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Albert of Saxony

Albert of Saxony (ca. 1316-1390), Master of Arts at Paris, then Rector of the University of Vienna, and finally Bishop of Halberstadt (Germany). As a logician, he was at the forefront of the movement that expanded the analysis of language based on the properties of terms, especially their reference (in Latin: suppositio), but also in the exploration of new fields of logic, especially the theory of consequences. As a natural philosopher, he worked in the tradition of John Buridan, and contributed to the spread of Parisian natural philosophy throughout Italy and central Europe.

1. Life and Works

Albert of Saxony (Albertus de Saxonia), whose family name was Albert of Ricmerstop or Rickmersdorf, is sometimes called Albertucius (Little Albert), to distinguish him from the 13th-century theologian Albert the Great. He was born at Helmstedt in present-day Germany around 1316. After initial schooling in the region of Helmstedt, and possibly a sojourn at Erfurt, he made his way to Prague and then on to Paris, where he became a master of arts in 1351. He was Rector of the University of Paris in 1353. He remained in Paris until 1362, during which time he taught arts and studied theology at the Sorbonne, apparently without obtaining any degree in the latter discipline. His logical and philosophical works were composed during this period. After two years of apparently carrying out diplomatic missions between the Pope and the Duke of Austria, he was charged with founding the University of Vienna, of which he became the first Rector in 1365. Appointed canon of Hildesheim in 1366, he was also named Bishop of Halberstadt the same year, fulfilling that office until his death, July 8, 1390.

Not having left any theological writings or commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics (at least none that we know of), Albert is primarily known for his works on logic and natural philosophy. He also wrote commentaries on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics and Economics, as well as several short mathematical texts (the “Treatise on Proportions” and “Question on the Squaring of the Circle”).

Albert's masterwork in logic is a summa entitled the Perutilis logica (Very Useful Logic). He also composed a voluminous collection of Sophismata, in which he examines numerous sentences raising difficulties of interpretation due to the presence of syncategorematic words (i.e., terms such as quantifiers and certain prepositions, which, according to medieval logicians, do not themselves have a proper and determinate signification, but which modify the signification of other terms in a proposition). He also wrote several question commentaries: Quaestiones on the Ars Vetus or Old Logic (the Isagoge of Porphyry and Aristotle's Categories and De interpretatione), Quaestiones and a Commentary on the Posterior Analytics, and a series of 25 Quaestiones logicales (Logical Questions), addressed to semantic problems and the status of logic. Of dubious authenticity are commentaries on the Prior Analytics (both literal and question commentaries), as well as treatises De consequentiis (On Consequences) and De locis dialecticis (On Dialectical Topics), which have been attributed to him in a Parisian manuscript.

The most renowned philosopher during the era when Albert studied and taught in the Faculty of Arts at Paris was John Buridan. Albert belonged to the first generation of masters who, in one form or another, carried on the tradition of Buridan in logic and natural philosophy. Accordingly, his commentary on the Posterior Analytics to a large extent reprises the work of Buridan. At the same time, however, Albert's own work, especially in logic, testifies to the influence of certain ideas and methods developed in England, particularly by William of Ockham, William Heytesbury -- as is apparent in Albert's Sophismata -- and Thomas Bradwardine, on the study of movement. Walter Burley was another important influence on Albert. This influence is paradoxical in view of the fact that they had opposing views on the nature of universals, but it is nonetheless in evidence in his commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics, and also noticeable in his theory of consequences. Finally, Albert both knew and discussed certain theses of Thomas Maulfelt, who had taught at Paris around 1330. These various influences have sometimes made Albert seem an eclectic compiler -- and not without reason. But, besides making possible several of Albert's own contributions, Albert's eclecticism confers upon him a unique place in the development of logic and philosophy at the University of Paris in the 14th century.

2. Logic

In most respects, the Perutilis logica exhibits the influence of Ockham's Summa logicae, although it develops in a more autonomous fashion the treatises on obligations, insolubles, and consequences, which had assumed greater importance during this period. As has been known for some time, this work is a remarkable handbook organized into six treatises: the first defines the elements of propositions; the second treats of the properties of terms; the third of the truth conditions of different types of proposition; the fourth of consequences (including syllogisms, and in fact adding to it the theory of topics); the fifth of fallacies; and the sixth of insolubles and obligations.

In the first part of the Perutilis logica, which sets out the terminology of the entire text, Albert returns to the Ockhamist conception of the sign, and so distances himself from the position defended by Buridan. After clearly including the term (an element of the proposition) in the genus of signs -- and thereby providing, in the tradition of Ockham, a semiotic approach to logico-linguistic analysis -- he establishes signification through a referential relation to a singular thing, defining the relation of spoken to conceptual signs as a relation of subordination. He is also Ockhamist in his conception of universals, which he regards as spoken or conceptual signs, and in his theory of supposition, which essentially restates the Ockhamist divisions of supposition. In particular, he preserves the notion of simple supposition -- i.e., the reference of a term to the concept to which it is subordinated, when it signifies an extra-mental thing -- which had been challenged and criticized by Buridan. Finally, Albert is close to the Venerabilis Inceptor in his theory of the categories, where, in contrast to Buridan, he refuses to consider quantity as something absolutely real, reducing it instead to a disposition of substance and quality. In doing so, he contributed as much as Ockham to the spread of this model of the relation between substance and quantity in natural philosophy in Paris and Italy.

Albert's treatment of relations is, on the other hand, highly original. Although (like Ockham) he refuses to make relations into things distinct from absolute entities, he clearly ascribes them to an act of the soul by which absolute entities are compared and placed in relation to each other (an act of the referring soul [actus animae referentis]). This leads him to reject completely certain propositions Ockham had admitted as reasonable, even if he did not construe them in quite the same way, e.g., ‘Socrates is a relation’. Both Ockham and Buridan had allowed that the term ‘relation’ could refer to the things related (whether connoted or signified) by concrete relative terms (whether collectively or not).

So Albert was not content with merely repeating Ockhamist arguments. More often than not, he developed and deepened them, e.g., in connection with the notion of the appellation of form. This property of predicates, which had previously been used by the Venerabilis Inceptor, was employed by Albert in an original manner when he turned to it, in place of Buridan's appellation of reason (appellatio rationis), to analyze verbs expressing propositional attitudes. Every proposition following a verb such as ‘believe’ or ‘know’ appellates its form. In other words, it must be possible to designate the object of the belief via the expression understood as identical to itself in its material signification, and without reformulation. Another area in which Albert deviates from Ockham is in his rejection of the idea that any distinction with multiple senses must have an equivocal proposition as its object. According to Albert, equivocal propositions can only be conceded, rejected, or left in doubt.

Albert's semantics becomes innovative when he admits that propositions have their own proper significate, which is not identical to that of their terms (see especially his Questions on the Posterior Analytics I, qq. 2, 7, 33). Like syncategorematic terms (see his Questions on the Categories, qu. 1 ‘On Names’), propositions signify the “mode of a thing [modus rei]”. Nevertheless, Albert avoids hypostatizing these modes, in the final analysis explaining them as relations between the things to which the terms refer. It cannot be said here that Albert is moving towards the “complexly signifiable [complexe significabile]” of Gregory of Rimini, although his remarks are reminiscent of the latter theory. Still, he uses the idea of the signification of a proposition to define truth and to explain ‘insolubles’, i.e., propositions expressing paradoxes of self-reference. On Albert's view, every proposition signifies that it is true by virtue of its form. Thus, an insoluble proposition will be false because it signifies at the same time that it is true and that it is false.

In his Sophismata, Albert usually follows Heytesbury. The distinction between compounded and divided senses, which is presented in a highly systematic way in Heytesbury's Tractatus de sensu composito et diviso, is the primary instrument (besides the appellation of form) used to resolve difficulties connected with epistemic verbs, and with propositional attitudes more generally. This is abundantly clear in his discussion of infinity. Rather than appealing to the increasingly common distinction between the categorematic and syncategorematic uses of the term ‘infinite’, and then indicating the different senses it can have depending upon where it occurs in a proposition, he treats the infinite itself as a term. Albert's approach involves giving the analysis of the logical and linguistic conditions of every proposition involving the term ‘infinite’ that is significant and capable of being true. This leads him to sketch a certain number of possible definitions (where he appears to take into account the definitions of Gregory of Rimini), but also to raise other questions, e.g., on the relation between finite and infinite beings (in propositions such as ‘infinite things are finite [infinita sunt finita]’), on the divisibility of the continuum, and on qualitative infinity. There are echoes in Albert not only of the approach Buridan had, for his part, systematically implemented in his Physics, but also of the analyses of English authors -- again, especially Heytesbury. As is often the case, the treatment proposed by Albert in the Sophismata is quick and a little eclectic, but it provides good evidence of the extent to which questions about the infinite were discussed at the time.

Finally, one of the fields in which Albert is considered a major contributor is the theory of consequences. In the treatise of the Perutilis Logica devoted to consequences, Albert often seems to follow Buridan. But whereas Buridan maintained the central role of Aristotelian syllogistic, Albert, like Burley, integrated syllogistic and the study of conversions into the theory of consequences. Consequence is defined as the impossibility of the antecedent's being true without the consequent's also being true -- truth itself being such that howsoever the proposition signifies things to be, so they are. The primary division is between formal and material consequences, the latter being subdivided into consequences simpliciter and ut nunc. A syllogistic consequence is a formal consequence whose antecedent is a conjunction of two quantified propositions and whose consequent is a third quantified proposition. Albert is thus led to present a highly systematized theory of the forms of inference, which represents a major step forward in the medieval theory of logical deduction.

3. Natural Philosophy

It is this analysis of language together with a particularist ontology that places Albert in the tradition of nominalism. This is combined with an epistemological realism that emerges, e.g., in his analysis of the vacuum. In certain respects, Albert's work is a proper extension of physical analysis to imaginary cases. Distinguishing, as Buridan did, between what is absolutely impossible (i.e., the contradictory) and what is impossible “in the common course of nature” (Questions on De Caelo I, qu. 15), he considers hypotheses under circumstances which are not naturally possible but imaginable given God's absolute power (e.g., the existence of a vacuum and the plurality of worlds). However, even if we can imagine a vacuum existing by divine omnipotence, no vacuum can occur naturally (Questions on the Physics IV, qu. 8). Albert refuses to extend the reference of physical terms to supernatural, purely imaginary possibilities. In the same way, one can certainly use the concept of a point, although this would only be an abbreviation of a connotative and negative expression. There is no simple concept of a point, a vacuum, or the infinite, and although imaginary hypotheses provide an interesting detour, physics must in the end provide an account of the natural order of things.

Historically, Albert does not enjoy the reputation in natural philosophy that he does in logic. His commentaries on the Physics and on the treatise De caelo are close to Buridan's, and Albert appeals to the authority of his “revered masters from the Faculty of Arts at Paris” at the beginning of his questions on De caelo. Even so, it should be noted that his Physics was written before the final version of Buridan's Questions on the Physics (between 1355 and 1358), which means that he could not have benefited from the final version of Buridan's lectures.

We have already seen that on the question of the status of the category of quantity, then at the forefront of logic and physics, Albert followed Ockham and distanced himself from Buridan by reducing quantity to a disposition of substance or quality. This move becomes evident in certain physical questions, e.g., in the study of condensation and rarefaction, where Albert openly disagrees with his Parisian master by arguing that condensation and rarefaction are possible only through the local motion of the parts of a body, and without needing to assume some quantity that would have a distinct reality on its own. Nevertheless, he defines the concept of a “lump of matter [materie massa]” without giving it any autonomous reality, although it does help fill in the idea of a ‘quantity of matter’, which Giles of Rome had already distinguished from simple extension.

Similarly, Albert is sometimes seen as standing alongside Ockham on the nature of motion, rejecting the idea of motion as a flux (fluxus), which is the position Buridan had adopted. In contrast to his master, Albert treats locomotion in the same way as alteration (movement according to quality): in neither case is it necessary to imagine local motion as a res successiva distinct from permanent things, at least if the common course of nature holds and one does not take into account the possibility of divine intervention.

As far as the general principles of motion are concerned, Albert, like Nicole Oresme, follows Thomas Bradwardine on the relation of motive force and resistance. On the other hand, when he considers the movement of projectiles, gravitational acceleration, and the movement of celestial bodies, Albert adopts Buridan's major innovation, i.e., the theory of impetus, a quality acquired by a moving body (see Buridan's Questions on the Physics VIII, qu. 13, on projectile motion). Like Buridan, he extends this approach to celestial bodies in his commentary on De caelo, clearly following its consequences in rejecting intelligences as agents of motion and in treating celestial and terrestrial bodies using the same principles. Nevertheless, he formulates the idea of impetus in more classical terms as a virtus impressa (impressed force) and virtus motiva (motive force). Albert makes no pronouncements about the nature of this force. This is a question for the metaphysician. His work also mentions the mean speed theorem, a method of finding the total velocity of a uniformly accelerated (or decelerated) body, which had been stated (without being demonstrated) in Heytesbury's Tractatus de motu, and also adopted by Nicole Oresme. Albert was part of the general scientific trend which sought the first formulations of the principles of dynamics.

As for his commentaries on Aristotle's works of natural philosophy, Albert wrote a Treatise on Proportions that was devoted to the analysis of movement. This was very much inspired by Bradwardine's treatise De proportionibus velocitatum in motibus, and extended the work he and others had begun at Oxford. Albert's texts on the kinematic measure of both rectilinear and circular motion enjoyed a broad popularity. Finally, he explained a number of curious natural phenomena, taking particular interest in earthquakes, tidal phenomena, and geology.

Like his master Buridan, Albert was interested in certain mathematical problems. To this end, he wrote a question on the squaring of the circle as well as questions on John of Sacrobosco's Treatise on the Sphere. In addition to authoritative arguments and purely empirical justifications, his question on the squaring of the circle uses properly mathematical arguments that appeal to both Euclid (in the version of Campanus of Novarra) and Archimedes (translated by Gerard of Cremona). His most original contribution consists in a proposal to dispense with Euclid's proposition X.1, replacing it with a postulate stating that if A is less than B, then there exists a quantity C such that A<B<C.

4. Impact and Influence

Albert of Saxony's teachings on logic and metaphysics were extremely influential. Although Buridan remained the predominant figure in logic, Albert's Perutilis logica was destined to serve as a popular text because of its systematic form and also because of the fact that it takes up and develops essential aspects of the Ockhamist position. But it was his commentary on Aristotle's Physics that was especially widely read. Many manuscripts of it can be found in France and Italy, in Erfurt and Prague. Albert's Physics, more than Oresme's and even Buridan's, basically guaranteed the transmission of the Parisian tradition in Italy, where it was used alongside the works of Heytesbury and John Dumbleton. His commentary on Aristotle's De caelo was also influential, eventually eclipsing Buridan's commentary on this text. Blasius of Parma read it in Bologna between 1379 and 1382. A little later, it enjoyed a wide audience at Vienna.

Albert played an essential role in the diffusion throughout Italy and central Europe of Parisian ideas which bore the mark of Buridan's teachings, but which were also clearly shaped by Albert's comprehensive grasp of English innovations. At the same time, Albert was not merely a compiler of the work of others. He knew how to construct proofs of undeniable originality on many topics in both logic and physics.


Primary Texts

Selected Studies and Critical Discussions

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestion.]

Related Entries

Bradwardine, Thomas | Burley [Burleigh], Walter | Heytesbury, William | Ockham [Occam], William


The author gratefully acknowledges Jack Zupko for translating this entry into English.

Copyright © 2001 by
Joël Biard
Centre d'Études Supérieures de la Renaissance
Université de Tours

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First published: January 29, 2001
Content last modified: January 29, 2001