters ought to be strictly enforced. So, although Aristotle holds that ethics cannot be reduced to a system of rules, however complex, he insists that some rules are inviolable.
Aristotle replies: "Virtue makes the goal right, practical wisdom the things leading to it" (1144a7-8). By this he cannot mean that there is no room for reasoning about our ultimate end. For as we have seen, he gives a reasoned defense of his conception of happiness as virtuous activity. What he must have in mind, when he says that virtue makes the goal right, is that deliberation typically proceeds from a goal that is far more specific than the goal of attaining happiness by acting virtuously. To be sure, there may be occasions when a good person approaches an ethical problem by beginning with the premise that happiness consists in virtuous activity. But more often what happens is that a concrete goal presents itself as his starting point -- helping a friend in need, or supporting a worthwhile civic project. Which specific project we set for ourselves is determined by our character. A good person starts from worthwhile concrete ends because his habits and emotional orientation have given him the ability to recognize that such goals are within reach, here and now. Those who are defective in character may have the rational skill needed to achieve their ends -- the skill Aristotle calls cleverness (1144a23-8) -- but often the ends they seek are worthless. The cause of this deficiency lies not in some impairment in their capacity to reason -- for we are assuming that they are normal in this respect -- but in the training of their passions.
It is not easy to understand the point Aristotle is making here. Has he not already told us that there can be no complete theoretical guide to ethics, that the best one can hope for is that in particular situations one's ethical habits and practical wisdom will help one to determine what to do? Furthermore, Aristotle nowhere announces, in the remainder of Book VI, that we have achieved the greater degree of accuracy that he seems to be looking for. The rest of this Book is a discussion of the various kinds of intellectual virtues: theoretical wisdom, science (epistêmê), intuitive understanding (nous), practical wisdom, and craft expertise. Aristotle explains what each of these states of mind is, draws various contrasts among them, and takes up various questions that can be raised about their usefulness. At no point does he explicitly return to the question he raised at the beginning of Book VI; he never says, "and now we have the standard of right reason that we were looking for." Nor is it easy to see how his discussion of these five intellectual virtues can bring greater precision to the doctrine of the mean.
We can make some progress towards solving this problem if we remind ourselves that at the beginning of the Ethics, Aristotle describes his inquiry as an attempt to develop a better understanding of what our ultimate aim should be. The sketchy answer he gives in Book I is that happiness consists in virtuous activity. In Books II through V, he describes the virtues of the part of the soul that is rational in that it can be attentive to reason, even though it is not capable of deliberating. But precisely because these virtues are rational only in this derivative way, they are a less important component of our ultimate end than is the intellectual virtue -- practical wisdom -- with which they are integrated. If what we know about virtue is only what is said in Books II through V, then our grasp of our ultimate end is radically incomplete, because we still have not studied the intellectual virtue that enables us to reason well in any given situation. One of the things, at least, towards which Aristotle is gesturing, as he begins Book VI, is practical wisdom. This state of mind has not yet been analyzed, and that is one reason why he complains that his account of our ultimate end is not yet clear enough.
But is practical wisdom the only ingredient of our ultimate end that has not yet been sufficiently discussed? Book VI discusses five intellectual virtues, not just practical wisdom, but it is clear that at least one of these -- craft knowledge -- is considered only in order to provide a contrast with the others. Aristotle is not recommending that his readers make this intellectual virtue part of their ultimate aim. But what of the remaining three: science, intuitive understanding, and the virtue that combines them, theoretical wisdom? Are these present in Book VI only in order to provide a contrast with practical wisdom, or is Aristotle saying that these too must be components of our goal? He does not fully address this issue, but it is evident from several of his remarks in Book VI that he takes theoretical wisdom to be a more valuable state of mind than practical wisdom. "It is strange if someone thinks that politics or practical wisdom is the most excellent kind of knowledge, unless man is the best thing in the cosmos" (1141a20-22). He says that theoretical wisdom produces happiness by being a part of virtue (1144a3-6), and that practical wisdom looks to the development of theoretical wisdom, and issues commands for its sake (1145a8-11). So it is clear that exercising theoretical wisdom is a more important component of our ultimate goal than practical wisdom.
Even so, it may still seem perplexing that these two intellectual virtues, either separately or collectively, should somehow fill a gap in the doctrine of the mean. Having read Book VI and completed our study of what these two forms of wisdom are, how are we better able to succeed in finding the mean in particular situations?
The answer to this question may be that Aristotle does not intend Book VI to provide a full answer to that question, but rather to serve as a prolegomenon to an answer. For it is only near the end of Book X that he presents a full discussion of the relative merits of these two kinds of intellectual virtue, and comments on the different degrees to which each needs to be provided with resources. In X.7-8, he argues that the happiest kind of life is that of a philosopher -- someone who exercises, over a long period of time, the virtue of theoretical wisdom, and has sufficient resources for doing so. (We will discuss these chapters more fully in section 10 below.) One of his reasons for thinking that such a life is superior to the second-best kind of life -- that of a political leader, someone who devotes himself to the exercise of practical rather than theoretical wisdom -- is that it requires less external equipment (1178a23-b7). Aristotle has already made it clear in his discussion of the ethical virtues that someone who is greatly honored by his community and commands large financial resources is in a position to exercise a higher order of ethical virtue than is someone who receives few honors and has little property. The virtue of magnificence is superior to mere liberality, and similarly greatness of soul is a higher excellence than the ordinary virtue that has to do with honor. (These qualities are discussed in IV.1-4.) The grandest expression of ethical virtue requires great political power, because it is the political leader who is in a position to do the greatest amount of good for the community. The person who chooses to lead a political life, and who aims at the fullest expression of practical wisdom, has a standard for deciding what level of resources he needs: he should have friends, property, and honors in sufficient quantities to allow his practical wisdom to express itself without impediment. But if one chooses instead the life of a philosopher, then one will look to a different standard -- the fullest expression of theoretical wisdom -- and one will need a smaller supply of these resources.
This enables us to see how Aristotle's treatment of the intellectual virtues does give greater content and precision to the doctrine of the mean. The best standard is the one adopted by the philosopher; the second-best is the one adopted by the political leader. In either case, it is the exercise of an intellectual virtue that provides a guideline for making important quantitative decisions. This supplement to the doctrine of the mean is fully compatible with Aristotle's thesis that no set of rules, no matter how long and detailed, obviates the need for deliberative and ethical virtue. If one chooses the life of a philosopher, one should keep the level of one's resources high enough to secure the leisure necessary for such a life, but not so high that one's external equipment becomes a burden and a distraction rather than an aid to living well. That gives one a firmer idea of how to hit the mean, but it still leaves the details to be worked out. The philosopher will need to determine, in particular situations, where justice lies, what generosity requires, when courage requires meeting a danger, and so on. All of the normal difficulties of ethical life remain, and they can be solved only by means of a detailed understanding of the particulars of each situation. Having philosophy as one's ultimate aim does not put an end to the need for developing and exercising practical wisdom and the ethical virtues.
Aristotle distinguishes two kinds of akrasia: impetuosity (propeteia) and weakness (astheneia). The person who is weak goes through a process of deliberation and makes a choice; but rather than act in accordance with his reasoned choice, he acts under the influence of a passion. By contrast, the impetuous person does not go through a process of deliberation and does not make a reasoned choice; he simply acts under the influence of a passion. At the time of action, the impetuous person experiences no internal conflict. But once his act has been completed, he regrets what he has done. One could say that he deliberates, if deliberation were something that post-dated rather than preceded action; but the thought process he goes through after he acts comes too late to save him from error.
It is important to bear in mind that when Aristotle talks about impetuosity and weakness, he is discussing chronic conditions. The impetuous person is someone who acts emotionally and fails to deliberate not just once or twice but with some frequency; he makes this error more than most people do. Because of this pattern in his actions, we would be justified in saying of the impetuous person that had his passions not prevented him from doing so, he would have deliberated and chosen an action different from the one he did perform.
The two kinds of passions that Aristotle focuses on, in his treatment of akrasia, are the appetite for pleasure and anger. Either can lead to impetuosity and weakness. But Aristotle gives pride of place to the appetite for pleasure as the passion that undermines reason. He calls the kind of akrasia caused by an appetite for pleasure "unqualified akrasia" -- or, as we might say, akrasia "full stop"; akrasia caused by anger he considers a qualified form of akrasia and calls it akrasia "with respect to anger". We thus have these four forms of akrasia: (A) impetuosity caused by pleasure, (B) impetuosity caused by anger, (C) weakness caused by pleasure (D) weakness caused by anger. It should be noticed that Aristotle's treatment of akrasia is heavily influenced by Plato's tripartite division of the soul in the Republic. Plato holds that either the spirited part (which houses anger, as well as other emotions) or the appetitive part (which houses the desire for physical pleasures) can disrupt the dictates of reason and result in action contrary to reason. The same threefold division of the soul can be seen in Aristotle's approach to this topic.
Although Aristotle characterizes akrasia and enkrateia in terms of a conflict between reason and feeling, his detailed analysis of these states of mind shows that what takes place is best described in a more complicated way. For the feeling that undermines reason contains some thought, which may be implicitly general. As Aristotle says, anger "reasoning as it were that one must fight against such a thing, is immediately provoked"(1149a33-4). And although in the next sentence he denies that our appetite for pleasure works in this way, he earlier had said that there can be a syllogism that favors pursuing enjoyment: "Everything sweet is pleasant, and this is sweet" leads to the pursuit of a particular pleasure (1147a31-30). Perhaps what he has in mind is that pleasure can operate in either way: it can prompt action unmediated by a general premise, or it can prompt us to act on such a syllogism. By contrast, anger always moves us by presenting itself as a bit of general, although hasty, reasoning.
But of course Aristotle does not mean that a conflicted person has more than one faculty of reason. Rather his idea seems to be that in addition to our full-fledged reasoning capacity, we also have psychological mechanisms that are capable of a limited range of reasoning. When feeling conflicts with reason, what occurs is better described as a fight between feeling-allied-with-limited-reasoning and full-fledged reason. Part of us -- reason -- can remove itself from the distorting influence of feeling and consider all relevant factors, positive and negative. But another part of us -- feeling or emotion -- has a more limited field of reasoning -- and sometimes it does not even make use of it.
Although "passion" is sometimes used as a translation of Aristotle's word pathos (other alternatives are "emotion" and "feeling"), it is important to bear in mind that his term does not necessarily designate a strong psychological force. Anger is a pathos whether it is weak or strong; so too is the appetite for bodily pleasures. And he clearly indicates that it is possible for an akratic person to be defeated by a weak pathos -- the kind that most people would easily be able to control (1150a9-b16). So the general explanation for the occurrence of akrasia cannot be that the strength of a passion overwhelms reason. Aristotle should therefore be acquitted of an accusation made against him by J.L. Austin in a well-known footnote to his paper, "A Plea For Excuses." Plato and Aristotle, he says, collapsed all succumbing to temptation into losing control of ourselves -- a mistake illustrated by this example: "I am very partial to ice cream, and a bombe is served divided into segments corresponding one to one with the persons at High Table: I am tempted to help myself to two segments and do so, thus succumbing to temptation and even conceivably (but why necessarily?) going against my principles. But do I lose control of myself? Do I raven, do I snatch the morsels from the dish and wolf them down, impervious to the consternation of my colleagues? Not a bit of it. We often succumb to temptation with calm and even with finesse." (Philosophical Papers, 1961, p. 146.) With this, Aristotle can agree: the pathos for the bombe can be a weak one, and in some people that will be enough to get them to act in a way that is disapproved by their reason at the very time of action.
What is most remarkable about Aristotle's discussion of akrasia is that he defends a position close to that of Socrates. When he first introduces the topic of akrasia, and surveys some of the problems involved in understanding this phenomenon, he says (1145b25-8) that Socrates held that there is no akrasia, and he describes this as a thesis that clearly conflicts with the appearances (phainomena). Since he says that his goal is to preserve as many of the appearances as possible (1145b2-7), it may come as a surprise that when he analyzes the conflict between reason and feeling, he arrives at the conclusion that in a way Socrates was right after all (1147b13-17). For, he says, the person who acts against reason does not have what is thought to be unqualified knowledge; in a way he has knowledge, but in a way does not.
Aristotle explains what he has in mind by comparing akrasia to the condition of other people who might be described as knowing in a way, but not in an unqualified way. His examples are people who are asleep, mad, or drunk; he also treats the akratic as someone like a student who has just begun to learn a subject, or an actor on the stage (1147a10-24). All of these people, he says, can utter the very words used by those who have knowledge; but their talk does not prove that they really have knowledge, strictly speaking.
These analogies can be taken to mean that the form of akrasia that Aristotle calls weakness rather than impetuosity always results from some diminution of cognitive or intellectual acuity at the moment of action. The akratic says, at the time of action, that he ought not to indulge in this particular pleasure at this time. But does he know or even believe that he should refrain? Aristotle might be taken to reply: yes and no. He has some degree of recognition that he must not do this now, but not full recognition. His feeling, even if it is weak, has to some degree prevented him from completely grasping or affirming the point that he should not do this. And so in a way Socrates was right. When reason remains unimpaired and unclouded, its dictates will carry us all the way to action, so long as we are able to act.
But Aristotle's agreement with Socrates is only partial, because he insists on the power of the emotions to rival, weaken or bypass reason. Emotion challenges reason in all three of these ways. In both the akratic and the enkratic, it competes with reason for control over action; even when reason wins, it faces the difficult task of having to struggle with an internal rival. Second, in the akratic, it temporarily robs reason of its full acuity, thus handicapping it as a competitor. It is not merely a rival force, in these cases; it is a force that keeps reason from fully exercising its power. And third, passion can make someone impetuous; here its victory over reason is so powerful that the latter does not even enter into the arena of conscious reflection until it is too late to influence action.
Supplementary Document: Alternate Readings of Aristotle on Akrasia
Book VII offers a brief account of what pleasure is and is not. It is not a process but an unimpeded activity of a natural state (1153a7-17). Aristotle does not elaborate on what a natural state is, but he obviously has in mind the healthy condition of the body, especially its sense faculties, and the virtuous condition of the soul. Little is said about what it is for an activity to be unimpeded, but Aristotle does remind us that virtuous activity is impeded by the absence of a sufficient supply of external goods (1153b17-19). One might object that people who are sick or who have moral deficiencies can experience pleasure, even though Aristotle does not take them to be in a natural state. He has two strategies for responding. First, when a sick person experiences some degree of pleasure as he is being restored to health, the pleasure he is feeling is caused by the fact that he is no longer completely ill. Some small part of him is in a natural state and is acting without impediment (1152b35-6). Second, Aristotle is willing to say that what seems pleasant to some people may in fact not be pleasant (1152b31-2), just as what tastes bitter to an unhealthy palate may not be bitter. To call something a pleasure is not only to report a state of mind but also to endorse it to others. Aristotle's analysis of the nature of pleasure is not meant to apply to every case in which something seems pleasant to someone, but only to activities that really are pleasures. All of these are unimpeded activities of a natural state.
It follows from this conception of pleasure that every instance of pleasure must be good to some extent. For how could an unimpeded activity of a natural state be bad or a matter of indifference? On the other hand, Aristotle does not mean to imply that every pleasure should be chosen. He briefly mentions the point that pleasures compete with each other, so that the enjoyment of one kind of activity impedes other activities that cannot be carried out at the same time (1153a20-22). His point is simply that although some pleasures may be good, they are not worth choosing when they interfere with other activities that are far better. This point is developed more fully in Ethics X.5.
Furthermore, Aristotle's analysis allows him to speak of certain pleasures as "bad without qualification" (1152b26-33), even though pleasure is the unimpeded activity of a natural state. To call a pleasure "bad without qualification" is to insist that it should be avoided, but allow that nonetheless it should be chosen in constraining circumstances. The pleasure of recovering from an illness, for example, is bad without qualification -- meaning that it is not one of the pleasures one would ideally choose, if one could completely control one's circumstances. Although it really is a pleasure and so something can be said in its favor, it is so inferior to other goods that ideally one ought to forego it. Nonetheless, it is a pleasure worth having -- if one adds the qualification that it is only worth having in undesirable circumstances. The pleasure of recovering from an illness is good, because some small part of oneself is in a natural state and is acting without impediment; but it can also be called bad, if what one means by this is that one should avoid getting into a situation in which one experiences that pleasure.
Aristotle indicates several times in VII.11-14 that merely to say that pleasure is a good does not do it enough justice; he also wants to say that the highest good is a pleasure. Here he is influenced by an idea expressed in the opening line of the Ethics: the good is that at which all things aim. In VII.13, he hints at the idea that all living things imitate the contemplative activity of god (1153b31-2). Plants and non-human animals seek to reproduce themselves because that is their way of participating in an unending series, and this is the closest they can come to the ceaseless thinking of the unmoved mover. Aristotle makes this point in several of his works (see for example De Anima 415a23-b7), and in Ethics X.7-8 he gives a full defense of the idea that the happiest human life resembles the life of a divine being. He conceives of god as a being who continually enjoy a "single and simple pleasure" (1154b26) -- the pleasure of pure thought -- whereas human beings, because of their complexity, grow weary of whatever they do. He will elaborate on these points in X.8; in VII.11-14, he appeals to his conception of divine activity only in order to defend the thesis that our highest good consists in a certain kind of pleasure. Human happiness does not consist in every kind of pleasure, but it does consist in one kind of pleasure -- the pleasure felt by a human being who engages in theoretical activity and thereby imitates the pleasurable thinking of god.
Book X offers a much more elaborate account of what pleasure is and what it is not. It is not a process, because processes go through developmental stages: building a temple is a process because the temple is not present all at once, but only comes into being through stages that unfold over time. By contrast, pleasure, like seeing and many other activities, is not something that comes into existence through a developmental process. If I am enjoying a conversation, for example, I do not need to wait until it is finished in order to feel pleased; I take pleasure in the activity all along the way. The defining nature of pleasure is that it is an activity that accompanies other activities, and in some sense brings them to completion. Pleasure occurs when something within us, having been brought into good condition, is activated in relation to an external object that is also in good condition. The pleasure of drawing, for example, requires both the development of drawing ability and an object of attention that is worth drawing.
The conception of pleasure that Aristotle develops in Book X is obviously closely related to the analysis he gives in Book VII. But the theory proposed in the later Book brings out a point that had received too little attention earlier: pleasure is by its nature something that accompanies something else. It is not enough to say that it is what happens when we are in good condition and are active in unimpeded circumstances; one must add to that point the further idea that pleasure plays a certain role in complementing something other than itself. Drawing well and the pleasure of drawing well always occur together, and so they are easy to confuse, but Aristotle's analysis in Book X emphasizes the importance of making this distinction.
He says that pleasure completes the activity that it accompanies, but then adds, mysteriously, that it completes the activity in the manner of an end that is added on. In the translation of W.D. Ross, it "supervenes as the bloom of youth does on those in the flower of their age" (1174b33). It is unclear what thought is being expressed here, but perhaps Aristotle is merely trying to avoid a possible misunderstanding: when he says that pleasure completes an activity, he does not mean that the activity it accompanies is in some way defective, and that the pleasure improves the activity by removing this defect. Aristotle's language is open to that misinterpretation because the verb that is translated "complete" (teleein) can also mean "perfect." The latter might be taken to mean that the activity accompanied by pleasure has not yet reached a sufficiently high level of excellence, and that the role of pleasure is to bring it to the point of perfection. Aristotle does not deny that when we take pleasure in an activity we get better at it, but when he says that pleasure completes an activity by supervening on it, like the bloom that accompanies those who have achieved the highest point of physical beauty, his point is that the activity complemented by pleasure is already perfect, and the pleasure that accompanies it is a bonus that serves no further purpose. Taking pleasure in an activity does help us improve at it, but enjoyment does not cease when perfection is achieved -- on the contrary, that is when pleasure is at its peak. That is when it reveals most fully what it is: an added bonus that crowns our achievement.
It is clear, at any rate, that in Book X Aristotle gives a fuller account of what pleasure is than he had in Book VII. We should take note of a further difference between these two discussions: In Book X, he makes the point that pleasure is a good but not the good. He cites and endorses an argument given by Plato in the Philebus: If we imagine a life filled with pleasure and then mentally add wisdom to it, the result is made more desirable. But the good is something that cannot be improved upon in this way. Therefore pleasure is not the good (1172b23-35). By contrast, in Book VII Aristotle strongly implies that the pleasure of contemplation is the good, because in one way or another all living beings aim at this sort of pleasure. Aristotle observes in Book X that what all things aim at is good (1172b35-1173a1); significantly, he falls short of endorsing the argument that since all aim at pleasure, it must be the good.
Book VII makes the point that pleasures interfere with each other, and so even if all kinds of pleasures are good, it does not follow that all of them are worth choosing. One must make a selection among pleasures by determining which are better. But how is one to make this choice? Book VII does not say, but in Book X, Aristotle holds that the selection of pleasures is not to be made with reference to pleasure itself, but with reference to the activities they accompany. "Since activities differ with respect to goodness and badness, some being worth choosing, others worth avoiding, and others neither, the same is true of pleasures as well" (1175b24-6). Aristotle's statement implies that in order to determine whether (for example) the pleasure of virtuous activity is more desirable than that of eating, we are not to attend to the pleasures themselves but to the activities with which we are pleased. A pleasure's goodness derives from the goodness of its associated activity. And surely the reason why pleasure is not the criterion to which we should look in making these decisions is that it is not the good. The standard we should use in making comparisons between rival options is virtuous activity, because that has been shown to be identical to happiness.
That is why Aristotle says that what is judged pleasant by a good man really is pleasant, because the good man is the measure of things (1176a15-19). He does not mean that the way to lead our lives is to search for a good man and continually rely on him to tell us what is pleasurable. Rather, his point is that there is no way of telling what is genuinely pleasurable (and therefore what is most pleasurable) unless we already have some other standard of value. Aristotle's discussion of pleasure thus helps confirm his initial hypothesis that to live our lives well we must focus on one sort of good above all others: virtuous activity. It is the good in terms of which all other goods must be understood. Aristotle's analysis of friendship supports the same conclusion.
His taxonomy begins with the premise that there are three main reasons why one person might like someone else. (The verb, "philein," which is cognate to the noun "philia," can sometimes be translated "like" or even "love" -- though in other cases philia involves very little in the way of feeling.) One might like someone because he is good, or because he is useful, or because he is pleasant. And so there are three bases for friendships, depending on which of these qualities binds friends together. When two individuals recognize that the other person is someone of good character, and they spend time with each other, engaged in activities that exercise their virtues, then they form one kind of friendship. If they are equally virtuous, their friendship is perfect. If, however, there is a large gap in their moral development (as between a parent and a small child, or between a husband and a wife), then although their relationship may be based on the other person's good character, it will be imperfect precisely because of their inequality.
The imperfect friendships that Aristotle focuses on, however, are not unequal relationships based on good character. Rather, they are relationships held together because each individual regards the other as the source of some advantage to himself or some pleasure he receives. When Aristotle calls these relationships "imperfect," he is tacitly relying on widely accepted assumptions about what makes a relationship satisfying. These friendships are defective, and have a smaller claim to be called "friendships," because the individuals involved have little trust in each other, quarrel frequently, and are ready to break off their association abruptly. Aristotle does not mean to suggest that unequal relations based on the mutual recognition of good character are defective in these same ways. Rather, when he says that unequal relationships based on character are imperfect, his point is that people are friends in the fullest sense when they gladly spend their days together in shared activities, and this close and constant interaction is less available to those who are not equal in their moral development.
When Aristotle begins his discussion of friendship, he introduces a notion that is central to his understanding of this phenomenon: a genuine friend is someone who loves or likes another person for the sake of that other person. Wanting what is good for the sake of another he calls "good will" (eunoia), and friendship is reciprocal good will, provided that each recognizes the presence of this attitude in the other. Does such good will exist in all three kinds of friendship, or is it confined to relationships based on virtue? At first, Aristotle leaves open the first of these two possibilities. He says: "it is necessary that friends bear good will to each other and wish good things for each other, without this escaping their notice, because of one of the reasons mentioned" (1156a4-5). The reasons mentioned are goodness, pleasure, and advantage; and so it seems that Aristotle is leaving room for the idea that in all three kinds of friendships, even those based on advantage and pleasure alone, the individuals wish each other well for the sake of the other.
But in fact, as Aristotle continues to develop his taxonomy, he does not choose to exploit this possibility. He speaks as though it is only in friendships based on character that one finds a desire to benefit the other person for the sake of the other person. "Those who wish good things to their friends for the sake of the latter are friends most of all, because they do so because of their friends themselves, and not coincidentally" (1156b9-11). When one benefits someone not because of the kind of person he is, but only because of the advantages to oneself, then, Aristotle says, one is not a friend towards the other person, but only towards the profit that comes one's way (1157a15-16).
In such statements as these, Aristotle comes rather close to saying that relationships based on profit or pleasure should not be called friendships at all. But he decides to stay close to common parlance and to use the term "friend" loosely. Friendships based on character are the ones in which each person benefits the other for the sake of other; and these are friendships most of all. Because each party benefits the other, it is advantageous to form such friendships. And since each enjoys the trust and companionship of the other, there is considerable pleasure in these relationships as well. Because these perfect friendships produce advantages and pleasures for each of the parties, there is some basis for going along with common usage and calling any relationship entered into for the sake of just one of these goods a friendship. Friendships based on advantage alone or pleasure alone deserve to be called friendships because in full-fledged friendships these two properties, advantage and pleasure, are present. It is striking that in the Ethics Aristotle never thinks of saying that the uniting factor in all friendships is the desire each friend has for the good of the other.
Aristotle does not raise questions about what it is to desire good for the sake of another person. He treats this as an easily understood phenomenon, and has no doubts about its existence. But it is also clear that he takes this motive to be compatible with a love of one's own good and a desire for one's own happiness. Someone who has practical wisdom will recognize that he needs friends and other resources in order to exercise his virtues over a long period of time. When he makes friends, and benefits friends he has made, he will be aware of the fact that such a relationship is good for him. And yet to have a friend is to want to benefit someone for that other person's sake; it is not a merely self-interested strategy. Aristotle sees no difficulty here, and rightly so. For there is no reason why acts of friendship should not be undertaken partly for the good of one's friend and partly for one's own good. Acting for the sake of another does not in itself demand self-sacrifice. It requires caring about someone other than oneself, but does not demand some loss of care for oneself. For when we know how to benefit a friend for his sake, we exercise the ethical virtues, and this is precisely what our happiness consists in.
Aristotle makes it clear that the number of people with whom one can sustain the kind of relationship he calls a perfect friendship is quite small (IX.10). Even if one lived in a city populated entirely by perfectly virtuous citizens, the number with whom one could carry on a friendship of the perfect type would be at most a handful. For he thinks that this kind of friendship can exist only when one spends a great deal of time with the other person, participating in joint activities and engaging in mutually beneficial behavior; and one cannot cooperate on these close terms with every member of the political community. One may well ask why this kind of close friendship is necessary for happiness. If one lived in a community filled with good people, and cooperated on an occasional basis with each of them, in a spirit of good will and admiration, would that not provide sufficient scope for virtuous activity and a well-lived life? Admittedly, close friends are often in a better position to benefit each other than are fellow citizens, who generally have little knowledge of one's individual circumstances. But this only shows that it is advantageous to be on the receiving end of a friend's help. The more important question for Aristotle is why one needs to be on the giving end of this relationship. And obviously the answer cannot be that one needs to give in order to receive; that would turn active love for one's friend into a mere means to the benefits received.
Aristotle attempts to answer this question in IX.11, but his treatment is disappointing. His fullest argument depends crucially on the notion that a friend is "another self," someone, in other words, with whom one has a relationship very similar to the relationship one has with oneself. A virtuous person loves the recognition of himself as virtuous; to have a close friend is to possess yet another person, besides oneself, whose virtue one can recognize at extremely close quarters; and so, it must be desirable to have someone very much like oneself whose virtuous activity one can perceive. The argument is unconvincing because it does not explain why the perception of virtuous activity in fellow citizens would not be an adequate substitute for the perception of virtue in one's friends.
Aristotle would be on stronger grounds if he could show that in the absence of close friends one would be severely restricted in the kinds of virtuous activities one could undertake. But he cannot present such an argument, because he does not believe it. He says that it is "finer and more godlike" to bring about the well being of a whole city than to sustain the happiness of just one person (1094b7-10). He refuses to regard private life -- the realm of the household and the small circle of one's friends -- as the best or most favorable location for the exercise of virtue. He is convinced that the loss of this private sphere would greatly detract from a well-lived life, but he is hard put to explain why. He might have done better to focus on the benefits of being the object of a close friend's solicitude. Just as property is ill cared for when it owned by all, and just as a child would be poorly nurtured were he to receive no special parental care -- points Aristotle makes in Politics II.2-5 -- so in the absence of friendship we would lose a benefit that could not be replaced by the care of the larger community. But Aristotle is not looking for a defense of this sort, because he conceives of friendship as lying primarily in activity rather than receptivity. It is difficult, within his framework, to show that virtuous activity towards a friend is a uniquely important good.
Since Aristotle thinks that the pursuit of one's own happiness, properly understood, requires ethically virtuous activity and will therefore be of great value not only to one's friends but to the larger political community as well, he argues that self-love is an entirely proper emotion -- provided it is expressed in the love of virtue (IX.8). Self-love is rightly condemned when it consists in the pursuit of as large a share of external goods -- particularly wealth and power -- as one can acquire, because such self-love inevitably brings one into conflict with others and undermines the stability of the political community. It may be tempting to cast Aristotle's defense of self-love into modern terms by calling him an egoist, and "egoism" is a broad enough term so that, properly defined, it can be made to fit Aristotle's ethical outlook. If egoism is the thesis that one will always act rightly if one consults one's self-interest, properly understood, then nothing would be amiss in identifying him as an egoist.
But egoism is sometimes understood in a stronger sense. Just as consequentialism is the thesis that one should maximize the general good, whatever the good turns out to be, so egoism can be defined as the parallel thesis that one should maximize one's own good, whatever the good turns out to be. Egoism, in other words, can be treated as a purely formal thesis: it holds that whether the good is pleasure, or virtue, or the satisfaction of desires, one should not attempt to maximize the total amount of good in the world, but only one's own. When egoism takes this abstract form, it is an expression of the idea that the claims of others are never worth attending to, unless in some way or other their good can be shown to serve one's own. The only underived reason for action is self-interest; that an act helps another does not by itself provide a reason for performing it, unless some connection can be made between the good of that other and one's own.
There is no reason to attribute this extreme form of egoism to Aristotle. On the contrary, his defense of self-love makes it clear that he is not willing to defend the bare idea that one ought to love oneself alone or above others; he defends self-love only when this emotion is tied to the correct theory of where one's good lies, for it is only in this way that he can show that self-love need not be a destructive passion. He takes it for granted that self-love is properly condemned whenever it can be shown to be harmful to the community. It is praiseworthy only if it can be shown that a self-lover will be an admirable citizen. In making this assumption, Aristotle reveals that he thinks that the claims of other members of the community to proper treatment are intrinsically valid. This is precisely what a strong form of egoism cannot accept.
We should also keep in mind Aristotle's statement in the Politics that the political community is prior to the individual citizen -- just as the whole body is prior to any of its parts (1253a18-29). Aristotle makes use of this claim when he proposes that in the ideal community each child should receive the same education, and that the responsibility for providing such an education should be taken out of the hands of private individuals and made a matter of common concern (1337a21-7). No citizen, he says, belongs to himself; all belong to the city (1337a28-9). What he means is that when it comes to such matters as education, which affect the good of all, each individual should be guided by the collective decisions of the whole community. An individual citizen does not belong to himself, in the sense that it is not up to him alone to determine how he should act; he should subordinate his individual decision-making powers to those of the whole. The strong form of egoism we have been discussing cannot accept Aristotle's doctrine of the priority of the city to the individual. It tells the individual that the good of others has, in itself, no valid claim on him, but that he should serve other members of the community only to the extent that he can connect their interests to his own. Such a doctrine leaves no room for the thought that the individual citizen does not belong to himself but to the whole.
Aristotle turns therefore, in X.7-8, to the two remaining alternatives -- politics and philosophy -- and presents a series of arguments to show that the philosophical life, a life devoted to theoria (contemplation, study), is best. Theoria is not the process of learning that leads to understanding; that process is not a candidate for our ultimate end, because it is undertaken for the sake of a further goal. What Aristotle has in mind when he talks about theoria is the activity of someone who has already achieved theoretical wisdom. The happiest life is lived by someone who has a full understanding of the basic causal principles that govern the operation of the universe, and who has the resources needed for living a life devoted to the exercise of that understanding. Evidently Aristotle believes that his own life and that of his philosophical friends was the best available to a human being. He compares it to the life of a god: god thinks without interruption and endlessly, and a philosopher enjoys something similar for a limited period of time.
It may seem odd that after devoting so much attention to the practical virtues, Aristotle should conclude his treatise with the thesis that the best activity of the best life is not ethical. In fact, some scholars have held that X.7-8 are deeply at odds with the rest of the Ethics; they take Aristotle to be saying that we should be prepared to act unethically, if need be, in order to devote ourselves as much as possible to contemplation. But it is difficult to believe that he intends to reverse himself so abruptly, and there are many indications that he intends the arguments of X.7-8 to be continuous with the themes he emphasizes throughout the rest of the Ethics. The best way to understand him is to take him to be assuming that one will need the ethical virtues in order to live the life of a philosopher, even though exercising those virtues is not the philosopher's ultimate end. To be adequately equipped to live a life of thought and discussion, one will need practical wisdom, temperance, justice, and the other ethical virtues. To say that there is something better even than ethical activity, and that ethical activity promotes this higher goal, is entirely compatible with everything else that we find in the Ethics.
Although Aristotle's principal goal in X.7-8 is to show the superiority of philosophy to politics, he does not deny that a political life is happy. Perfect happiness, he says, consists in contemplation; but he indicates that the life devoted to practical thought and ethical virtue is happy in a secondary way. He thinks of this second-best life as that of a political leader, because he assumes that the person who most fully exercises such qualities as justice and greatness of soul is the man who has the large resources needed to promote the common good of the city. The political life has a major defect, despite the fact that it consists in fully exercising the ethical virtues, because it is a life devoid of philosophical understanding and activity. Were someone to combine both careers, practicing politics at certain times and engaged in philosophical discussion at other times (as Plato's philosopher-kings do), he would lead a life better than that of Aristotle's politician, but worse than that of Aristotle's philosopher.
But his complaint about the political life is not simply that it is devoid of philosophical activity. The points he makes against it reveal drawbacks inherent in ethical and political activity. Perhaps the most telling of these defects is that the life of the political leader is in a certain sense unleisurely (1177b4-15). What Aristotle has in mind when he makes this complaint is that ethical activities are remedial: they are needed when something has gone wrong, or threatens to do so. Courage, for example, is exercised in war, and war remedies an evil; it is not something we should not wish for. Aristotle implies that all other political activities have the same feature, although perhaps to a smaller degree. Corrective justice would provide him with further evidence for his thesis -- but what of justice in the distribution of goods? Perhaps Aristotle would reply that in existing political communities a virtuous person must accommodate himself to the least bad method of distribution, because, human nature being what it is, a certain amount of injustice must be tolerated. As the courageous person cannot be completely satisfied with his courageous action, no matter how much self-mastery it shows, because he is a peace-lover and not a killer, so the just person living in the real world must experience some degree of dissatisfaction with his attempts to give each person his due. The pleasures of exercising the ethical virtues are, in normal circumstances, mixed with pain. Unalloyed pleasure is available to us only when we remove ourselves from the all-too-human world and contemplate the rational order of the cosmos. No human life can consist solely in these pure pleasures; and in certain circumstances one may owe it to one's community to forego a philosophical life and devote oneself to the good of the city. But the paradigms of human happiness are those people who are lucky enough to devote much of their time to the study of a world more orderly than the human world we inhabit.
Although Aristotle argues for the superiority of the philosophical life in X.7-8, he says in X.9, the final chapter of the Ethics, that his project is not yet complete, because we can make human beings virtuous, or good even to some small degree, only if we undertake a study of the art of legislation. The final section of the Ethics is therefore intended as an prolegomenon to Aristotle's political writings. We must investigate the kinds of political systems exhibited by existing Greek cities, the forces that destroy or preserve cities, and the best sort of political order. Although the study of virtue Aristotle has just completed is meant to be helpful to all human beings who have been brought up well -- even those who have no intention of pursuing a political career -- it is also designed to serve a larger purpose. Human beings cannot achieve happiness, or even something that approximates happiness, unless they live in communities that foster good habits and provide the basic equipment of a well-lived life.
The study of the human good has therefore led to two conclusions: The best life is not to be found in the practice of politics. But the well being of whole communities depends on the willingness of some to lead a second-best life -- a life devoted to the study and practice of the art of politics, and to the expression of those qualities of thought and passion that exhibit our rational self-mastery.
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First published: May 1, 2001
Content last modified: May 1, 2001