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The Identity Theory of Truth

The simplest and most general statement of the identity theory of truth is that when a truth-bearer (e.g. a proposition) is true, there is a truth-maker (e.g. a fact) with which it is identical and the truth of the former consists in its identity with the latter. The theory is best understood by contrast with a rival such as the correspondence theory, according to which the relation of truth-bearer to truth-maker is correspondence rather than identity.

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The theory is a response to certain intellectual pressures. One such pressure is the wish that there should be no gap between mind and world: that when we think truly, we think what is the case. Another is dissatisfaction with the correspondence theory of truth, of the sort expressed by Frege [Frege (1918), p. 3]:
A correspondence, moreover, can only be perfect if the corresponding things coincide and so are just not different things. ... It would only be possible to compare an idea with a thing if the thing were an idea too. And then, if the first did correspond perfectly with the second, they would coincide. But this is not at all what people intend when they define truth as the correspondence of an idea with something real. For in this case it is essential precisely that the reality shall be distinct from the idea. But then there can be no complete correspondence, no complete truth. So nothing at all would be true; for what is only half true is untrue. Truth does not admit of more and less.
Frege then goes on to deploy a charge of circularity against the likely reply that all the correspondence theory requires is correspondence in a certain respect. He himself concluded that truth was indefinable; but some have thought it possible to formulate an identity theory of a recognizably Fregean sort.

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A Genuine Theory?

This theory is notably absent from textbook discussions of truth; and there is controversy over whether it is a theory of truth at all. Those who think that it is not are likely to make one or both of the following objections: it is obviously absurd; no one has ever held it. The remainder of this section is devoted to considering these two objections.

Can the absurdity charge be met?

The identity theory is clearly absurd from the point of view of those who, for instance, believe that truth-bearers are sentences and truth-makers non-linguistic states of affairs. But it may be available to those who hold the kinds of metaphysical views which make truth-bearers and truth-makers more alike. (For ease of expression, I shall from now on use the vocabulary of ‘judgments’ and ‘facts’ for truth-bearers and truth-makers respectively, recognizing that these terms can be tendentious -- especially in expressing the views of philosophers who abjured them.)

Making judgments more like facts

Some philosophers have tried to make judgments more like facts. Russell, reacting against idealism, at one stage adopted a view of judgment which did not regard it as an intermediary between the mind and the world: instead, the constituents of judgments are the very things the judgments are about. This involves a kind of realism about judgments, and looks as though it offers the possibility of an identity theory of truth. But since both true and false judgments are equally composed of real constituents, truth would not be distinguished from falsehood by being identical with reality; an identity theory of truth is thus unavailable on this view of judgment because it would be rendered vacuous by being inevitably accompanied by an identity theory of falsehood. Those who have held this sort of view of judgments, such as Moore and Russell, have accordingly been forced to hold that truth is an unanalyzable property of some judgments. If one looks for an identity theory here, one finds what might be called an identity theory of judgment rather than of truth. [Less brutally condensed accounts of these matters can be found in Baldwin (1991), Candlish (1989) and Candlish (1996).]

Making facts more like judgments

Other philosophers, notably those who have held the idealist view that reality is experience, have implied that facts are more like judgments. One such is F.H. Bradley, who explicitly embraced an identity theory of truth, regarding it as the only account capable of resolving the difficulties he finds with the correspondence theory. [See Bradley (1907).] The way he reaches it is worth describing in a little detail, for it shows how he could avoid allowing the theory to be rendered vacuous by an accompanying identity theory of falsehood.

Bradley argues that the correspondence theory’s view of facts as real and mutually independent entities is unsustainable: the impression of their independent existence is the outcome of the illegitimate projection on to the world of the divisions with which thought must work, a projection which creates the illusion that a judgment can be true by corresponding to part of a situation: as, e.g., the remark ‘The pie is in the oven’ might appear to be true despite its (by omission) detaching the pie from its dish and the oven from the kitchen. His hostility to such abstraction ensures that, according to Bradley’s philosophical logic, at most one judgment can be true -- that which encapsulates reality in its entirety. This allows his identity theory of truth to be accompanied by a non-identity theory of falsehood, since he can account for falsehood as a falling short of this vast judgment and hence as an abstraction of part of reality from the whole. The result is his adoption of the idea that there are degrees of truth: that judgment is the least true which is the most distant from the whole of reality. Although the consequence is that all ordinary judgments will turn out to be more or less infected by falsehood, Bradley allows some sort of place for false judgment and the possibility of distinguishing worse from better. One might argue that the reason the identity theory of truth remains only latent in Russell and Moore is the surrounding combination of their atomistic metaphysics and their assumption that truth is not a matter of degree.

For Bradley, then, at most one judgment can be fully true. But even this one judgment has so far been conceived as describing reality, and its truth as consisting in correspondence with a reality not distorted by being mentally cut up into illusory fragments. Accordingly, even this one, for the very reason that it remains a description, will be infected by falsehood unless it ceases altogether to be a judgment and becomes the reality it is meant to be about. This apparently bizarre claim becomes intelligible if seen as both the most extreme expression of his hostility to abstraction and a reaction to the most fundamental of his objections to the correspondence theory, which is the same as Frege’s: that for there to be correspondence rather than identity between judgment and reality, the judgment must differ from reality and in so far as it does differ, to that extent must distort and so falsify it.

Thus Bradley’s version of the identity theory turns out to be misleadingly so-called. For it is in fact an eliminativist theory: when truth is attained, judgments disappear and only reality is left. It is not surprising that Bradley, despite expressing his theory in the language of identity, talked of the attainment of complete truth in terms of thought’s suicide. In the end, then, even the attribution of the identity theory of truth to one who explicitly endorsed it turns out to be dubious. [For a more detailed version of this section, see Candlish (1995). For other doubts about whether Bradley was an identity theorist, see Walker (1998).]

A metaphysically neutral identity theory

More recently there have been attempts, consciously taking inspiration from Frege, to defend a metaphysically neutral version of the theory: holding that truth-bearers are the contents of thoughts, and that facts are simply true thoughts rather than the metaphysically weighty sorts of things envisaged in correspondence theories. That is, the identity is not conceived as a (potentially troublesome) relation between an apparently mind-dependent judgment and an apparently mind-independent fact. A claimed benefit of this version is that it is not immediately disabled by the inevitable accompaniment of an identity theory of falsehood. The difficulty for these attempts is to make out the claim that they involve a theory of truth at all, since they lack independent accounts of truth-bearer and truth-maker to give the theory substance. One way of trying to overcome this difficulty is by urging that we can properly lower our expectations of philosophical theories. [See Candlish (1995), Dodd and Hornsby (1992), Dodd (1996), Hornsby (1997).]

Can the no-holder charge be met?

Although it is difficult to find a completely uncontroversial attribution of the identity theory, there is evidence of its presence in the thought of a few major philosophers. Frege and Bradley have already been mentioned. Bolzano and Meinong are other possibilities: Findlay, for example, believes Meinong to have held an identity theory, reminding us that on his view, there are no entities between our minds and the facts; facts themselves are true in so far as they are the objects of judgments. [See Findlay (1933), Ch. III sec. ix.] C.A. Baylis defended a similar account of truth in 1948, and Roderick Chisholm endorsed a recognizably Meinongian account in his Theory of Knowledge. A sketchy version of the theory is embraced in Woozley’s Theory of Knowledge. There are also the attempts, already mentioned, to establish a metaphysically neutral version: these show that there can be no doubt that some philosophers have tried to defend something that they wished to call an identity theory of truth.

Thomas Baldwin argues that the identity theory of truth, though itself indefensible, has played an influential but subterranean role within philosophy from the nineteenth century onwards, citing as examples philosophers of widely different convictions. [See Baldwin (1991). One of his attributions is queried in Stern (1993), others in Candlish (1995).] Whether or not Baldwin is right -- and it is possible that the theory is no more than an historical curiosity -- the identity theory of truth may turn out to be best thought of as comparable to solipsism: rarely, if ever, consciously held, but the inevitable result of thinking out the most extreme consequences of assumptions which philosophers often just take for granted.

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In each case, the date shown immediately after the author’s name is the date of original publication. A separate date is shown for the edition cited only where this differs from the original.

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Related Entries

Bradley, Francis Herbert | facts | Frege, Gottlob | Meinong, Alexius | Moore, George Edward | propositions | Russell, Bertrand | truth: coherence theory of | truth: correspondence theory of | truth: deflationary theory of | truth: revision theory of

Copyright © 1996, 2001 by
Stewart Candlish

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First published: March 28, 1996
Content last modified: January 24, 2001