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(L) Sentence (L) is not true.Sentence (L) says of itself that it is not true. A contradiction can be derived from (L) from apparently trivial principles. One basic intuition about truth needed is that a sentence is true if and only if what it asserts is the case. For example, the sentence "there is gold on the moon" is true if and only if there is gold on the moon. Applying this principle in the particular case of sentence (L) results in:
(1) Sentence (L) is true if and only if sentence (L) is not true.Notice that sentence (L) asserts precisely that it is not true. So by the principle just mentioned it is true if and only if it is not true.
Another principle needed to obtain an explicit contradiction is the following:
(2) Sentence (L) is either true or not.Sentence (1) may already appear to be obviously contradictory. If not, a contradiction can be quickly derived using (2) by breaking into the two cases it allows: that (L) is true, or that (L) is not.
Case 1. Sentence (L) is true. Then by (1) sentence (L) is not true. So it is both true and not true, which is impossible.
Case 2. Sentence (L) is not true. Then by (1) sentence (L) is true. Again it is both true and not true, which is impossible.
So either of the two cases is seen to be impossible by applying (1). This seems to imply that at least one of these basic intuitions expressed in (1) and (2) is wrong.
S is true if and only if POne way of forming names of sentences is by quotation, so that if the sentence in question is "there is gold on the moon," the Tarski biconditional for the sentence is:
"there is gold on the moon" is true if and only if there is gold on the moon.Another method of giving names to sentences is by Goedel numbering, assigning numbers to sentences in some typically systematic fashion.
While the Tarski biconditionals seem to be quite trivial, they are seen to lead to blatant contradictions when applied to sentences such as the liar sentence.
According to the revision theory, while the Tarski biconditionals give the meaning of truth, special semantical tools are needed to show how they generate the concept of truth. In particular, the theory accepts that truth is a circular concept, and provides special tools for understanding circular concepts such as truth. Thus, the reasoning above that resulted in a contradiction from would be seen as misapplying the information expressed in (1), the Tarski biconditional for the liar sentence.
On the revision theory, Tarski biconditionals such as (1) should be understood as having a hypothetical character. While they entirely define the concept of truth, they do so only in virtue of the special role given to them by the revision theory. In particular, the biconditionals are seen as providing a method for obtaining better and better approximations of the extension of the truth predicate. Thus, they do not simply provide the extension of the truth predicate, but provide an improvement on any temporary extension that might be suggested.
Thus, let M be an ordinary first-order model that also gives an arbitrary extension to the truth predicate. The Tarski biconditionals provide a method for obtaining an improved model M*. Namely, for any sentence P having name S, S is assigned to the extension of the truth predicate in M* if P evaluates as true in M, and not assigned to the extension of truth otherwise. Thus, given any model M with any initial extension to the truth predicate, the biconditionals generate a series of models M*, M**, M***, etc., that are constructed using the biconditionals by evaluating sentences in the previous member of the series.
The series is also extended into the transfinite by collecting together the results from earlier stages at limit ordinals. One method of doing this is, at a limit stage, letting the extension of truth at the limit stage consist of all (names of) sentences that have stabilized as the sequence approached the limit. That is, if at some stage in the sequence a sentence is declared true at every subsequent stage below the limit stage, then put it in the extension of truth at the limit. Many other reasonable limit rules are possible here.
A "revision sequence" is any sequence of models beginning with an arbitrary model M that is generated by the Tarski bicondionals according to the revision theory of truth.
Some sentences will stabilize eventually in every revision sequence. For example, where "T" is the truth predicate, let S be the name of the sentence "T(T(F(b)))" where "F" is an arbitrary one-place predicate and "b" is an arbitrary name.
Let M(T) represent the extension assigned to T by M. Then S is in M**(T) if and only if "T(F(b))" is in M*(T). But "T(F(b))" is in M*(T) if and only if "F(b)" is in M(T). Thus, S is in M**(T) if and only if "F(b)" is in M(T), that is, if and only if b is in M(F). Likewise, from the second revision onwards, S is assigned to the extension of truth if and only if b is in the extension of the predicate F. So beginning with any model M the sentence S stabilizes as either true or false in every revision sequence depending on whether "F(b)" is evaluated as either true or false in the original model M.
Intuitively "normal" sentences stabilize in every sequence. Sentences such as the liar sentence exhibit unusual behavior in the framework of the revision theory. For example, the liar sentence alternates between true and false at successive revisions in every revision sequence. Hence it exhibits extremely unstable behavior.
Many other classifications of sentences with respect to their behavior over various revision sequences are possible. Some will stabilize as false in all sequences. Some will stabilize as true in some but not all sequences. Some will stabilize as true in some sequences and false in the rest. This apparatus provides tools for fine-grained classifications of various types of sentences into different semantical categories.
Because the theory deals with sequences of classical models, every logical truth will stabilize as true in every sequence and every logical falsehood as false in every sequence. Hence one of the advantages often claimed for the revision theory is that it supports classical reasoning in contrast to various other approaches to truth.
Along with other recent theories of truth, the revision theory has the feature that given any revision, eventually a stage will be reached at which every sentence that will ever stabilize as true or as false in the sequence has already stabilized.
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First published: December 15, 1995
Content last modified: January 2, 1996