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Taking Thomas's alma mater Paris as reference point, the Faculty of Arts provided the point of entry to teen-aged boys. With the attainment of the Master of Arts at about the age of 20, one could go on to study in a higher faculty, law, medicine or theology. The theological program Thomas entered in Paris was a grueling one, with the master's typically attained in the early thirties. Extensive and progressively more intensive study of the scriptures, Old and New Testament, and of the summary of Christian doctrine called the Sentences which was compiled by the twelfth century Bishop of Paris, Peter Lombard. These close textual studies were complemented by public disputations and the even more unruly quodlibetal questions. Modeled more or less on the guilds, the student served a long apprenticeship, established his competence in stages and eventually, after a public examination was named a master and then gave his inaugural lecture.
At Naples, he was given the task of elevating the status of the Dominican House of Studies. His writing continued until he had a mystical experience which made him think of all he had done as "mere straw." At the time of his death in 1274 he was under a cloud in Paris and in 1277, 219 propositions were condemned by a commission appointed by the Bishop of Paris, among them tenets of Thomas. This was soon lifted, he was canonized and eventually was given the title of Common Doctor of the Church. But the subtle and delicate assimilation of Aristotle that characterized his work in both philosophy and theology did not survive his death, outside the Dominican Order, and has experienced ups and downs ever since.
Sometimes, Thomas puts the difference this way: "... the believer and the philosopher consider creatures differently. The philosopher considers what belongs to their proper natures, while the believer considers only what is true of creatures insofar as they are related to God, for example, that they are created by God and are subject to him, and the like." (Summa contra gentiles, bk II, chap. 4) Since the philosopher too, according to Thomas, considers things as they relate to God, this statement does not put the difference in a formal light.
The first and major formal difference between philosophy and theology is found in their principles, that is, starting points. The assumptions of the philosopher, that to which his discussions and arguments are ultimately driven back, are in the public domain. They are things that everyone knows; they are where disagreement between us must come to an end. These principles are not themselves the products of proof -- which does not of course mean that they are immune to rational analysis and inquiry -- and thus they are said to be known by themselves (per se, as opposed to per alia). This is proportionately true of each of the sciences, where the most common principles just alluded to are in the background and the proper principles or starting points of the particular science function regionally as the common principles do across the whole terrain of thought and being.
By contrast, the discourse of the theologian is ultimately driven back to starting points or principles that are held to be true on the basis of faith, that is, the truths that are authoritatively conveyed by the Bible. Some believers reflect on these truths and see other truths implied by them, spell out their interrelations and defend them against the accusation of being nonsense. Theological discourse looks like any other discourse and is, needless to say, governed by the common principles of thought and being, but it is characterized formally by the fact that its arguments and analyses are truth-bearing only for one who accepts Scriptural revelation as true.
This provides a formal test for deciding whether a piece of discourse is philosophical or theological. If it relies only on truths anyone can be expected to know about the world, and if it offers to lead to new truths on the basis of such truths, and only on that basis, then it is philosophical discourse. On the other hand, discourse whose cogency -- not formal, but substantive -- depends upon our accepting as true such claims as that there are three persons in one divine nature, that our salvation was effected by the sacrifice of Jesus, that Jesus is one person but two natures, one human, one divine, and the like, is theological discourse. Any appeal to an authoritative scriptural source as the necessary nexus in an argument is thereby other than philosophical discourse.
More will be said of this contrast later, but this is the essential difference Thomas recognizes between philosophy and theology. I will conclude this paragraph with a passage in which Thomas summarizes his position. He is confronting an objection to there being any need for theological discourse. Whatever can be the object of inquiry will qualify as a being of one sort or another; but the philosophical disciplines seem to cover every kind of being, indeed there is even a part of it which Aristotle calls theology. So what need is there for discourse beyond philosophical discourse?
....it should be noted that different ways of knowing (ratio cognoscibilis) give us different sciences. The astronomer and the natural philosopher both conclude that the earth is round, but the astronomer does this through a mathematical middle that is abstracted from matter, whereas the natural philosopher considers a middle lodged in matter. Thus there is nothing to prevent another science from treating in the light of divine revelation what the philosophical disciplines treat as knowable in the light of human reason. (Summa theologiae, Ia, q. 1, a., ad 2)
When such observations turn into objections, perhaps into the accusation that a believer cannot be a proper philosopher, there is often an unexamined notion of what a proper philosopher looks like. The proper philosopher may be thought to be someone -- perhaps merely some mind -- without antecedents or history who first comes to consciousness posing a philosophical question the answer to which is pursued without prejudice. But of course no human being and thus no philosopher is pure reason, mind alone, without previous history as he embarks on the task of philosophizing. One has necessarily knocked about in the world for a long time before he signs up for Philosophy 101. He has at hand or rattling around in his mind all kinds of ready responses to situations and questions. He very likely engaged in some kind of inquiry about whether or not to begin the formal study of philosophy in the first place. This may be acknowledged, but with the proviso that step one in the pursuit of philosophy is to rid the mind of all such antecedents. They must be put in the dock, put in brackets, placed in doubt, regarded with suspicion. Only after appropriate epistemological cleansing is the mind equipped to make its first warranted knowledge claim. Knowledge thus becomes a deliverance of philosophy, a product of philosophizing. Outside of philosophy there is no knowledge.
The preceding paragraph has been meant to capture the salient note of much modern philosophy since Descartes. Philosophy is first of all a search for defensible knowledge claims, and for the method according to which it will be found. As opposed to what?
As opposed to the view of philosophy described in paragraph 2, Thomas understands philosophizing to depend upon antecedent knowledge, to proceed from it, and to be unintelligible unless, in its sophisticated modes, it can be traced back to the common truths known to all. But this tracing back will pass through very different terrains, depending on the upbringing, culture and other vagaries and accidents of a given person's experience. The pre-philosophical -- I refer to the formal study of philosophy -- outlook of the believer will be characterizable in a given way, a way suggested above. It is more difficult to characterize the pre-philosophical attitudes and beliefs out of which the non-believer philosophizes. Let us imagine that he holds in a more or less unexamined way that all events, including thinking, are physical events. If he should, as a philosopher, take up the question of the immortality of the soul, he is going to regard with suspicion those classical proofs which rely on an analysis of thinking as a non-physical process. The Christian, on the other hand, will be well-disposed towards efforts to prove the immortality of the human soul and will accordingly approach descriptions of thinking as non-physical sympathetically. He is unlikely to view with equanimity any claim that for human beings death is the utter end.
The importance of this is that a believer runs the risk of accepting bad proofs of the immateriality of thinking and thus of the human soul. On the other hand, a committed materialist may be too quick to accept a bad proof that thinking is just a material process. Such antecedent stances are often the reason why philosophical agreement is so hard to reach. Does it make it impossible? Do such considerations destroy any hope of philosophical objectivity? Surely not, in principle. Believers and non-believers should be able to agree on what counts as a good proof in a given area even if they expect different results from such a proof. Thinking either is or is not merely a physical process and antecedent expectations do not settle the question, however they influence the pursuit of that objective resolution. But the important point is that antecedent dispositions and expectations are the common condition of philosophers, believers and unbelievers alike. Of course, believers hold that they have an advantage here, since the antecedents that influence them are revealed truths, not just hearsay, received opinion, the zeitgeist or prejudice.
This has led some to suggest that what is called Thomistic philosophy is an eclectic hodgepodge, not a set of coherent disciplines. Others, struck by the prominence in Thomas of such Platonic notions as participation, have argued that his thought is fundamentally Platonic, not Aristotelian. There is also an undeniable anti-Aristotelian animus in some influential students of Thomas, for example, Etienne Gilson. For Gilson, there is a radically original Thomistic philosophy which cannot be characterized by anything it shares with earlier thinkers, particularly Aristotle.
The recognition that Thomas is fundamentally an Aristotelian is not equivalent to the claim that Aristotle is the only influence on him. It is the claim that whatever Thomas takes on from other sources is held to be compatible with what he already holds in common with Aristotle. And, of course, to draw attention to the sources of Thomas's philosophy is not to say that everything he holds philosophically can be parsed back into historical antecedents.
That is one way to lay out the various philosophical disciplines. But there is another that has to do with the appropriate order in which they should be studied. That order of learning is as follows: logic, mathematics, natural philosophy, moral philosophy, metaphysics. The primacy of logic stems from the fact that we have to know what knowledge is so we will recognize that we have met its demands in a particular case. The study of mathematics comes early because little experience of the world is required to master it. But when we turn to knowledge of the physical world, there is an ever increasing dependence upon a wide and deep experience of things. Moral philosophy requires not only experience, but good upbringing and the banking of the passions. Metaphysics or wisdom, is the culminating and defining goal of philosophical inquiry: it is such knowledge as we can achieve of the divine, the first cause of all else.
Thomas commented on two logical works of Aristotle: On Interpretation (incomplete) and Posterior Analytics. On mathematics, there are only glancing allusions in Thomas's writings. Thomas describes logic as dealing with "second intentions," that is, with relations which attach to concepts expressive of the natures of existent things, first intentions. This means that logic rides piggy-back on direct knowledge of the world and thus incorporates the view that what is primary in our knowledge is the things of which we first form concepts. Mathematical entities are idealizations made by way of abstraction from our knowledge of sensible things. It is knowledge of sensible things which is primary and thus prior to the "order of learning" the philosophical sciences.
This epistemological primacy of knowledge of what we grasp by our senses is the basis for the primacy of the sensible in our language. Language is expressive of knowledge and thus what is first and most easily knowable by us will be what our language first expresses. That is the rule. It is interesting to see its application in the development of the philosophy of nature.
The first thing to notice about this is the assumption that we begin our study of the natural world, not with the presumed ultimate alphabet with which macrocosmic things are spelled, but with a vague and comprehensive concept which encompasses whatever has come to be as the result of a change and undergoes change. The reader of Aquinas becomes familiar with this assumption. Thomas learned it from the beginning of Aristotle's Physics.
The natural way of doing this is to start from the things which are more knowable and clear to us and to proceed towards those which are clearer and more knowable by nature; for the same things are not knowable relatively to us and knowable without qualification. So we must follow this method and advance from what is more obscure by nature, but clearer to us, towards what is more clear and more knowable by nature.
Now what is to us plain and clear at first is rather confused masses, the elements and principles of which become known to us later by analysis. Thus we must advance from universals to particulars; for it is a whole that is more knowable to sense-perception, and a universal is a kind of whole, comprehending many things within it, like parts. Much the same thing happens in the relation of the name to the formula. A name, e.g. Circle, means vaguely a sort of whole: its definition analyses this into particulars. Similarly a child begins by calling all men father, and all women mother, but later on distinguishes each of them." (Physics, 1, 1.)
Thomas calls the movement from the more to the less general in a science the "order of determination" or specification of the subject matter. The first purchase on natural things is via "physical object" or "natural thing." The "order of demonstration" involves finding the properties of things as known through this general concept. Then, specifying the subject further, one seeks properties of things known through the less common concepts. For example, in plane geometry, one would begin with plane figure and discover what belongs to it as such. Then one would turn to, say, triangle and seek its properties, after which one would go on to scalene and isosceles. So one will, having determined what is true of things insofar as they are physical objects, go on to seek the properties of things which are physical objects of this kind or that, for example, living and non-living bodies.
Thomas emphasizes those passages in the Aristotelian natural writings which speak of the order of determination, that is, of what considerations come first and are presupposed to those that come later. In several places, Thomas takes great pains to array the Aristotelian natural writings according to this Aristotelian principle, most notably perhaps at the outset of his commentary on Sense and sensibilia. The Physics is the first step in the study of the natural world and exhibits the rule that what is first and most easily known by us are generalities. The language used to express knowledge of such generalities will have, as we shall emphasize, a long career in subsequent inquiries, both in natural philosophy and beyond. What is sometimes thought of as a technical vocabulary, perhaps even as Aristotelian jargon, is seen by Thomas Aquinas as exemplifying the rule that we name things as we know them and that we come to know more difficult things after the easier things and extend the language used to speak of the easier, adjusting it to an every expanding set of referents.
The change may be expressed in three ways:
This makes clear that the different expressions of the change involve two things other than the subject of the change: the characteristics of the subject before (not-musical) and after (musical) the change. These elements of the change get the names that stick from another example, whittling wood. The term for wood in Greek is hyle and the term for shape, the external contours of a thing, is morphe. In English, form, a synonym of shape, is used to express the characteristic that the subject acquires as the result of the change, e.g. musical. The characterization of the subject prior to the change as not having the form is called privation. Using this language as canonical, Aristotle speaks of the subject of the change as its hyle or matter, the character it gains as its morphe or form, and its prior lack of the form as its privation. Any change will involve these three elements: matter, form and privation. The product of a change involves two things: matter and form.
Change takes place in the categories of quality, quantity and place, but in all cases the terminology of matter, form and privation comes to be used. The terms bind together similar but different kinds of change -- a subject changing temperature is like a subject changing place or size.
The thing to notice about this analysis is that substantial change is spoken of on an analogy with incidental change. The analysis of incidental change is presupposed and regulative. Moreover, the language used to speak of the elements of incidental change are extended to substantial change and altered in meaning so as to avoid equivocation. Thomas sees Aristotle's philosophical vocabulary arising out of analysis of what is most obvious to us and then progressively extended to more and more things insofar as the later is made known by appeal to the prior. Thus we can see that matter and form apply in a graded and connected way to the various kinds of incidental change and then to substantial change. It is this feature of Aristotle's language that Thomas adopts as his own. It both provides the lens through which Aristotle can be correctly seen and it provides a rule for knowing and naming that will characterize Thomas's use of Latin in philosophy and in theology as well.
How can we best analyze perception -- that is, seeing, feeling, hearing, and the like? In continuity with what has gone before, the questions are put in this form: How best to analyze coming to see, coming to feel, coming to hear, and the like. Seeing these on the analogy of change as already analyzed, we look for a subject, a privation and a form. The sensing subject is, say, the animal, but the proximate subjects to which they are attributed are the powers of sight, touch, hearing, and the like. An instance of seeing is describable as the power's moving from not seeing to seeing. Since the object of seeing is color, the change from not seeing to seeing issues in the power having the form of color.
We could give as an example of physical change, a substance acquiring a color. Now, while there are physical changes involved in sensation -- the organs are altered in the way physical bodies are -- that is not the change involved in perception as such. That is, in feeling a body my hand's own temperature is altered by the contact. But feeling cannot be just that, since any two physical bodies that come into contact would undergo a similar alteration of temperature. Feeling the temperature, becoming aware of it, is another sort of change, however much it depends on a contemporary physical change in the organs of sense. Having the color or temperature in this further sense is thus made known and named by reference to physical change. The fundamental difference between the two ways of acquiring a form is this. In a physical change of color, the change produces a new numerical instance of the color. In grasping or sensing a color, a numerically new instance of color does not result.
We have here the basis for talk of immateriality in perception. If the acquiring of a form by matter in physical change results in a new instance of the form and this is not the case with perception, we can make this point that acquiring the form in sensation is not identical to the acquiring of the form by matter in the primary sense. Thus, we both want to speak of the subject of sensation on an analogy with physical change and to distinguish the former from the latter. This is done by speaking of the immaterial reception of a form. Nonetheless, the sense power is a subject and thus matter in an analogous sense.
In his interpretation of Aristotle's De anima Thomas defends a view that was as contested in his own time as it is almost an orphan in our own. Among the tenets of so-called Latin Averroism was the view, first held by Averroes, that the move from perceptive acts to intellection is not one from a lower to a higher set of capacities or faculties of the human soul. When Aristotle contrasts intellection with perception and argues that the former does not employ a sense organ because it displays none of the characteristics of perception which does employ an organ, he is not, on the Latin-Averroistic view, referring to another capacity of the human soul, the intellect, but rather referring to a separate entity thanks to whose action human beings engage in what we call thinking. But the cause of this, the agent intellect, is not a faculty of the soul. (Aristotle distinguished two intellects, a passive and an active.) The proof for immortality which results from a wholly immaterial activity is therefore a statement about the incorruptibility of the separate entity, not a basis for arguing that each human soul is immortal because it has the capacity to perform immaterial activities. The Latin-Averroists consequently denied that Aristotle taught personal immortality.
Given this consequence, Thomas's adoption of the opposite interpretation -- viz. that the agent intellect is, like the passive intellect, a faculty of the human soul -- may seem merely an interested desire to enlist Aristotle's support for a position in harmony with Christian belief. Thomas is frequently said to have baptized Aristotle, which seems to mean that he fitted him to the Procrustean bed of Christian doctrine. Of course, the full Christian view is not simply that the soul survives death but that it will be reunited with body, and Thomas nowhere suggests that there is any intimation of this in Aristotle. Oddly enough, it is often friends of St. Thomas who suggest that he used Aristotle and was not chiefly concerned with what Aristotle might actually have intended.
Surely this is libelous. It would be less of an accusation to say that Thomas got a passage wrong than that he pretended it meant something he knew it did not. But the important point, all these centuries later, is whether Thomas's reading is or is not supported by the text. When he commented on the De anima, he seems not to be concerned with the flare up in Paris over Latin Averroism. This is the basis for dating the commentary in 1268, before Thomas returned to Paris. The commentary, accordingly, cannot be read as though it were prompted by the controversy. Of course, Thomas might be said to have long term interests in taming Aristotle to behave in a Christian way. As it happens, during the second Parisian period, in the thick of the Latin-Averroist controversy, Thomas wrote an opusculum dedicated to the question: what did Aristotle actually teach? The work is called in the Latin, De unitate intellectus contra averroistas. I have translated it as, On there being only one intellect. This little work is absolutely essential for assessing the nature of Thomas's Aristotelianism. He provides us with an extended textual analysis to show that the rival interpretation cannot be sustained by the text and that the only coherent reading of the De anima must view the agent and passive intellects as faculties of the human soul. His interpretation may be right or wrong, but the matter must be decided on the basis of textual interpretation, not vague remarks about Thomas's intentions.
For much of the twentieth century, Aristotelian studies have been conducted under the repressive pall of Werner Jaeger's evolutionary hypothesis. On this view, Aristotle began as an ardent Platonist for whom the really real lay beyond sensible reality. With maturity, however, came the sober Macedonian empiricism which trained its attention on the things of this world and eschewed all efforts to transcend it. As for the Metaphysics, Jaeger saw it as an amalgam of both theories. The passage just alluded to at the beginning of the work is ascribed to the Platonic phase. Other passages have a far more modest understanding of the range and point of a science over and above natural philosophy and mathematics. Platonice loquendo, there are entities which exist separately from sensible things and they constitute the object of the higher science. The more sober view finds a role for a science beyond natural philosophy and mathematics, but it will deal with things those particular sciences leave unattended, e.g. defense of the first principle of reasoning. But these tasks do not call for, and do not imply, a range of beings over and above sensible things.
Jaeger found both these conceptions of metaphysics clumsily juxtaposed in a crucial passage of Book Six.
One might indeed raise the question whether first philosophy is universal, or deals with one genus, i.e. some one kind of being; for not even the mathematical sciences are all alike in this respect, -- geometry and astronomy deal with a certain particular kind of thing, while universal mathematics applies alike to all. We answer that if there is no substance other than those which are formed by nature, natural science will be the first science; but if there is an immovable substance, the science of this must be prior and must be first philosophy, and universal in this way, because it is first. And it will belong to this to consider being qua being -- both what it is and the attributes which belong to it qua being. (1025a24-33)Jaeger invites us to see here a monument to a lost hope and an abiding reluctance to bid it a definitive farewell. Aristotle mentions the possibility of an immovable substance, something existing apart from the natural realm. Without such a separate substance, natural philosophy will be first philosophy. If there is such a substance, it will be a kind of being different from material being. The science that studies it will bear on a certain kind of being, immovable substance, immaterial being, not on being as being. It will be a special, not a universal, science. Jaeger sees Aristotle seeking to glue on to the special science the tasks that belong to a universal science, to make a theology into an ontology.
Jaeger's hypothesis, which cannot withstand half an hour's scrutiny, dominated interpretations of the Metaphysics until yesterday. Giovanni Reale's book had to await English translation before it could have any impact. By that time, people were turning from Jaeger and toward Aristotle neat, but this was only to weary of Jaeger, not to disprove him. Thomas's reading of the Metaphysics makes clear how mistaken Jaeger's claims are.
But let us first lay out Thomas's view of metaphysics. His question is Aristotle's: is there any science beyond natural science and mathematics? If to be and to be material are identical, then the science of being as being will be identical with the science of material being. That is what Aristotle rejects in the passage just quoted. It is in the course of doing natural philosophy that one gains certain knowledge that not everything that is is material. At the end of the Physics, Aristotle argues from the nature of moved movers that they require a first unmoved mover. If successful, this proof establishes that there is a first mover of all moved movers which is not itself material. Furthermore, the discussion of intellect in On the Soul III to which we alluded in the preceding paragraph, points beyond the material world. If the activity of intellect provides a basis for saying that, while the human soul is the substantial form of the body, it can exist apart from the body, that is, survive death, it is an immaterial existent. The Prime Mover and the immortal souls of human beings entail that to be and to be material are not identical. Since these are acquisitions at the limit of natural philosophy, they represent possible objects of inquiry in their own right. This is pre-eminently the case with the Prime Mover. It seems inevitable that there should be a discipline whose principal aim is to know more about the divine. How can it be described?
By common consent, Thomas's early discussion of the way theoretical sciences are distinguished from one another in the course of his exposition of the tractate of Boethius On the Trinity is masterful. The text speaks of three kinds of theoretical science, physics, mathematics and theology, and Thomas invokes the methodology of the Posterior Analytics. A scientia is constituted by a demonstrative syllogism. From a formal point of view, a conclusion follows necessarily from the premises in a well-formed syllogism. Still the conclusion may state a merely contingent truth. What is needed in a demonstrative syllogism is not just the necessity of the consequence but a necessary consequent, and this requires that the premises express necessary truths. That which is necessary cannot be otherwise than as it is; it cannot change. Science thus requires that it bear on immobile things. There is another requirement of the object of speculative or theoretical knowledge which stems from intellection. The activity of the mind, as has been mentioned, is not a material event; it is immaterial. Since it is the mind that knows, science is a mode of its knowing, and will share its nature. Thomas thus states two essential characteristics of the object of speculation, the speculabile: it must be removed both from matter and from motion. If that is the case then insofar as there are formally different ways in which speculabilia can be removed from matter and motion, there will be formally different speculative sciences.
By this analysis, Thomas has provided the necessary background for understanding the text of Boethius but also more importantly that of Aristotle as it is developed in the chapter from which Werner Jaeger quoted in order to display the failure of the Aristotelian project. "Now we must not fail to notice the nature of the essence and of its formula, for, without this, inquiry is but idle. Of things defined, i.e. of essences, some are like snub, and some like concave. And these differ because snub is bound up with matter (for what is snub is a concave nose), while concavity is independent of perceptible matter." (1025a28-32) The objects of natural philosophy are defined like snub and the objects of mathematics like concave. This makes it clear that the way in which natural things are separated from sensible matter is the way in which the definition common to many things abstracts from the singular characteristics of each. But it is the matter as singular that is the principle of change in things, so the common definition has the requisite necessity for science. This or that man comes to be, but what-it-is-to-be-a-man does not come to be or pass away.
Mathematical things, on the analogy of concave, do not have sensible matter in their definitions. Lines, points, numbers, triangles -- these do not have sensible qualities whether stated universally or singularly. The fact that we define mathematicals without sensible matter does not commit us to the view that mathematicals actually exist apart from sensible matter.
In the commentary on Boethius to which reference has been made, Thomas has early on recalled another fundamental aspect of Aristotle's thought. The objects of thought are either simple or complex, where complex means that one thing is affirmed or denied of another. Knowledge of simples is expressed in a definition, that of the complex in a proposition. Thinking of human nature without thinking of singular characters of this man or that is a matter of definition, not of assertion, as if one were denying that human nature is found in singular matter. So too defining mathematicals without sensible matter is not tantamount to the judgment that mathematicals exist apart from sensible matter. These are both instances of abstraction, where abstraction means to think apart what does not exist apart. Thus it is that the question of metaphysics turns on what Thomas calls separatio. To separate differs from abstraction in this that separation is expressed in a negative judgment, a proposition: this is not that, that this exists apart from that. The relevant separation for metaphysics is the negative judgment that to be and to be material are not the same. That is, there are things which exist apart from matter and motion -- not just are defined without, but exist without matter and motion.
What then is the subject of metaphysics? "Subject" here means the subject of the conclusion of the demonstrative syllogism. The discussion of definition in effect bore on the middle terms of demonstrative syllogisms and the suggestion is that formally different modes of defining, with respect to removal from matter and motion, ground the formal difference between types of theoretical science. The subject of a demonstration in natural philosophy is defined without singular but with common or universal sensible matter; the subject of a mathematical demonstration is defined without any sensible matter. How can the subject of metaphysics be expressed? The possibility of the science depends on our knowing that some things exist apart from matter and motion. Mathematics does not presuppose the separate existence of its objects; metaphysics does. Why not then say that metaphysics deals with things separated from matter and motion, that is, as Jaeger notes, with a particular kind of being? But that is the not the subject ever assigned to this effort by Aristotle. The methodological reasons can be found in chapter 17 of Book Seven of the Metaphysics: the subject of a science must always be a complex entity. That is why the subject of this discipline is being as being.
Why should we say that, in our desire to learn more about separate substances, we should take as our subject all the things that are? The short answer is this: in order to be a theology, metaphysics must first be an ontology. Separate substance, divine being, is not directly accessible for our inspection or study. We come upon our first secure knowledge of God in the proof of the Prime Mover. Tantalizingly, once seen as a necessary requirement for there being any moved movers, the Prime Mover does not become a thematic object of inquiry in natural philosophy. One obvious reason for this is that such an entity is not an instance of the things which fall under the scope of the science. Knowledge of it comes about obliquely and indirectly. The same restriction is operative when the philosopher turns his culminating attention to the deity. How can he know more about the first cause of things? If the Prime Mover is known through moved movers as his effects, any further knowledge of him must be through his effects. It is by describing the effect as widely as possible that one seeks to come to a knowledge of the first cause unrestricted by the characteristics of mobile things. That characterization is being as being. The subject of metaphysics is being in all its amplitude in order to acquire a knowledge of the cause of being that will be correspondingly unbounded.
Thus it is that divine science or theology is of two kinds, one in which divine things are considered not as the subject of the science but as principles of the subject and this is the theology that the philosophers pursue, also called metaphysics. The other considers divine things in themselves as the subject of the science, and this is the theology which is treated in Sacred Scripture. They are both concerned with things which exist separately from matter and motion, but differently, insofar as they are two ways in which something can exist separately from matter and motion: first, such that it is of the definition of the things said to be separate, that they can never exist in matter in motion, as God and the angels are said to be separate from matter and motion; second, such that it is not part of their definition that they exist in matter and motion, because they can exist apart from matter and motion, although sometimes they are found in matter and motion, for example, substance, potency and act are separate from matter and motion because they do not require matter in order to exist as mathematicals do, although they can be understood without sensible matter. Philosophical theology treats of things separate in the second way as its subjects and of things separate in the first way as the principles of its subject. But the theology of Sacred Scripture treats of things separate in the first way as its subjects, although in it some things which exist in matter and motion are considered insofar as they are needed to make the divine manifest." (Exposition of Boethius' On the Trinity, q. 5, a. 4)Philosophical theology is not some science distinct from metaphysics; it is simply the name that can be given to metaphysics because it appeals to God as the cause of its subject. This may make it seem that knowledge of God is merely a bonus, a tangential consideration; on the contrary, it is the chief aim of the science. But the divine can only be known indirectly, through its effects. For this reason, metaphysics can be viewed as an extended effort to examine substance in order to come to knowledge of the first cause. And given the principle that we name things as we know then, this can be regarded as a prolonged effort to devise a language with which to speak of God.
In the crucial middle books of the Metaphysics -- Seven and Eight -- we have an analysis of substance which takes off from material substance, which is a compound of matter and form, and arrives at a notion of substance as form alone. This definition does not fit material substance, of course, but it is devised in order to be able to apply the term substance to the immaterial things whose existence has been established in natural philosophy. This extension of names whose natural habitat is sensible things to God is another instance of analogous naming for Aquinas. Names common to God and creature bring out another feature of our knowing insisted upon by both Aristotle and Aquinas. If we ask what the primary analogate of names common to God and creature is, the answer is: the meaning of the term as it applies to creatures. The word must be refined before it can be applied to God and this means the formation of an extended meaning which leans on the primary meaning for its intelligibility.
Consider the example of wise. Both men and God are said to be wise. What can we mean when we say that God is wise? Not the same thing as when we say that Socrates is wise. Socrates became wise and wisdom is a trait which with age and forgetfulness he could lose. Thus to be Socrates and to be wise are not the same thing. But in the case of God, wise does not signify some incidental property He might or might not have. This is captured by noting that while we say God is wise, we also say he is wisdom. This suffices to indicate the way in which the meaning of the term as applied to God involves negating features of its meaning as it applies to men.
If God is thus named secondarily by the common name, so that the creature is primarily named by it, nonetheless God's wisdom is the cause and source of human wisdom. Ontologically, God is primary and the creature secondary. Names analogously common to God and creature thus underscore the way in which what comes to be known first for us is not first in reality and what is first in reality is not first in our knowledge.
The problem that Thomas now faces is how to speak of the immaterial substances which are less than God although superior to material substances, that is, angels. For a material thing to exist is for its form actually to inhere in its matter. But what is it for a pure form to exist? Since immaterial substances less than God are dependent on the divine causality in order to exist, existence cannot be what they are, of their essence. In short, in angels too there is a distinction of essence and existence. Thomas notes that a created separate substance is what it is and not another thing: that is, it has the perfection it has, but not unlimited perfection. It is a being of a kind, not being as such. Gabriel is perfect as to Gabrielitas, but he is not Raphael or Michael. Form thus operates as a restriction on existence as such. In God alone is there unrestricted existence; he is existence, ipsum esse subsistens.
Many have come to this point, pulse quickened by the possibilities of the function-argument, only to be gripped with doubt at this final application of it. Rational activity seems too unmanageable a description to permit a function-analysis of it. Of course Aristotle agrees, having made the point himself. Rational activity is said in many ways or, as Thomas would put it, it is an analogous term. It covers an ordered set of instances. There is the activity of reason as such, there is the activity of reason in its directive or practical capacity, and there are bodily movements and the like which are rational insofar as they are directed by reason. If the virtue of a function is to perform it well, the analogy of "rational activity" makes clear that there is a plurality of virtues. Moral virtues are habits of appetite brought about by the direction of reason. Temperance is to seek pleasure rationally, courage is to react to the threat of harm rationally. The virtues of practical intellect are art and prudence; the virtues of theoretical intellect are insight, science and wisdom.
All this and much more enters into Thomas's moral teaching. Here as elsewhere the Aristotelian component looms large. Thomas will distinguish acts of a man from human acts, the former being activities truly found in human agents but also found in other non-human agents too. The human act is one which proceeds from knowledge and will. Since the human act by definition is the pursuit of a known good, the question arises as to the relationship between the objects of the myriad acts that human perform. Is there some over-all good sought by human agents? Is there an ultimate end of human action?
In commenting on chapter two of Book One of the Nicomachean Ethics where Aristotle argues for there being an ultimate end, Thomas points out that the argument is actually a series of reductiones ad absurdum. That is, the denial of an ultimate end of human action reduces to the claim that there is no end to human seeking, that it is pointless. This analysis has not gotten the attention it deserves: the implication is that it is self-evident that there is an ultimate end which is why denials of it must flounder in incoherence. The argument for ultimate end that Thomas puts forth in the Summa theologiae is somewhat different. Any action aims at some good. A particular good by definition shares in and is not identical with goodness itself. What binds together all the acts that humans perform is the overarching goodness they seek in this, that and the other thing. That over arching goodness, what Thomas calls the ratio bonitatis, is the ultimate end. It follows that anything a human agent does is done for the sake of the ultimate end.
This dissatisfies because we feel we are owed a richer account of goodness. After all, human agents differ insofar as they have different notions of what goodness is. Fame, wealth, pleasure, power, and so on seem to function as the dominant purpose of different persons. Thomas could scarcely overlook this, let alone deny it. Can his earlier position on the unity of the ultimate end still stand? The fact that there are false or inadequate identifications of goodness does not mean that there is not a true and adequate account of what is perfecting or fulfilling of human agents. Everyone acts on the supposition that what he does will contribute to his overall good; one's overall good is the ultimate reason for doing anything. But not everything one does under this aegis actually contributes to one's overall good. Thus in one sense there is one and the same ultimate end for every human agent -- the integral human good -- and there are correct and mistaken notions of what actually constitutes this integral good.
This may seem like an empty claim, but it provides a basis on which to proceed. If indeed every human agent acts for the sake of his overall good, the discussion can turn to whether or not what he here and now pursues, or his general theory of what constitutes the overall good, can withstand scrutiny. It is not necessary to persuade anyone that he ought to pursue the ultimate end in the sense of his overall good. What else would he pursue? But if one is persuaded that what he pursues does not contribute to his overall good, he already has reasons for changing his ways.
What is natural law? One description of it is: the peculiarly human participation in the eternal law, in providence. All creatures are ordered to an end, have natures whose fulfillment is what it is because of those natures. It is not peculiar to man that he is fashioned so as to find his good in the fulfillment of his nature. That is true of anything. But others things are ordered to ends of which they themselves are not conscious. It is peculiar to man that he becomes aware of the good and freely directs himself to it. Of course man is not free to choose the good -- any choice is a choice of the good. But as to what is really as opposed to only apparently his good, he is not free to make that what it is. He is free to direct himself or not to his true end, however.
A second description of natural law is: the first principles or starting points of practical reasoning. To indicate what he means by this, Thomas invokes the analogy of the starting points of reasoning as such. We have already mentioned the distinction between knowledge of the simple and knowledge of the complex. The former is a concept and is expressed in a definition or description. The latter is an affirmation or negation of one thing of another. There is something which is first in each of these orders. That is, Thomas holds that there is a conception which is prior to and presupposed by all other conceptions and a judgment that is prior to and presupposed by all other judgments. Since knowledge is expressed by language, this seems to come down to the assertion that there is a first word that everyone utters and a first sentence that would appear in everyone's baby book on the appropriate page. But surely that is false. So what does Thomas mean?
He says that our first conception is of being, of that which is, and our first judgment is that you cannot affirm and deny the same thing in the same sense simultaneously. Since few if any humans first utter being or its equivalent and no one fashions as his first enunciation the principle of contradiction, facts as known to Thomas as ourselves, his meaning must be more subtle. It is this. Whatever concept one first forms and expresses verbally -- Mama, hot, whatever -- is a specification or an instance of that which is. Aristotle has observed that children at first call all men father and all women mother. The terms then function as generic for any male or female. Even more basically, each presupposes that what is generically grasped is an instance of being. Being is prior not because it is grasped absolutely, without reference to this being or that. It is some particular being that is first of all grasped and however it is named it will mean minimally something that is.
So too with regard to the first judgment. Children express their recognition of this principle when they disagree over the location of some quite specific thing, say a baseball mitt. One accuses the other of taking it. You did. I didn't. You did. I didn't. A fundamental disagreement. But what they are agreed on is that if it were true that one did it could not simultaneously and in the same sense be true that he did not. The principle is latent in, implicit in, any concrete judgment just as being is involved in any other conception.
It is on an analogy with these starting points of thinking as such that Thomas develops what he means by natural law. In the practical order there is a first concept analogous to being in the theoretical order and it is the good. The good means what is sought as fulfilling of the seeker. The first practical judgment is: the good should be done and pursued and evil avoided. Any other practical judgment is a specification of this one and thus includes it. Natural Law consists of this first judgment and other most general ones that are beyond contest. These will be fashioned with reference to constituents of our complete good -- existence, food, drink, sex and family, society, desire to know. We have natural inclinations to such goods. Natural law precepts concerning them refer the objects of natural inclinations to our overall or integral good, which they specify.
Most moral judgments are true, if true, only by and large. They express means to achieve our overall good but because there is not a necessary connection between the means and end, they can hold only for the most part. Thus there are innumerable ways in which men lead their lives in keeping with the ultimate end. Not all means are necessarily related to the end. Moral philosophy reposes on natural law precepts as common presuppositions, but its advice will be true only in the main.
It might be noted that when Thomas, following Aristotle, says that man is by nature a social or political animal, he does not mean that each of us has a tendency to enter into social contracts or the like. The natural in this sense is what is not chosen, but given, and what is given about human life is that we are born into the community of the family and are dependent on it for years in order to survive. The moral consists in behaving well in this given setting.
When in 1879 Leo XIII issued the encyclical Aeterni Patris calling for the revival of the study of Thomas Aquinas, he was not directing his readers to one school as opposed to others. Thomas was put forward as the paladin of philosophy in its true sense, as over and against the vagaries of modern thought since Descartes. The response to Leo's call was global and sustained. New journals and learned societies were founded, curricula were reshaped to benefit from the thought of Thomas and this not simply in seminaries and pontifical universities but throughout the world in colleges and universities. Such giants as Jacques Maritain and Etienne Gilson may be taken to symbolize the best of this Thomistic revival.
Vatican II, the ecumenical council that met from 1962-1965 spelled the end of the Thomistic Revival. It was widely held that the Council had dethroned Thomas in favor of unnamed contemporary philosophers. (When they were named, quarrels began.) In the post-conciliar period, Catholics have managed to board every sinking ship in sight and now with the vogue of the notion that modernity has failed and the Enlightenment Project come a cropper, many, Catholics and others, are turning to Thomas as a spur or foil for their thinking. In 1998 John Paul II issued an encyclical called Fides et Ratio which may be regarded as the charter of the Thomism of the third millennium.
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First published: July 12, 1999
Content last modified: July 12, 1999