|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
John Wyclif (ca. 1330-84) was one of the most important and authoritative thinkers of the Middle Ages. His activity is set in the very crucial period of late Scholasticism, when the new ideas and doctrines there propounded accelerated the transition to the modern way of thought. On the one hand, he led a movement of opposition to the medieval Church and to some of its dogmas and institutions, and was a forerunner of the Reformation; on the other, he was also the most prominent English philosopher of the second half of the 14th century. His logical and ontological theories are, at the same time, the final result of the preceding realistic tradition of thought and the starting-point of the new forms of realism at the end of the Middle Ages, since many authors active during the last decades of the 14th and/or the first decades of the 15th centuries (Robert Alyngton, William Penbygull, Johannes Sharpe, William Milverley, Roger Whelpdale, John Tarteys, and Paul of Venice), were heavy influenced by his metaphysics and largely used his logical apparatus. However, his philosophical system, rigorous in its general design, contains unclear and aporetic points that his followers attempted to remove. So, although an influential thinker, Wyclif pointed to the strategy the Realists at the end of the Middle Ages were to adopt, rather than fully developed it.
John Wyclif was born near Richmond (Yorkshire) before 1330 and ordained in 1351. He spent the greater part of his life in the schools at Oxford: he was fellow of Merton in 1356, master of arts at Balliol in 1360, and doctor of divinity in 1372. He definitely left Oxford in 1381 for Lutterworth (Leicestershire), where he died on 31 December, 1384. It was not until 1374 (when he went on a diplomatic mission to Bruges) that Wyclif entered the royal service, but his connection with John of Gaunt, Duke of Lancaster, probably dates back to 1371. His ideas on lordship and church wealth, expressed in De civili dominio (On Civil Dominion), caused in 1377 his first official condemnation by the Pope (Gregory XI), who censured nineteen articles. As has been pointed out (Leff 1967), in 1377-78 Wyclif made a swift progression from unqualified fundamentalism to a heretical view of the Church and its Sacraments. He clearly claimed the supremacy of the king over the priesthood (see for instance his De ecclesia [On the Church], between early 1378 and early 1379), and the simultaneous presence in the Eucharist of the substance of the bread and the body of Christ (De eucharistia [On the Eucharist], and De apostasia [On Apostasy], both ca. 1380). His theses would influence Jan Hus and Jerome of Prague in the 15th century. So long as he limited his attack to abuses and the wealth of the Church, he could rely on the support of a (more or less extended) part of the clergy and aristocracy, but once he dismissed the traditional doctrine of transubstantiation, his (unorthodox) theses could not be defended any more. Thus in 1382 Archbishop Courtenay had twenty-four propositions that were attributed to Wyclif condemned by a council of theologians, and could force Wyclifs followers at Oxford University to retract their views or flee. The Council of Constance (1414-18) condemned Wyclifs writings and ordered his books burned and his body removed from consecrated ground. This last order, confirmed by Pope Martin V, was carried out in 1428.
The most complete biographical study of Wyclif is still the monograph of Workman 1926, but the best analysis of his intellectual development and of the philosophical and thelogical context of his ideas is Robson 1961.
Wyclif produced a very large body of work, both in Latin and English, a great portion of which has been edited by the Wyclif Society between the end of the 19th and the beginning of the 20th centuries, even though some of his most important books are still unpublished -- for instance, his treatises on time (De tempore) and on divine ideas (De ideis). W. R. Thomson 1983 wrote a full bibliography of Wyclifs Latin writings, among which the following can be mentioned: De logica (On Logic -- ca. 1360); De ente in communi (On Universal Being -- ca. 1365); De ente primo in communi (On Primary Being -- ca. 1365); Purgans errores circa universalia in communi (Amending Errors about Universals -- between 1366 and 1368); De ente praedicamentali (On Categorial Being -- ca. 1369); Tractatus de universalibus (Treatise on Universals -- ca. 1368-69 according to Thomson 1983, but between 1373 and 1374 according to Mueller 1985); De materia et forma (On matter and form -- between late 1370 and early 1372 according to Thomson 1983, but about 1374-75 according to Mueller 1985). Many of these treatises were later arranged as a Summa, called Summa de ente (Summa on Being), in two books, containing seven and six treatises respectively. (On the genesis, nature, structure, and tasks of this work see Robson 1961, pp. 115-40.)
Late medieval Nominalists, like Ockham and his followers, drew a distinction between things as they exist in the extra-mental world and the schemata by means of which we think of and talk about them. While the world consists only of two genera of individuals, substances and qualities, the concepts by which they are grasped and expressed are universal and of ten different types. Nor do the relations through which we connect our notions in a proposition analytically correspond to the real links that join individuals in a state of affairs. Thus, our conceptual forms do not coincide with the elements and structures of reality, and our knowledge does not reproduce its objects but merely regards them.
Wyclif maintained that such an approach to philosophical questions was misleading and deleterious. Many times in his works he expressed the deepest hostility to such a tendency. He thought that only on the basis of a close isomorphism between language and the world could the signifying power of terms and statements, the possibility of definitions, and finally the validity and universality of our knowledge be explained and ensured. So the nucleus of his metaphysics lies in his trust in the scheme object-label as the general interpretative key of every logico-epistemological problem. He firmly believed that language was an ordered collection of signs, each referring to one of the constitutive elements of reality, and that true (linguistic) propositions were like pictures of those elements inner structures or/and mutual relationships. From this point of view, universals are conceived of as the real essences common to many individual things, which are necessary conditions for our language to be significant. Wyclif thought that by associating common terms with such universal realities the fact could be accounted for that each common term can stand for many things at once and can label all of them in the same way.
This conviction explains the main characteristic of his philosophical style, to which all his contributions can be traced back: a strong propensity towards hypostatisation. Wyclif methodically replaces logical and epistemological rules with ontological criteria and references. He thought of logic as turning on structural forms, independent of both their semantic contents and the mental acts by which they are grasped. It is through these forms that the network connecting the basic constituents of the world (individuals and universals, substances and accidents, concrete properties, like being-white, and abstract forms, like whiteness) is disclosed to us. His peculiar analysis of predication and his own formulation of the Scotistic formal distinction are logically necessary requirements of this philosophical approach. They are two absolute novelties in late medieval philosophy, and certainly the most important of Wyclifs contributions to the thought of his times.
Wyclifs last formulation of the theory of difference and his theory of universals and predication are linked together, and rest upon a sort of componential analysis where things substitute for lexemes and ontological properties for semantic features. Within Wyclifs world, difference (or distinction) is defined in terms of partial identity, and is the main kind of transcendental relation holding among the worlds objects, since in virtue of its metaphysical composition everything is at the same time partially identical to and different from any other. When the objects at issue are categorial items, and among what differentiates them is their own individual being, the objects differ essentially. If the objects share the same individual being and what differentiates them is (at least) one of their concrete metaphysical components (or features), then the objects differ really, whereas if what differentiates them is one of their abstract metaphysical components, then they differ formally. Formal distinction is therefore the tool by means of which the dialectic of one-many internal to the worlds objects is regulated. It explains why one and the same thing is at the same time an atomic state of affairs and how many different beings can constitute just one thing.
Wyclif explains the notion of formal distinction (or difference) in the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi (chap. 4, p. 38) and in the later Tractatus de universalibus. (On Wyclifs formulation of the formal distinction see Spade 1985, pp. xx-xxxi, and Conti 1997, pp. 158-63.) The two versions differ from each other on some important points, and are both unsatisfactory, since Wyclifs definitions of the different types of distinction are rather ambiguous.
In the Tractatus de universalibus (chap. 4, pp. 90-92), Wyclif lists three main kinds of differences (or distinctions):
The third main kind of difference is the formal one. It is described as the difference by which things differ from each other even though they are constitutive elements of the same single essence or supposit. According to Wyclif, this is the case for:
This account of the various kinds of distinctions is more detailed than that of the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi, but not more clear. What is the difference, for instance, between the definition of the real-but-not-essential distinction and the definition of the formal distinction? What feature do all the kinds of formal distinction agree in? Some points are obvious, however:
Wyclif presents his opinion on universals as intermediate between those ones of St. Thomas (and Giles of Rome) and Walter Burley. Like Giles, whom he quotes by name, Wyclif recognizes three main kinds of universals:
Therefore Wyclif distinguished three main types of predication, which he conceived as a real relation that holds between metaphysical entities. (On Wyclifs theory of predication, see Spade 1985, pp. xxxi-xli, and Conti 1997, pp. 150-58.)
In the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi (chap. 2), the three main types of predication are the following: formal predication, essential predication, and causal predication. In the Tractatus de universalibus (chap. 1, pp. 28-37), causal predication has been replaced by habitudinal predication -- a kind of predication that Wyclif had already recognized in the Purgans errores circa universalia in communi, but whose position within the main division of types of predication was not clear. In the Tractatus de universalibus, formal predication, essential predication, and habitudinal predication are described as three non-exclusive ways of predicating, each more general than the preceding. We speak of causal predication when the form designated by the predicate term is not present in the entity signified by the subject term, but is something caused by that entity. No instances of this kind of predication are given by Wyclif. Formal predication, essential predication, and habitudinal predication are defined in almost the same way in the Purgans errores circa universalia and in the Tractatus de universalibus.
Formal predication is that in which the form designated by the predicate term is directly present in the entity signified by the subject term. This happens whenever an item in the categorial line is predicated of something inferior, or an accident is predicated of its subject of inherence. In fact, in both cases, the subject term and the predicate term refer to the same reality in virtue of the form connoted by the predicate term itself.
To speak of essential predication, it is sufficient that the same empirical reality is both the real subject and the predicate, even though the formal principle connoted by the predicate term differs from that connoted by the subject term. God is man and The universal is particular are instances of this kind of predication. In fact, the same empirical reality (or essence) that is a universal is also an individual, but the forms connoted by the subject term and by the predicate term differ from each other.
Finally we speak of habitudinal predication when the form connoted by the predicate term does not inhere, either directly or indirectly, in the essence designated by the subject, but simply implies a relation to it, so that the same predicate may be at different times truly or falsely spoken of its subject without there being any change in the subject itself. According to Wyclif, we use such a kind of predication mainly when we want to express theological truths, like: God is known and loved by many creatures, and brings about, as efficient, exemplar, and final cause, many good effects. It is evident that habitudinal predication does not require any kind of identity between the entity signified by the subject term and the entity signified by the predicate term, but formal predication and essential predication do. So the ontological presuppositions of the most general type of predication, implied by the other types, are completely different from those of the other two.
The final result of Wyclifs revolution is therefore a not fully developed system of intensional logic, which he superimposes on the standard extensional system inherited from Aristotle. As a result, the copula of the philosophical propositions that are dealt with cannot be extensionally interpreted, since it does not properly mean that a given object is a member of a certain set or that a given set is included in another; rather it means degrees of identity. Only in virtue of renouncing any extensional approach to the matter were Wyclifs followers able to give a logically satisfactory solution of the problem of the relationship between universals and individuals, which had always been the most difficult issue for medieval Realists.
The point of departure for Wyclifs metaphysics is the notion of being, since it occupies the central place in his ontology. After Duns Scotus, the real issue for metaphysics was the relationship between being and, on the other side, God and creatures, as Scotus theory of the univocity of the concept of being was an absolute novelty, full of important consequences for the development of later medieval philosophy. Wyclif takes many aspects from Scotus explanation, but strongly stresses the ontological implications of the doctrine. Wyclif, like Scotus, claims that the notion of being is the most general one, a notion entailed by all others, but he also states that an extra-mental reality corresponds to the concept of being-in-general (ens in communi). This extra-mental reality is predicated of everything (God and creatures, substances and accidents, universal and individual essences) according to different degrees, since God is in the proper sense of the term and any other entity is (something real) only insofar as it shares the being of God (De ente in communi, chap. 1, pp. 1-2; chap. 2, p. 29; De ente praedicamentali, chap. 1, p. 13; chap. 4, p. 30; Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 4, p. 89; chap. 7, p. 130; chap. 12, p. 279; De materia et forma, chap. 6, p. 213).
If being is a reality, it is then clear that it is impossible to affirm its univocity. The Doctor Subtilis thought of being as simply a concept, and therefore could describe it as univocal in a broad sense (one name -- one concept -- many natures). Wyclif, on the contrary, is convinced that the being-in-general is an extra-mental reality, so he works out his theory at a different level than does Scotus: no more at the intensional level (the meaning connected with the univocal sign, or univocum univocans), but at the extensional one (the thing signified by the mental sign, considered as shared by different entities according to different degrees). For that reason, he cannot use Aristotelian univocation, which hides these differences in sharing. Thus he denies the univocity of being and prefers to use one of the traditional notions of analogy (De ente praedicamentali, chap. 3, pp. 25, 27), since the being of God is the measure of the being of other things, which are drawn up on a scale with the separated spiritual substances at the top and prime matter at the bottom. Therefore he qualifies being as an ambiguous genus (ibidem, p. 29), borrowing an expression already used by Grosseteste in his commentary on Aristotles Posterior Analytics. The analogy of being does not entail a multiplicity of correlated meanings, however, as in Thomas Aquinas. Since Wyclif hypostatizes the notion of being and considers equivocity, analogy, and univocity as real relations between things, not as semantic relations between terms and things, his analogy is partially equivalent to the standard Aristotelian univocity, since what differentiates analogy from univocity is the way a certain nature (or property) is shared by a set of things: analogous things (analoga) share it according to different degrees (secundum magis et minus, or secundum prius et posterius), while univocal things (univoca) share it all in the same manner and at the same degree. This is the true sense of his distinction between ambiguous genera, like being and accident (accidens), and logical genera, like substance (De ente praedicamentali, chap. 4, pp. 30, 32). Hence, according to this account, being in general is the basic component of the metaphysical structure of each reality, which posses it in accordance with its own nature, value, and position in the hierarchy of created beings.
Unfortunately, this theory is weak in an important point, since Wyclif does not clarify the relation between being-in-general and God. On the one hand, being is a creature, the first of all the creatures; on the other hand, God should share it, as being-in-general is the most common reality, predicated of all, and according to him to-be-predicated-of something means to-be-shared-by it. As a consequence, a creature would be in some respect superordinated to God -- a theological puzzle that Wyclif failed to acknowledge.
According to Wyclif, the constitutive property of each kind of being is the capacity to be the object of a complex act of signifying (De ente in communi, chap. 3, p. 36; De ente primo in communi, chap. 1, p. 70). This choice implies a revolution in the standard medieval theory of transcendentals, since Wyclif actually replaces being (ens) with true (verum). According to the common belief, among the transcendentals (being, thing, one, something, true, good) being was the primitive notion, from which all the others stemmed by adding a specific connotation in relation to something else, or by adding some new determination. So true (verum) was nothing but being (ens) itself considered in relation to an intellect, no matter whether divine or human. In Wyclifs view, on the contrary, being is no longer the main transcendental and its notion is not the first and simplest; rather there is something more basic to which being can be reduced: truth (veritas or verum). According to the English philosopher, only what can be signified by a complex expression is a being, and whatever is the proper object of an act of signifying is a truth. Truth is therefore the true name of being itself (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 7, p. 139). Thus everything that is is a truth, and every truth is something not simple but complex. Absolute simplicity is unknown within Wyclifs metaphysical world. From the semantic point of view, this means the collapsing of the fundamental distinction in the common Aristotelian theory of meaning, the one between simple signs (like nouns) and compound signs (like propositions). From the ontological point of view, this entails the uniqueness in type of what is signified by every class of categorematic expressions (Logica, chap. 5, p. 14). Within Wyclifs world, it is the same (kind of) object that both concrete terms and propositions refer to, as individual substances have to be regarded as (atomic) states of affairs. According to him, from the metaphysical point of view a singular man is nothing but a real proposition (propositio realis), where actual existence in time as an individual plays the role of the subject, the common nature (i.e., human nature) plays the role of the predicate, and the singular essence (i.e., that by means of which this individual is a man) plays the role of the copula (ibid., pp. 14-15).
Despite appearances, Wyclifs opinion on this subject is not just a new formulation of the theory of the complexe significabile. According to the supporters of the complexe significabile theory, the same things that are signified by simple concrete terms are signified by complex expressions (or propositions). In Wyclifs thought, on the contrary, there are no simple things in the world that correspond to simple concrete terms; rather, simple concrete terms designate real propositions, that is, (atomic) states of affairs. Wyclifs real proposition is everything that is, as everything save God is composed at least of potency and act (De ente praedicamentali, chap. 5, pp. 38-39), and therefore can be conceived of and signified both in a complex (complexe) and in a non-complex manner (incomplexe) (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 2, pp. 55-56; chap. 3, pp. 70, 74, and 84; chap. 6, pp. 118-19). When we conceive of a thing in a complex manner, we think of that thing considered according to its metaphysical structure, and so according to its many levels of being and kinds of essence. As a consequence, Wyclifs metaphysical world, like his physical world, consists of atomic objects, that is, single essences belonging to the ten different types or categories. But these metaphysical atoms are not simple but rather composite, because they are reducible to something else, belonging to a different rank of reality and unable to exist by itself: being and essence, potency and act, matter and form, abstract genera, species and differences. For that reason, everything one can speak about or think of is both a thing and an atomic state of affairs, while every true sentence expresses a molecular state of affairs, that is, the union (if the sentence is affirmative) or the separation (if the sentence is negative) of two (or more) atomic objects.
Among the many kinds of beings Wyclif lists, the most important set is that consisting of categorial beings. They are characterized by the double fact of having a nature and of being the constitutive elements of finite corporeal beings or atomic states of affairs. These categorial items, conceived of as instances of a certain kind of being, are called by Wyclif essences (essentiae). An essence therefore is a being that has a well defined nature, even if the name essence does not make this nature known (De ente primo in communi, chap. 3, pp. 88-89; De ente praedicamentali, chap. 5, p. 43; Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 7, pp. 128-29; De materia et forma, chap. 4, pp. 185-86). So the term essence (essentia) is less general than being (ens), but more general than quiddity (quidditas), since (i) every essence is a being, and not every being is an essence, and (ii) every quiddity is an essence, and not every essence is a quiddity, as individual things are essences but are not quiddities (see Kenny 1985, pp. 21 ff.; and Conti 1993, pp. 171-81).
According to Wyclif, being is the stuff that the ten categories modulate according to their own nature, so that everything is immediately something that is (De ente praedicamentali, chap. 4, p. 30; Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 7, p. 130); therefore, he maintains no real distinction between essence and being. The essences of creatures do not precede their beings, not even causally, since every thing is (identical with) its essence. The being of a thing is brought into existence by God at the same instant as its essence, since essence without being and being without essence would be two self-contradictory states of affairs. In fact, essence without being would imply that an individual could be something of a given type without being real in any way, and being without essence would imply that there could be the existence of a thing without the thing itself (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 6, pp. 122-23). As a consequence, the pars destruens of his theory of being and essence is a strong refutation of the twin opinions of St. Thomas and Giles of Rome. Although Wyclif does not name either the Dominican master or the Augustinian one, it is nevertheless clear from the context that their conceptions are the object of his criticisms (ibid., pp. 120-22).
On the other hand, it is evident that while from the extensional point of view the being and essence of creatures are equipollent, since every being is an essence and vice versa, from the intensional point of view there is a difference, because the being of a thing logically presupposes its essence and not vice versa (De materia et forma, chap. 4, pp. 184-85). Moreover, in Wyclifs opinion, every creature has two different kinds of essence and four levels of being. Indeed, he clearly distinguishes between singular essence and universal essence (essentia quidditativa speciei vel generis) -- that is, the traditional forma partis and forma totius. The singular essence is the form that in union with the matter brings about the substantial composite. The universal essence is the type that the former instantiates; it is present in the singular substance as a constitutive part of its nature, and it discloses the inner metaphysical structure of the substantial composite (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 6, pp. 116-18). Furthermore, he speaks of four-fold level of reality (esse):
According to St. Thomas (see In I Sent., d. 19, q. 5; d. 36, qq. 1-2; and STh. I, qq. 14-15) -- whose doctrine of divine ideas can be considered a perfect background for a better understanding of Wyclifs theory -- divine ideas are really the same as the divine essence, but distinct in reason from it. Everything produced by God has a certain similarity with the divine essence, since divine ideas are the ways in which God views His essence as capable of being imitated by a possible creature. When a given possible creature is brought into existence by the divine volition, the divine idea that is its corresponding paradigm also serves as a principle of divine creation and becomes therefore an exemplar in the strict sense of the term. As a consequence, according to Aquinas, there is a difference between a divine idea as a mere principle of knowledge (ratio) by means of which God thinks of a given possible and a divine idea as an exemplar by means of which God produces a certain set of individuals. This difference prevents Aquinas system from being a form of necessitarism, as the two spheres of existent and possible do not coincide, since the existent is a sub-set of the possible.
Wyclif defines ideas as the divine nature in action, since they are the means by which God creates all that is outside Himself. In this way, any distinction between the ideas as rationes and the ideas as exemplaria is abolished. Furthermore, ideas are the constitutive principles of the divine nature, essentially identical with it. Thus divine ideas become as necessary as the divine nature itself (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 15, pp. 371-74). On the other side, ideas are the first level of being proper to creatures (see above Section 3.3). As a consequence, everything that is is necessary and a necessary object of Gods volition; the three spheres of possible, existent, and necessary totally coincide.
This doctrine of divine ideas and the connected theory of being had a significant result also for the notion of divine omnipotence. In the Middle Ages, one of the most important features of divine omnipotence was the capacity of annihilating, which was viewed as the necessary counterpart of the divine capacity of creating. Wyclif denies the thesis of an opposition between creation and annihilation, and openly denies that God can annihilate creatures. He argues that nothing is contrary to creation, since the act of creating is peculiar to God, and nothing is opposite or contrary to God. In fact, absolute non-being (the only "thing" that could be considered opposite to God) is something self-contradictory, and therefore logically impossible. Accordingly, there cannot be any action opposite to creation. The only possible kind of non-being admitted by Wyclif is corruption (corruptio), that is, the natural destruction of the actual existence in time of an object in the world (Tractatus de universalibus, chap. 13, pp. 302-3).
On the other hand, according to Wyclif, annihilation, if possible, would be equivalent to the total destruction of all of a creatures levels of being (ibid., p. 307), and thus would imply the following absurdities:
Wyclifs rejection of the possibility of annihilation and the subsequent new notion of divine onnipotence shed light on his theory of universals, as they help us to appreciate the difference between his thesis of the identity between universals and individuals and the analogous thesis of moderate Realists. For these latter, this identiy meant that the individuals are in potentia universal; for Wyclif it means that the individuals are the universals qua existing in actu -- that is, the individuals are the outcome of a process of production that is inscribed into the nature of general essences themselves, and through which general essences change from an incomplete type of subsistence as forms to a full existence as individuals. This position is consistent with (i) his theory of substance, where the main and basic composition of every substance, both individual and universal, is not the hylemorphic one, but the composition of potency and act (De ente praedicamentali, chap. 5, pp. 38-39), and (ii) a Neoplatonic reading of Aristotelian metaphysics, where universal substances, and not individual ones as the Stagirite had taught, are the main and fundamental kind of being.
Wyclifs heretical theses concerning the Eucharist are the logical consequence of the application of this philosophical apparatus to the problem of the real presence of the body of Christ in the consecrated host. According to Catholic doctrine, after consecration the body of Christ is really present in the host instead of the substance of the host itself, while the accidents of the host are the same as before. St. Thomass explanation of this process, called transubstantiation, was that the substance of the bread (and wine) was changed into the body (and blood) of Christ, whereas its quantity, through which the substance of the bread received physical extension and the other accidental forms, was now the entity that kept the other accidental forms physically in being. Duns Scotus and Ockham, on the contrary, had claimed that after consecration the substance of the bread (and wine) was annihilated by God, while the accidents of the bread (and wine) remained the same as before because of an intervention of divine omnipotence.
Wyclif rejects both solutions as well as the Catholic formulation of the dogma, since he could not accept the ideas of the destruction of a substance by God and of the existence of the accidents of a given singular substance without and apart from that singular substance itself -- two evident absurdities within the metaphyisical framework of his system of thought. As a consequence, Wyclif affirms the simultaneous presence in the Eucharist of the body of Crhist and of the substance of the bread (and wine), which continues to exist even after the consecration. According to him, transubstantiation is therefore a twofold process, natural and supernatural. There is natural transubstantiation when a substitution of one substantial form for another takes place, but the subject-matter remains the same. This is the case with water that becomes wine. There is supernatural transubstantiation when a miraculous transformation of the substantial entity at issue takes place. This was the case, for instance, with the incarnation of the second person of the Trinity, who is God and became man (De apostasia, p. 170). The Eucharist implies this second kind of transubstantiation, since the Eucharist, like Christ, has a dual nature: earthly and divine. According to its earthly nature the Eucharist is bread (and wine), but according to its divine nature it is the body of Christ, which is present in the host spiritually or habitudinnaly, since it is in virtue and by means of faith only that it could be received (De apostasia, pp. 180 and 210; De eucharistia, pp. 17, 19, 51-52, and 230; for a description of the habitudinal presence, see the definition of the habitudinal predication above, Section 2.3).
Wyclif conceives Sacred Scripture as a direct emanation from God himself, and therefore as a timeless, unchanging, and archetypal truth independent of the present world and of the concrete material text by means of which it is manifested. As a consequence, in his De veritate Sacrae Scripturae (On the Truth of Sacred Scripture -- between late 1377 and the end of 1378) he tries to show that, despite appearences, the Bible is free from error and contradictions. The exegetic principle he adopts is the following: since the authority of Scripture is greater than our capacity of understanding, therefore if some error and/or inconsistencies are found in the Bible, there is something wrong with our interpretation. The Bible contains the whole truth and nothing but the truth, so that nothing can be added to it or subtracted from it. Every part of it has to be taken absolutely and without qualification (De veritate Sacrae Scripturae, vol. 1, pp. 1-2, 395, 399; vol. 2, pp. 99, 181-84).
In attributing inerrancy to the Bible, Wyclif was following the traditional attitude towards it, but the way he viewed the book detached him from Catholic tradition, as he thought that his own metaphysical system was the necessary interpretative key for the correct understanding of Biblical truth. In fact, in the Trialogus (Trialogue -- between late 1382 and early 1383), where Wyclif gives us the conditions for achieving the true meaning of the Bible, they are the following:
This same approach, when applied to the Church, led Wyclif to fight against it in its contemporary state. (On Wyclifs ecclesiology see Leff 1967, pp. 516-46.) The starting point of Wyclifs reflection on the Church is the distinction between the heavenly and the earthly cities that St. Augustine draws in his De civitate Dei. In St. Augustine such a division is metaphorical, but Wyclif made it literal. So he claims that the Holy Catholic Church is the mystical and indivisible community of the saved, eternally bound together by the grace of predestination, while the foreknown, i.e. the damned, are eternally excluded from it (De civili dominio, vol. 1, p. 11). This community of the elect is really distinct from the various particular earthly churches (ibid., p. 381). It is timeless and outside space, and therefore is not a physical entity; its being, like the actual being of any other universal, is wherever any of its members is (De ecclesia, p. 99). All its members always remain in grace, even if temporally in mortal sin (ibid., p. 409), as conversely the damned remain in mortal sin, even if temporally in grace (ibid., p. 139). The true Church is presently divided into three parts: the triumphant Church in heaven; the sleeping Church in purgatory; and the militant Church on earth (ibid., p. 8). But the militant Church on earth cannot be identified with the visible church and its hierarchy. Even more, since we cannot know who are the elect, there is no reason for consenting to recognize and obey the authority of the visible church (see De civili dominio, vol. 1, p. 409; De ecclesia, pp. 71-2). Authority and dominion rely on Gods law manifested by Sacred Scripture. As a consequence, obedience to any member of the hierarchy is to be subordinated to his fidelity to the precepts of the Bible (De civili dominio, vol. 2, p. 243; De potestate papae [On the Power of the Pope -- ca. 1379], p. 149; De ecclesia, p. 465). Faithfulness to the true Church can entail the necessity of rebelling against the visible church and its members, when their requests are in conflict with the teaching of Christ (De civili dominio, vol. 1, pp. 384, 392).
In conclusion, since the visible church cannot help the believers gain salvation, which is fixed from eternity, and its authority depends on its fidelity to divine revelation, it cannot perform any of the functions traditionally attributed to it, and it therefore has no reason for its own existence. To be ordained a priest offers no certainty of divine approval and authority (De ecclesia, p. 577). Orthodoxy can only result from the application of right reason to the faith of the Bible (De veritate Sacrae Scripturae, vol. 1, p. 249). The Pope, bishops, abbots, and priests are expected to prove their really belonging to the Holy Catholic Church through their exemplary behavior; they should be poor and free from worldly concerns, and they should spend their time preaching and praying (De ecclesia, pp. 41, 89, 129). In particular, the Pope should not interfere in worldly matters, but should be an example of holiness. Believers are always allowed to doubt the clergys legitimacy, which can be evaluated only on the basis of its consistency with the Evangelic rules (ibid., pp. 43, 456). Unworthy priests forfeit their right to exercise authority and to hold property, and lay lords might deprive them of their benefices (De civili dominio, vol. 1, p. 353; vol. 3, pp. 326, 413; De ecclesia, p. 257).
As Leff remarked (Leff 1967, p. 546), the importance of Wyclifs teaching on dominion and grace has been exaggerated. His doctrine depends on Richard Fitzralphs theory, according to which the original lordship is independent of natural and civil circumstances (on Fitzralphs conception see Robson 1961, pp. 70-96), and is only a particular application of Wyclifs general view on election and damnation. In fact, the three main theses of the first book of his De civili dominio are the following:
Table of Contents
First published: September 18, 2001
Content last modified: December 12, 2001