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There is wide agreement that a term is vague to the extent that it has borderline cases. This makes the notion of a borderline case crucial in accounts of vagueness. I shall limit myself to a characterization of borderline cases that most commentators would accept. This consensus breaks down profoundly when we press for details on the nature of borderline cases. Many philosophers think that borderline cases can only be properly characterized by abandoning standard logic. These applications of deviant logic would require detailed treatment of the sorites paradox. I shall instead strive for a theory-neutral comparison between vagueness and two other notions that concern multiplicity of meaning: ambiguity and generality. After then explaining why vagueness poses a special philosophical challenge, there will be final remarks on the issue of whether vagueness is a purely linguistic phenomenon.

Inquiry Resistance

If you cut one head off of a two headed man, have you decapitated him? What is the maximum height of a short man? When does a fertilized egg develop into a person?

These questions are impossible to answer because they involve borderline cases. When a term is applied to one of its borderline cases the result is a statement that resists all attempts to settle whether it is true or false. No amount of conceptual analysis or empirical inquiry can settle whether removing one head from a two headed man counts as decapitating him. We could give the appearance of settling the matter by stipulating that ‘decapitate’ means ‘remove a head’ (as opposed to ‘make headless’ or ‘remove the head’ or ‘remove the most important head’). But that would amount to changing the topic to an issue that merely sounds the same as decapitation.

Vagueness is standardly defined as the possession of borderline cases. For example, ‘tall’ is vague because a man of 1.8 meters in height is neither clearly tall nor clearly non-tall. No amount of conceptual analysis or empirical investigation can settle whether a 1.8 meter man is tall. Borderline cases are inquiry resistant. Indeed, the inquiry resistance typically recurses. For in addition to the unclarity of the borderline case, there is normally unclarity as to where the unclarity begins. In other words ‘borderline case’ has borderline cases. This higher order vagueness shows that ‘vague’ is vague.

Comparison with Ambiguity and Generality

‘Tall’ is relative. A 1.8 meter pygmy is tall for a pygmy but a 1.8 meter Masai is not tall for a Masai. Although relativization disambiguates, it does not eliminate borderline cases. There are shorter pygmies who are borderline tall for a pygmy and taller Masai who are borderline tall for a Masai. The direct bearers of vagueness are a word’s full disambiguations such as ‘tall for a twentieth century American man’. Words are only vague indirectly, by virtue of having a sense that is vague. In contrast, an ambiguous word has it ambiguity directly -- simply in virtue of having multiple meanings.

This contrast between vagueness and ambiguity is obscured by the fact that most words are both vague and ambiguous. ‘Child’ is ambiguous between ‘offspring’ and ‘immature offspring’. The latter reading of ‘child’ is vague because there are borderline cases of immature offspring. The contrast is further complicated by the fact that most words are also general. For instance, ‘child’ covers both boys and girls.

Generality is obviously useful. If uncertain whether someone is 35, I can hedge by describing him as ‘thirty-something’. There is an inverse relationship between the contentfulness of a proposition and its probability: the more specific a claim, the less likely it is to be true. By gauging generality, we can make sensible trade-offs between truth and detail. ‘Vague’ has a sense which is synonymous with generality. This precipitates many equivocal explanations of vagueness. For instance, many commentators say that vagueness exists because broad categories ease the task of classification. If I can describe your sweater as red, then I do not need to figure out whether it is scarlet. This freedom to use wide intervals obviously helps us to learn, teach, communicate, and remember. But so what? The problem is to explain the existence of borderline cases.

The existence of vagueness and ambiguity is much more difficult to explain than generality. Every natural language is both vague and ambiguous. However, both features seem eliminable. Indeed, both are eliminated in miniature languages such as chess notation, programming languages, and mathematical descriptions. Moreover, it seems that both vagueness and ambiguity ought to be minimized. ‘Vague’ and ‘ambiguous’ are pejorative terms. And they seem to deserve their bad reputations. Think of all the automotive misery that has been prefaced by

Driver: Do I turn left?
Passenger: Right.
Philosophers have long motivated appeals for an ideal language by pointing out how ambiguity creates the menace of equivocation:
No child should work.
Every person is a child of someone.
Therefore, no one should work.
Happily, we know how to criticize and correct all equivocations. Indeed, every natural language is self-disambiguating in the sense that each has all the resources needed to uniquely specify any reading one desires. Any mystery posed by an ambiguous sentence can be solved with a clarificatory paraphrase.

The Philosophical Challenge Posed By Vagueness

Vagueness, in contrast, precipitates a profound problem: the sorites paradox. For instance,
A one day year old human being is a child.
If an n day old human being is a child, then it is also a child when it is n + 1 days old.
Therefore, a 36,500 day old human being is a child.
The conclusion is false because a 100 year old human being is clearly a non-child. Since the first premise of the argument is also plainly true and the argument is valid by mathematical induction, we seem to have no choice but to reject the second premise. However, the negation of the second premise would commit us to a sharp threshold for childhood; there would be a value for n at which an n day old is a child but an n + 1 day old is not.

Epistemicists (Williamson 1994) accept this astonishing consequence. They think vagueness is a form of ignorance. Most philosophers believe that this is tantamount to the acceptance of a linguistic miracle. They boggle at the possibility that our rough and ready terms such as ‘child’ and ‘heap’ could so sensitively classify objects. Most of them would prefer to change the classical logic that validates the sorites. Every form of deviant logic has been applied in the hope of resolving the sorites paradox: fuzzy logic, intuitionism, paraconsistent logic, supervaluationism, etc. Overlapping these logic reformers are metaphysicians who think that the sorites can be resolved by acknowledging that objects themselves are vague.

Is All Vagueness Linguistic?

There used to be a consensus that believers in vague objects were committing the fallacy of verbalism -- inferring that an object has the property that its representation has. However, a minority of philosophers now believe that there are vague objects (clouds, the sky, perhaps even entities of quantum physics). For instance, Peter van Inwagen (1990) is heartened by the history of modal logic. He recalls that thirty years ago, there was a consensus that all necessity is linguistic. However, now most philosophers take the possibility of essential properties seriously.

The view that vagueness is always linguistic has been attacked from other directions. Mental imagery seems vague. When rising suddenly after a prolong crouch, I "see stars before my eyes". I can tell there are more than ten of these hallucinated lights but I cannot tell how many. Is this indeterminacy in thought to be reduced to indeterminacy in language? Why not vice versa?

Another possible challenge comes from cardinality mis-matches. Natural languages must have finite vocabularies and finite rules to be learnable. The number of potential sentences in such a finitary language is infinite. But the order of infinity is low, just aleph-0. In contrast, the number of arithmetic truths is far greater. For instance, the power set of the set of all the natural numbers contains uncountably many sets. For each of these sets, either 0 is a member of the set or not. So there are uncountably many precise propositions. Similarly, for each set, either the set contains only small numbers or not. So there are also uncountably many vague propositions. Since there are only countably many vague sentences, there cannot be a vague sentence for each vague proposition.

Given that propositions themselves are vague, logicians will not be able to blame vagueness on linguistic laziness. Logicians can insist that sentences be disambiguated prior to the application of their rules of inference. But vagueness cannot be screened away.


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ambiguity | Sorites paradox

Copyright © 1997 by
Roy Sorensen

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First published: February 8, 1997
Content last modified: February 16, 1997