Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
The Identity Theory of Truth
The simplest and most general statement of the identity theory of
truth is that when a truth-bearer (e.g. a proposition) is
true, there is a truth-maker (e.g. a fact) with which it is identical
and the truth of the former consists in its identity with the
latter. The theory is best understood by contrast with a rival such
as the correspondence theory, according to which the relation of
truth-bearer to truth-maker is correspondence rather than identity.
The theory is a response to certain intellectual pressures. One such
pressure is the wish that there should be no gap between mind and
world: that when we think truly, we think what is the case.
Another is dissatisfaction with the correspondence theory of truth, of
the sort expressed by Frege [Frege (1918), p. 3]:
A correspondence, moreover, can only be perfect if the corresponding
things coincide and so are just not different things. ... It would
only be possible to compare an idea with a thing if the thing were an
idea too. And then, if the first did correspond perfectly with the
second, they would coincide. But this is not at all what people intend
when they define truth as the correspondence of an idea with something
real. For in this case it is essential precisely that the reality
shall be distinct from the idea. But then there can be no complete
correspondence, no complete truth. So nothing at all would be true;
for what is only half true is untrue. Truth does not admit of more and
Frege then goes on to deploy a charge of circularity against the
likely reply that all the correspondence theory requires is
correspondence in a certain respect. He himself concluded that truth
was indefinable; but some have thought it possible to formulate an
identity theory of a recognizably Fregean sort.
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This theory is notably absent from textbook discussions of truth; and
there is controversy over whether it is a theory of truth at all.
Those who think that it is not are likely to make one or both of the
following objections: it is obviously absurd; no one has ever held it.
The remainder of this section is devoted to considering these two
Can the absurdity charge be met?
The identity theory is clearly absurd from the point of view of those who,
for instance, believe that truth-bearers are sentences and truth-makers
non-linguistic states of affairs. But it may be available to those who
hold the kinds of metaphysical views which make truth-bearers and
truth-makers more alike. (For ease of expression, I shall from now on use
the vocabulary of judgments and facts for truth-bearers and
truth-makers respectively, recognizing that these terms can be tendentious
-- especially in expressing the views of philosophers who abjured them.)
Making judgments more like facts
Some philosophers have tried to make judgments more like facts.
Russell, reacting against idealism, at one stage adopted a view of
judgment which did not regard it as an intermediary between the mind
and the world: instead, the constituents of judgments are the very
things the judgments are about. This involves a kind of realism about
judgments, and looks as though it offers the possibility of an
identity theory of truth. But since both true and false judgments are
equally composed of real constituents, truth would not be
distinguished from falsehood by being identical with reality; an
identity theory of truth is thus unavailable on this view of judgment
because it would be rendered vacuous by being inevitably accompanied
by an identity theory of falsehood. Those who have held this sort of
view of judgments, such as Moore and Russell, have accordingly been
forced to hold that truth is an unanalyzable property of some
judgments. If one looks for an identity theory here, one finds what
might be called an identity theory of judgment rather than of truth.
[Less brutally condensed accounts of these matters can be found in
Baldwin (1991), Candlish (1989) and Candlish (1996).]
Making facts more like judgments
Other philosophers, notably those who have held the idealist view that
reality is experience, have implied that facts are more like
judgments. One such is F.H. Bradley, who explicitly embraced an
identity theory of truth, regarding it as the only account capable of
resolving the difficulties he finds with the correspondence theory.
[See Bradley (1907).] The way he reaches it is worth describing in a
little detail, for it shows how he could avoid allowing the theory to
be rendered vacuous by an accompanying identity theory of falsehood.
Bradley argues that the correspondence theorys view of facts as real
and mutually independent entities is unsustainable: the impression of
their independent existence is the outcome of the illegitimate
projection on to the world of the divisions with which thought must
work, a projection which creates the illusion that a judgment can be
true by corresponding to part of a situation: as, e.g., the remark
The pie is in the oven might appear to be true despite its (by
omission) detaching the pie from its dish and the oven from the
kitchen. His hostility to such abstraction ensures that, according to
Bradleys philosophical logic, at most one judgment can be true --
that which encapsulates reality in its entirety. This allows his
identity theory of truth to be accompanied by a non-identity theory of
falsehood, since he can account for falsehood as a falling short of
this vast judgment and hence as an abstraction of part of reality from
the whole. The result is his adoption of the idea that there are
degrees of truth: that judgment is the least true which is the most
distant from the whole of reality. Although the consequence is that
all ordinary judgments will turn out to be more or less infected by
falsehood, Bradley allows some sort of place for false judgment and
the possibility of distinguishing worse from better. One might argue
that the reason the identity theory of truth remains only latent in
Russell and Moore is the surrounding combination of their atomistic
metaphysics and their assumption that truth is not a matter of degree.
For Bradley, then, at most one judgment can be fully true. But even
this one judgment has so far been conceived as describing
reality, and its truth as consisting in correspondence with a reality
not distorted by being mentally cut up into illusory fragments.
Accordingly, even this one, for the very reason that it remains a
description, will be infected by falsehood unless it ceases altogether
to be a judgment and becomes the reality it is meant to be
about. This apparently bizarre claim becomes intelligible if
seen as both the most extreme expression of his hostility to
abstraction and a reaction to the most fundamental of his objections
to the correspondence theory, which is the same as Freges: that for
there to be correspondence rather than identity between judgment and
reality, the judgment must differ from reality and in so far as it
does differ, to that extent must distort and so falsify it.
Thus Bradleys version of the identity theory turns out to be
misleadingly so-called. For it is in fact an eliminativist theory:
when truth is attained, judgments disappear and only reality is left.
It is not surprising that Bradley, despite expressing his theory in
the language of identity, talked of the attainment of complete truth
in terms of thoughts suicide. In the end, then, even the attribution
of the identity theory of truth to one who explicitly endorsed it
turns out to be dubious. [For a more detailed version of this section,
see Candlish (1995). For other doubts about whether Bradley was an
identity theorist, see Walker (1998).]
A metaphysically neutral identity theory
More recently there have been attempts, consciously taking inspiration
from Frege, to defend a metaphysically neutral version of the theory:
holding that truth-bearers are the contents of thoughts, and that
facts are simply true thoughts rather than the metaphysically weighty
sorts of things envisaged in correspondence theories. That is, the
identity is not conceived as a (potentially troublesome) relation
between an apparently mind-dependent judgment and an apparently
mind-independent fact. A claimed benefit of this version is that it is not
immediately disabled by the inevitable accompaniment of an identity
theory of falsehood. The difficulty for these attempts is to make out
the claim that they involve a theory of truth at all, since
they lack independent accounts of truth-bearer and truth-maker to give
the theory substance. One way of trying to overcome this difficulty is
by urging that we can properly lower our expectations of philosophical
theories. [See Candlish (1995), Dodd and Hornsby (1992), Dodd (1996),
Can the no-holder charge be met?
Although it is difficult to find a completely uncontroversial
attribution of the identity theory, there is evidence of its presence
in the thought of a few major philosophers. Frege and Bradley have
already been mentioned. Bolzano and Meinong are other possibilities:
Findlay, for example, believes Meinong to have held an identity
theory, reminding us that on his view, there are no entities between
our minds and the facts; facts themselves are true in so far as they
are the objects of judgments. [See Findlay (1933), Ch. III sec. ix.]
C.A. Baylis defended a similar account of truth in 1948, and Roderick
Chisholm endorsed a recognizably Meinongian account in his
Theory of Knowledge. A sketchy version of the theory is
embraced in Woozleys Theory of Knowledge. There are also
the attempts, already mentioned, to establish a metaphysically neutral
version: these show that there can be no doubt that some philosophers
have tried to defend something that they wished to call an identity
theory of truth.
Thomas Baldwin argues that the identity theory of truth, though itself
indefensible, has played an influential but subterranean role within
philosophy from the nineteenth century onwards, citing as examples
philosophers of widely different convictions. [See Baldwin (1991). One of
his attributions is queried in Stern (1993), others in Candlish (1995).]
Whether or not Baldwin is right -- and it is possible that the theory is
no more than an historical curiosity -- the identity theory of truth may
turn out to be best thought of as comparable to solipsism: rarely, if
ever, consciously held, but the inevitable result of thinking out the most
extreme consequences of assumptions which philosophers often just take for
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In each case, the date shown immediately after the authors name is
the date of original publication. A separate date is shown for the
edition cited only where this differs from the original.
- Baldwin, T. (1991), The Identity Theory of Truth,
Mind 100, pp. 35-52.
- Baylis, C.A. (1948), Facts, Propositions, Exemplification and
Truth, Mind, LVII, pp. 459-79.
- Bolzano, B. (1837), Wissenschaftslehre (Leipzig:
Felix Meiner 1929), Vol. I, sections 19-33.
- Bradley, F.H. (1907), On Truth and Copying, Essays on
Truth and Reality (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1914), pp. 107-26.
- Candlish, S. (1989), The Truth about F.H. Bradley,
Mind 98, pp. 331-48.
- Candlish, S. (1995), Resurrecting the Identity Theory of
Truth, Bradley Studies 1, pp. 116-24.
- Candlish, S. (1996), The Unity of the Proposition and
Russells Theories of Judgment, in Bertrand Russell
and the Origins of Analytical Philosophy, ed. Ray Monk and
Anthony Palmer (Bristol: Thoemmes).
- Candlish, S. (1999), Identifying the Identity Theory of
Truth, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society,
XCIC, pp. 233-40.
- Candlish, S. (1999), A Prolegomenon to an Identity Theory
of Truth, Philosophy, 74, pp. 199-221.
- Cartwright, R. (1987), A Neglected Theory of Truth, in his
Philosophical Essays (Cambridge, MA and London: The MIT
- Chisholm, R.M. (1966), Theory of Knowledge
(Englewood Cliffs, N.J.: Prentice-Hall), Ch. 7.
- Dodd, J. (1995), McDowell and Identity Theories of Truth,
Analysis 55, pp.160-5.
- Dodd, J. (1996), Resurrecting the Identity Theory of Truth: A
Reply to Candlish, Bradley Studies 2, pp. 42-50.
- Dodd, J. (1999), Hornsby on the Identity Theory of Truth,
Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, XCIC,
- Dodd, J. (2000), An Identity Theory of Truth
- Dodd, J. and Hornsby, J. (1992),
The Identity Theory of Truth: Reply to Baldwin,
Mind 101, pp. 319-22.
- Findlay, J.N. (1933), Meinongs Theory of Objects
(Oxford: Oxford University Press).
- Frege, G. (1918), Thoughts, in his Logical
Investigations (Oxford: Blackwell, 1977).
- Hornsby, J. (1997), Truth: The Identity Theory,
Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society XCVII, pp. 1-24.
- Hornsby, J. (1999), The Facts in Question: a Response to Dodd
and to Candlish, Proceedings of the Aristotelian
Society, XCIC, pp. 241-45.
- Stern, R. (1993), Did Hegel Hold an Identity Theory of
Truth?, Mind 102, pp. 645-47.
- Walker, R.C.S. (1998), Bradleys Theory of
Truth, in Appearance versus Reality, ed. Guy Stock
(Oxford: Clarendon Press), pp. 93-109.
- Woozley, A.D. (1949), Theory of Knowledge (London:
Hutchinson), Ch. 7.
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[Please contact the author with suggestions.]
Bradley, Francis Herbert |
Frege, Gottlob |
Meinong, Alexius |
Moore, George Edward |
Russell, Bertrand |
truth: coherence theory of |
truth: correspondence theory of |
truth: deflationary theory of |
truth: revision theory of
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First published: March 28, 1996
Content last modified: January 24, 2001