|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
There are many implications of a theory of this sort for philosophical debate about the nature of truth. Philosophers often make suggestions like the following: truth consists in correspondence to the facts; truth consists in coherence with a set of beliefs or propositions; truth is the ideal outcome of rational inquiry. According to the deflationist, however, such suggestions are mistaken, and, moreover, they all share a common mistake. The common mistake is to assume that truth has a nature of the kind that philosophers might find out about and develop theories of. For the deflationist, truth has no nature beyond what is captured in ordinary claims such as that snow is white is true just in case snow is white. Philosophers looking for the nature of truth are bound to be frustrated, the deflationist says, because they are looking for something that isnt there.
The deflationary theory has gone by many different names, including at least the following: the redundancy theory, the disappearance theory, the no-truth theory, the disquotational theory, and the minimalist theory. There is no terminological consensus about how to use these labels: sometimes they are used interchangeably; sometimes they are used to mark distinctions between different versions of the same general view. Here I will use deflationism, and the deflationary theory of truth to denote the general view I want to discuss, and reserve other names for specific versions of that view.
It is worthy of notice that the sentence I smell the scent of violets has the same content as the sentence it is true that I smell the scent of violets. So it seems, then, that nothing is added to the thought by my ascribing to it the property of truth. (Frege 1918)In addition to being popular historically, the deflationary theory has been the focus of much recent work. Perhaps its most vociferous contemporary defenders are Hartry Field and Paul Horwich.
Truth and falsity are ascribed primarily to propositions. The proposition to which they are ascribed may be either explicitly given or described. Suppose first that it is explicitly given; then it is evident that It is true that Caesar was murdered means no more than that Caesar was murdered, and It is false that Caesar was murdered means no more than Caesar was not murdered. They are phrases which we sometimes use for emphasis or stylistic reasons, or to indicate the position occupied by the statement in our argument....In the second case in which the proposition is described and not given explicitly we have perhaps more of a problem, for we get statements from which we cannot in ordinary language eliminate the words true or false. Thus if I say He is always right, I mean that the propositions he asserts are always true, and there does not seem to be any way of expressing this without using the word true. But suppose we put it thus For all p, if he asserts p, p is true, then we see that the propositional function p is true is simply the same as p, as e.g. its value Caesar was murdered is true is the same as Caesar was murdered. (Ramsey 1927)
...it is evident that a sentence of the form "p is true" or "it is true that p" the reference to truth never adds anything to the sense. If I say that it is true that Shakespeare wrote Hamlet, or that the proposition "Shakespeare wrote Hamlet" is true, I am saying no more than that Shakespeare wrote Hamlet. Similarly, if I say that it is false that Shakespeare wrote the Illiad, I am saying no more than that Shakespeare did not write the Illiad. And this shows that the words true and false are not used to stand for anything, but function in the sentence merely as assertion and negation signs. That is to say, truth and falsehood are not genuine concepts. Consequently there can be no logical problem concerning the nature of truth. (Ayer 1935).
The truth predicate is a reminder that, despite a technical ascent to talk of sentences, our eye is on the world. This cancellatory force of the truth predicate is explicit in Tarskis paradigm:Snow is white is true if and only if snow is white.Quotation marks make all the difference between talking about words and talking about snow. The quotation is a name of a sentence that contains a name, namely snow, of snow. By calling the sentence true, we call snow white. The truth predicate is a device for disquotation. (Quine 1970).
One reason for the popularity of deflationism is its anti-metaphysical stance. Deflationism seems to deflate a grand metaphysical puzzle, a puzzle about the nature of truth, and much of modern philosophy is marked by a profound scepticism of metaphysics. Another reason for the popularity of deflationism concerns the fact that truth is a semantic notion, and therefore takes its place along with other semantic notions, such as reference, meaning, and content. Many philosophers are concerned with trying to understand these semantic notions. The deflationary theory is attractive since it suggests that, at least in the case of truth, there is less to be puzzled about here than one might expect.
(ES) n is true if and only p.With the help of (ES), we can formulate deflationism as the view, first, that someone has the concept of truth just in case he or she accepts all (nonparadoxical) instances of this schema, and, second, that saying this captures everything significant that can be said about truth. In most cases, theories which depart from deflationism dont deny the first part of this claim; what they deny is that the equivalence schema tells us the whole truth about truth. Since such theories add to the equivalence schema, they are often called inflationary theories of truth. (The equivalence schema is associated with Alfred Tarski (1944, 1958), but it is far from obvious that Tarski was any sort of deflationist. We will set Tarski aside here.)
Two important points need to be noted about this formulation of deflationism. The first point concerns the parenthetical word nonparadoxical. Why do we not say more simply that, according to deflationism, someone has the concept of truth just in case he or she accepts all instances of (ES). The reason is that some instances of the schema -- most notoriously, those associated with the liar paradox -- are either false or have no truth value, and are on that ground presumably would not be accepted by someone who has the concept of truth. We can mark these exceptions by restricting the formulation to nonparadoxical instances of the schema. (For further discussion of this issue, see the discussion of objection from truth value gaps below.)
The second point is that it is important to see that deflationists are not suggesting that the equivalence schema is an explicit definition of truth. First, (ES) is not a definition of anything. Second, the deflationary theory does not, strictly speaking, provide an explicit definition of truth at all. What the deflationary theory provides instead is an explicit definition of having the concept of truth. To be more precise, the suggestion of the deflationary theory is that someone has the concept of truth just in case he or she is disposed to accept all (noncontroversial) instances of the equivalence schema, i.e., every sentence of the form n is true iff p that is not paradoxical or in some other way deviant. Of course, deflationists do think that, in saying something about what it is to have the concept of truth, they have told us what the concept of truth is. But the latter is a by-product of the former; for this reason, we can say that deflationists are proposing an implicit definition of the concept of truth. This marks an important divide between deflationist theories and other kinds of theories of truth which attempt to provide an explicit definition of truth in other terms.
Are there versions of deflationism, or positions allied to deflationism, which do not employ the equivalence schema or some similar device? Yes, but we shall mention them here only to set them aside. One such view-which may be called expressivism -- is the analogue of emotivism in ethics. (This view of truth is often associated with Strawson 1950, though the attribution is a difficult one.) According to emotivism, at least in one of its most traditional forms, utterances of the form torture is wrong do not, despite appearances, predicate is wrong of torture; rather utterances of torture is wrong merely indicate a negative attitude on the part of the speaker toward torture. Expressivism is the parallel position about truth. According to expressivism, utterances of the form S is true do not, despite appearances, predicate is true of S; rather S is true merely indicates preparedness on the part of the speaker to assert S.
Another such view is the prosentential theory of truth advanced by Dorothy Grover (see Grover, Camp and Belnap 1973, and Grover 1992) . According to this theory, sentences formed with the predicate is true are prosentences, where a prosentence is a device for achieving anaphoric cross-reference to sentences uttered previously in a conversation, just as pronouns are devices for achieving anaphoric cross-reference to names uttered previously in a conversation. According to the prosentential theory, for example, just as in
(1) Mary wanted to buy a car, but she could only afford a motorbike.we interpret she as a pronoun anaphorically dependent on Mary, so too in
(2) Snow is white. That is true, but it rarely looks white in Pittsburghwe interpret That is true as a prosentence anaphorically dependent on Snow is white.
Expressivism and the prosentential theory are close cousins of deflationism, and, in some uses of the term, might reasonably be called deflationary. However, they are also sufficiently different from those versions of deflationism that utilize the equivalence schema to be set aside here. The important difference between expressivism and the prosentential theory on the one hand, and deflationism as we are understanding it on the other, concerns the logical structure of sentences such as S is true. For the deflationist, the structure of such sentences is very straightforward: S is true predicates the property expressed by is true of the thing denoted by S. We might express this by saying that, according to deflationism, S is true says of S that it is true, just as apples are red says, of apples, that they are red or John sleeps says, of John, that he sleeps. Both expressivism and the prosentential theory deny this, though for different reasons. According to expressivism, S is true is properly interpreted not even of subject-predicate form; rather it has the structure Hooray to S. Obviously, therefore, it does not say, of S, that it is true. According to prosententialism, by contrast, while S is true has a subject-predicate structure, it would still be mistaken to interpret it as being about S. For consider: according to the prosentential theory, S is true is a prosentence which stands in for the sentence denoted by S just as she in (1) is a pronoun which stands in for the name Mary. But we do not say that she in (1) is about the name Mary; similarly, according to the prosentential theory, we should not say that S is true is about S. To suppose otherwise would be to misconstrue the nature of anaphora.
One important question concerns the issue of what instances of the equivalence schema are assumed to be about (equivalently: to what the names in instances of the equivalence schema are assumed to refer). According to one view, instances of the equivalence schema are about sentences, where a name for a sentence can be formulated simply by quoting the sentence -- thus "Brutus killed Caesar" is a name for Brutus killed Caesar. In other words, for those who hold what might be called a sententialist version of deflationism the equivalence schema has instances like (3):
(3) Brutus killed Caesar is true if and only if Brutus killed Caesar.To make this explicit, we might say that, according to sententialism, the equivalence schema is (ES-sent):
(ES-sent) The sentence s is true if and only if sAccording to those who hold what might be called a propositionalist version of deflationism, by contrast, instances of the equivalence schema are about propositions, where names of propositions are, or can be taken to be, expressions of the form the proposition that p -- thus, the proposition that Brutus killed Caesar is a name for the proposition that Brutus killed Caesar. For the propositionalist, in other words, instances of the equivalence schema are properly interpreted not as being about sentences but about propositions, i.e., more like (4) than (3):
(4) The proposition that Brutus killed Caesar is true if and only if Brutus killed Caesar.To make this explicit, we might say that, according to propositionalism, the equivalence schema is (ES-prop):
(ES-prop) The proposition that p is true if and only if p.To interpret the equivalence schema as (ES-sent) rather than (ES-prop), or vice versa, is to yield a different deflationary theory of truth. Hence sententialism and propositionalism are different versions of deflationism. (There are also some further ways to interpret the equivalence schema, but we shall set them aside here.)
The other dimension along which deflationary theories vary concerns the nature of the equivalence that the theories interpret instances of the equivalence schema as asserting. On one view, the right hand side and the left hand side of such instances are analytically equivalent. Thus, for sententialists, (3) asserts that, "Brutus killed Caesar is true" means the same as Brutus killed Caesar; while for propositionalists (4) asserts that the proposition that Brutus killed Caesar is true means the same as Brutus killed Caesar. A second view is that the right hand side and the left hand side of claims such as (3) and (4) are only materially equivalent; this view interprets the if and only if in both (3) and (4) as the biconditional of classical logic. And a third view is that claims such as (3) and (4) assert a necessary equivalence between their right hand sides and their left hand sides; that is, both (3) and (4) are to be interpreted as material biconditionals that hold of necessity.
This tripartite distinction between analytic, necessary, and material equivalence, when combined with the distinction between sententialism and propositionalism, yields six different versions of deflationism:
It is this variegated nature of deflationism that to a large extent dictates the many names that have been used for the theory. The labels redundancy theory, disappearance theory and no-truth theory have been used mainly to apply to analytic versions of deflationism: positions A or B. The label disquotational theory tends to apply to sententialist versions, and in fact to material sentential deflationism: position C. The label minimalist theory is a label used recently by Paul Horwich (1990) to apply to necessary versions, and in fact to necessary propositional deflationism: position F. It will not be important for us to examine all of these versions of deflationism in detail; to a large extent philosophers prefer one or other versions of these views on the basis of views from other parts of philosophy, views about the philosophy of language and metaphysics. However, it will be convenient here to settle on one version of the view. I will therefore follow Horwich in concentrating mainly on position F. Horwich calls this view minimalism, but I will continue simply with deflationism.
Suppose, for example, that Jones for whatever reason decides that Smith is an infallible guide to the nature of reality. We might then say that Jones believes everything Smith says. To say this much, however, is not to capture the content of Joness belief. In order to do that we need some way of expressing an infinite conjunction of something like the following form:
If Smith says that snow is white, then snow is white, and if he says snow is pink, then snow is pink, and if he says that snow is chartreuse, then snow is chartreuse,...and so on.The equivalence schema (ES-prop) allows us to capture this infinite conjunction. For, on the basis of the schema, we can reformulate the infinite conjunction as:
If Smith says that snow is white, then the proposition that snow is white is true, and if he says snow is pink, then the proposition that snow is pink is true, and if he says that snow is chartreuse, then the proposition that snow is chartreuse is true,...and so on.In turn, this reformulated infinite conjunction can be expressed as a statement whose universal quantifier ranges over propositions:
For every proposition x, if what Smith said = x, then x is true.Or, to put the same thing more colloquially:
Everything Smith says is true.This statement give us the content of Joness belief. And the important point for deflationists is that we could not have stated the content of this belief unless we had the concept of truth as described by the deflationary theory. In fact, for most deflationists, it is this feature of the concept of truth -- its role in the formation of generalizations -- that explains why we have a concept of truth at all. This is, as it is often put, the raison detre of the concept of truth.
Consider the two true propositions (5) and (6):
(5) Caracas is the capital of VenezuelaDo these propositions share a property of being true? Well, in one sense of course they do: since they are both true, we can say that there both have the property of being true. In this sense, the deflationary theory is not denying that truth is a property: truth is the property that all true propositions have.
(6) The earth revolves around the sun.
On the other hand, when we say that two things share a property F, we often mean more than simply that they are both F; we mean in addition that there is intuitively a common explanation as to why they are both F. It is in this second sense in which deflationists are denying that truth is a property. Thus, in the case of our example, what explains the truth of (5) is that Caracas is the capital of Venezuela; and what explains this is the political history of Venezuela. On the other hand, what explains the truth of (6) is that the earth revolves around the sun; and what explains this is the nature of the solar system. The nature of the solar system, however, has nothing to do with the political history of Venezuela (or if is does the connections are completely accidental!) and to that extent there is no shared explanation as to why (5) and (6) are both true. Therefore, in this stronger sense, they have no property in common.
It will help to bring out the contrast being invoked here if we consider two properties that have nothing to do with truth, the property of being, i.e. the property of having existence, and the property of being a mammal. Consider Hillary Rodham Clinton and the Great Wall of China. Do these objects have the property of existence? Well, in one sense, they do: they both exist so they both have the property of existence. On the other hand, however, there is no common explanation as to why they both exist. What explains the existence of the Great Wall is the architectural and defense policies of classical China; what explains the existence of Hillary Rodham Clinton is Mr and Mrs Rodham. We might then say that existence is not a property and mean by this that it does not follow from the fact that two things exist that there is a common explanation as to why they exist. But now compare the property of existence with the property of being a mammal. If two things are mammals, they have the property of being a mammal, but in addition there is some common explanation as to why they are both mammals-both are descended from the same family of creatures, say. According to deflationism, the property of being true is more like the property of existence than it is like the property of being a mammal, and this is what deflationists mean when they say that truth is not a property.
A natural account of the concept of falsity defines it in terms of the concept of truth. Thus, someone has the concept of falsehood just in case they accept instances of the schema:
(F-prop) The proposition that P is false if and only if the proposition that P is not trueA second, and initially slightly different, account of falsity defines it directly in terms of negation. According to this view, someone has the concept of falsity just in case they accept instances of the schema:
(F-prop*) The proposition that P is false if and only if it is not the case that PMany deflationists suppose that that (F-prop) and (F-prop*) in fact implicitly define the same concept of falsity (cf Horwich 1994). The key idea here is that there seems no reason to distinguish being true from being the case. If there is no distinction between being true and being the case, presumably there is also no distinction between It is not the case that p and It is not true that p. In addition, however, It is not true that p is plausibly synonymous with the proposition that p is not true; and this means that (F-prop) and (F-prop*) are equivalent. As we will shortly see, this account of falsity, though certainly a natural one, leaves the deflationary theory open to an important objection concerning truth-value gaps.
(7) Snow is white is true if and only if snow is whiteNow, does snow is white refer to a sentence or a proposition? If, on the one hand, we take (7) to be about a sentence, then, assuming (7) can be interpreted as making a necessary claim, (7) is false. On the face of it, after all, it takes a lot more than snows being white for it to be the case that snow is white is true. In order that snow is white be true, it must be the case not only that snow is white, it must in addition be the case that snow is white means that snow is white. But this is a fact about language that (7) ignores. On the other hand, suppose we take snow is white to denote a proposition; in particular, suppose we take it to denote the proposition that snow is white. Then the theory looks to be trivial, since the proposition that snow is white is defined as being true just in case snow is white. In short, the deflationist is faced with a dilemma: take deflationism to be a theory of sentences and it is false; take it to be a theory of propositions, on the other hand, and it is trivial.
Of the two horns of this dilemma, it might seem that the best strategy for deflationists is to remain with the propositionalist version of their doctrine and accept its triviality. A trivial doctrine, after all, at least has the advantage of being true. Moreover, the charge of triviality is something that deflationists might well be expected to wear as a badge of honor: since deflationists are advocating their theory as following from mundane facts about which everyone can agree, it is no wonder that the theory they advocate is trivial.
However, there are a number of reasons why deflationists have typically not endorsed this option. First, the triviality at issue here does not have its source in the concept of truth, but rather in the concept of a proposition. Second, a trivial version of deflationism says nothing about the theory of meaning, where by theory of meaning, I mean an account of the connections between sentences of natural language and the propositions they express. After all, if deflationists are attending only to propositions, they are evidently not attending to the relation between sentences and propositions. Of course, one might point out that other theories of truth are also silent on the theory of meaning-why then can deflationism not be? However, the fact is that many deflationists present their doctrine as a central part of a much bigger philosophical project, viz., to provide a deflationary account of all the semantic notions, that is, notions such as truth, reference, and meaning. The problem for deflationists who grasp the second horn of the dilemma is that they must admit that there is no way to complete this project: the deflationary theory of truth can only be maintained by remaining silent about the theory of meaning. And this means that deflationism should be understood as a much more modest project than it is often taken to be.
The other possible response to this dilemma is to accept that deflationism applies inter alia to sentences, but to argue that the sentences to which it applies must be interpreted sentences, i.e., sentences which have meaning. Of course, if the sentences to which deflationism applies are interpreted sentences, then there will be no force to the objection that deflationism is ignoring the fact that sentences have meaning. Deflationism, on this interpretation, is not so much ignoring this fact as assuming it.
However, if it is to be conceded that the deflationary theory of truth applies only to sentences which have meaning, the deflationist takes on a dual task: first, to provide some other account of what it is for a sentence to mean what it does; second, to provide an account that does not employ the concept of truth. For after all, if deflationists did appeal to the concept of truth in building their theory of meaning, the doctrine would be obviously circular. Since most theories of meaning do in fact appeal to the concept of truth, this task is by no means easy. However, recent defenders of deflationism have begun it: both Paul Horwich and Hartry Field have in different ways defended a version of a use theory of meaning (cf. Field 1994, Horwich 1995). There is, however, a lot of work to be done before a use theory can be regarded as a successful theory of meaning.
It is often objected to deflationism, however, that the doctrine has particular trouble meeting this adequacy condition. One way to bring out the problem here is by focusing on a particular articulation of the correspondence intuition, an articulation favoured by deflationists themselves (Horwich 1990). According to this way of spelling it out, the intuition that a certain sentence or proposition corresponds to the facts is the intuition that the sentence or proposition is true because of a certain way the world is; that is, the truth of the proposition is explained by some contingent fact which is usually external to the proposition itself. We might express this by saying that someone who endorses the correspondence intuition so understood would endorse:
(8) The proposition that snow is white is true because snow is whiteNow, the problem with (8) is that, when we combine it with the deflationary theory-or at least with a necessary version of that theory-we can derive something that is plainly false. Someone who holds a necessary version of deflationism would clearly be committed to the necessary truth of:
(9) The proposition that snow is white is true iff snow is white.And, since (9) is a necessary truth, it is very plausible to suppose that (8) and (9) together entail:
(10) Snow is white because snow is white.Unfortunately, however, (10) is false. The reason is that the relation reported by because in (8) and (10) is a causal or explanatory relation, and such relations must obtain between distinct relata. But the relata in (10) are (obviously) not distinct. Hence (10) is false. But this means that the conjunction of (8) and (9) must be false, and that deflationism is inconsistent with the correspondence intuition. To borrow a phrase of Mark Johnstons -- who mounts a similar argument in a different context -- we might put the point differently by saying that, if deflationism is true, then what seems to be a perfectly good explanation in (8) goes missing; if deflationism is true, after all, then (8) is equivalent to (10), and (10) is not an explanation of anything.
How might a deflationist respond to this objection? One response is to provide a different articulation of the correspondence intuition. For example, one might point out that the connection between the proposition that snow is white and snows being white is not a contingent connection, and suggest that this rules out (8) as a successful articulation of the correspondence intuition. That intuition (one might continue) is more plausibly given voice by (8*):
(8*) Snow is white is true because snow is white.However, when (8*) is conjoined with (9), one cannot derive the problematic (10), and thus, one might think, the objection from correspondence might be avoided. Now certainly this is a possible suggestion; the problem with it, however, is that a deflationist who thinks that (8*) is true is most plausibly construed as holding a sententialist, rather than a propositionalist, version of deflationism. A sententialist version of deflationism, on the other hand, will in turn supply a version of (9), viz.:
(9*) Snow is white is true iff snow is whitewhich, at least it is interpreted as a necessary truth, will conspire with (8*) to yield (10). And we are back where we started.
Another response would be to object that because creates an opaque context -- that is, the kind of context within which one cannot substitute co-referring expressions and preserve truth. If because creates an opaque context, then it would be illegitimate to suppose that (8) and (9) entail (10). This too is a possibility; however, it is not clear that because creates opaque context of the right kind. In general we can distinguish two kinds of opaque context: intensional contexts, which allow the substitution of necessarily co-referring expressions but not contingently co-referring expressions; and hyper-intensional contexts, which do not even allow the substitution of necessarily co-referring expressions. If the inference from (8) and (9) to (10) is to be successfully blocked, it is necessary that because creates a hyper-intensional context. However, it is open to a friend of the correspondence objection to argue that, while because creates an intensional context, it does not create a hyper-intensional context.
A final, and most radical, response would be to reject the correspondence intuition outright. This response is not in fact as drastic as it sounds. In particular, the deflationist does not have say that someone who says the proposition that snow is white corresponds to the facts is speaking falsely. Deflationists would do better to say that such a person is simply using a picturesque or ornate way of saying that the proposition is true, where truth is understood in accordance with the deflationary theory. Indeed, the deflationist can even agree that for certain rhetorical or conversational purposes, it might be more effective to use the correspondence to the facts talk. Nevertheless, it is important to see that this response does involve a burden, since it involves rejecting a condition of adequacy that many regard as binding on a theory of truth
The deflationary theory of truth is inconsistent with there being a gap in the class of propositions, and this has been thought by many to be an objection to the theory. The reason for the inconsistency is very simple, and flows directly from the deflationist theory of falsity that we considered earlier. Suppose, for reductio, that the gap is correct and thus that there is a proposition Q which lacks a truth-value. Obviously, since Q lacks a truth-value, it is not the case that it is true or false. But now consider the equivalence schema (F-prop):
(F-prop) The proposition that P is false if and only if the proposition that P is not true.It is clear from (F-prop) that if it is not the case that Q is true or false, then it is not the case that Q is true or not true. But that is a contradiction: it must be the case that Q is true or not true. It follows that Q must have a truth value, and, of course, that there is no gap in the class of propositions.
Clearly, then, one must give up, or modify, either deflationism or the gap. Which? One strategy modifies deflationism by jettisoning the account of falsity that the deflationist offers, while hanging on to the account of truth. This strategy is a fairly desperate one, however. To begin with, if we give up the account of falsehood, it is not clear that we have an account of truth. Truth and falsehood are, as I have said, a package deal. Moreover, the deflationary theories of falsity that we considered are motivated in large part by classical logic. Presumably, it would be desirable to maintain classical logic if at all possible, and this means that we should maintain the deflationist account of falsity. Finally, one can generate a problem for the gap even if we operate without falsity, and only with truth (Rescher 1969). Suppose, again for reductio, that there is a proposition Q that is neither true nor false. Obviously, if Q is neither true nor false, then the proposition that Q is true will be false. But this means that for at least one instance of the equivalence schema, one side of the biconditional will be false, and the other side will be neither true nor false. On all logics that involve truth-value gaps, however, such a biconditional will be counted either as false or else as neither true nor false. Either way, the result is that the equivalence schema is not true in all instances. And this contradicts deflationism.
A second strategy argues that the gap, as I have presented it, is malformed. According to this strategy, one should not respond to the phenomena that prompt the gap by suggesting that certain propositions lack truth values; one should rather suggest that certain declarative sentences lack truth values, i.e., because they fail to express propositions at all. Thus, if we take presupposition failure as our example, the suggestion is that instead of supposing that the proposition that the present King of France is bald does not have a truth value if the King of France does not exist, one should rather suppose that the sentence the present King of France is bald does not express a proposition, and therefore fails to have a truth value. This kind of approach removes any conflict between the gap and deflationism. The gap says, or implies, that certain sentences fail to express propositions; deflationism says, or implies, that if those sentences did express propositions, they would have truth values. But there is clearly no contradiction in supposing, on the one hand, that a certain sentence fails to express a proposition and, on the other, that if it did, it would have a truth value.
A final strategy is to reject the gap entirely, and to simply agree that there is no gap which divides either propositions or sentences. This may initially seem to be an overreaction to the inconsistency of deflationism and the gap; however, what lies behind this strategy is the thought that it is not clear that the various phenomena that motivate the gap ought to be regarded as phenomena which involve failure of truth value, whether of sentences or propositions. In the case of presupposition failure, for example, it is not clear that the problem is best explained by a failure of certain sentences to have truth values, or by the presence of conventional or conversational implicatures that govern utterances of those sentences. The possibility of a broadly pragmatic account of the phenomena suggests that one might accommodate the intuitions behind the gap without supposing that there is a gap in the class of propositions (for an example, see Stalnaker 1975).
Of course, at the present stage of investigation, both of these strategies are only schematic: it is not clear that both or either of them will be sufficient to account for the various linguistic phenomena that prompt the gap. Clearly, work is required on the part of deflationists to show that these strategies are in fact up to the task.
The first thing to say is that there is certainly a sense in which deflationism is not inconsistent with the idea that truth is a norm of assertion. To illustrate this, notice that we can obtain an intuitive understanding of the content of this idea without mentioning truth at all, so long as we focus on a particular case. Suppose for whatever reason that Mary sincerely believes that snow is green, has good evidence for this belief, and on the basis of this belief and evidence asserts that snow is green. We might say that there is a norm of assertion which implies that Mary is in this case open to criticism. After all, since snow is evidently not green, there must be something incorrect or defective about Marys assertion that it is. It is this incorrection or defectiveness that the idea that truth is a norm of assertion is trying to capture.
But now let us see if we can give a general statement of the norm that lies behind this particular case. The problem of providing a general statement seems to be difficult, and for reasons that by now should be familiar. To state the norm in general we would need to be able to do something we cannot really do, namely, to complete an infinite conjunction of something like the following form:
If someone asserts that snow is green, and snow is not green then he or she is open to criticism, and if someone asserts that grass is purple, and grass is not purple then he or she is open to criticism,...and so on.Given the equivalence schema (F-prop*) provided by the deflationary theory of falsity, however, this infinite conjunction can be reformulated as:
If someone asserts that snow is green and the proposition that snow is green is false, then he or she is open to criticism, and if someone asserts that grass is purple and the proposition that grass is purple is false, then he or she is open to criticism, and so on.In turn, this reformulated infinite conjunction can be reformulated as a statement whose universal quantifier ranges over propositions:
For all propositions p, if someone asserts that p, and p is false, then he or she is open to criticismOr, to put it as some philosophers might:
Truth is a norm of assertion.For after all, if truth is a norm of assertion, then, if you assert something false, you are open to criticism. In short, then, deflationists are certainly not denying that truth is a norm of assertion; on the contrary, the concept of truth is required to state that very generalization.
If the problem of normativity is not the straightforward one that deflationists cannot account for the idea that truth is a norm of assertion, what is the problem? Crispin Wright argues that the problem is not so much that deflationists cannot account for normativity; rather, he suggests that the problem is twofold: first, that any theory of truth that does account for normativity is ipso facto not a deflationary theory properly so-called, and second, that any theory of truth which employs the equivalence schemas can account for normativity (Wright 1992; and see Price 1996 for discussion). The result is that, since most contemporary varieties of deflationism evidently employ the equivalence schemas, most contemporary varieties of deflationism are not varieties of deflationism properly so-called.
Wrights objection from normativity is a difficult one to assess. For one thing, it is difficult to find Wrights reason for supposing that the equivalence schemas play such a central role in the explanation of normativity. As we have seen, the equivalence schemas are crucial in providing a general statement of the idea that truth is a norm of assertion, but there seems for all that no internal connection between truth and the norm in question, and thus no internal connection between the equivalence schemas and that norm (cf. Price 1996). Nor is it clear what role normativity plays in the distinction between an inflationary and a deflationary theory of truth. Certainly it is not good enough to simply define deflationism so that any deflationary theory cannot account for normativity. Of course, it is a consequence of a definition of this sort that a theory of truth is either inflationary or false; but then again, no deflationist will accept the definition.
Whatever one thinks of the details of Wrights objection, however, it does have far-reaching consequences for deflationism about truth. What the objection forces us to consider is the possibility that there is no very clear distinction between an inflationary and a deflationary theory of truth. Indeed, this possibility-that there is no clear inflationary/deflationary distinction-is the topic of the final objection to deflationism that I will discuss.
The problem that this Moorean view about truth presents for the deflationary theory might best be expressed in the form of a question: what is the difference between the Moorean view and deflationism? Of course, there is a sense in which the flavour of the Moorean view is very different from the flavour of the deflationist theory about truth. After all, what could be more inflationary than thinking that truth is a property of a proposition that is unanalyzable? Certainly Moores view about good has been viewed in this light. However, the fact that one view has a different flavour from another does not mean that, at bottom, they are not the same view. One might perhaps suggest that, according to the deflationary theory, the concept of truth has an important logical role, i.e., to capture generalizations. However, this doesnt really answer our question. For one thing, it isnt clear that Moores notion might not also capture generalizations. For another, the idea that the deflationary concept of truth plays an important logical role doesnt distinguish the metaphysics of deflationism from the metaphysics of the Moorean view; and it is the metaphysics of the matter that the present objection really brings into focus. Alternatively, one might suggest that the distinction between truth according to deflationism and truth according to Moores view is the distinction between having a simple unanalyzable nature, and not having a nature at all. However, what is that distinction? It is certainly not obvious that there is any distinction between having a nature about which nothing can be said and having no nature at all.
The problem is particularly acute in light of the fact that deflationism has often been discussed in the context of various claims about reductionism. In many discussions of deflationism, for example, the opponent is assumed to be a particular version of a correspondence theory that attempts to reduce the correspondence relation to certain relations of causation (Field 1986 is a good example). However, it should be noted that this kind of view is also opposed to the kind of position that takes semantic facts-such as a propositions being true-as primitive (Field 1972 is a good example). And the problem that we are considering for deflationism is that these two views are not simply identical in being opposed to the kind of view that explains correspondence in terms of causation: it is that they are identical simpliciter. The suggestion, in short, is that deflationism is identical to what initally seems to be its complete opposite, Moorean inflationism.
The decision to be an inflationist or a deflationist about truth has been called "the biggest decision a theorist of truth must make" (Boghossian 1990). Certainly this is true at an intuitive level. But it is sobering also to realize that it is not exactly clear what this decision amounts to when subjected to philosophical scrutiny. And this suggests that there is still a lot of work to be done before we can arrive at a final evaluation of the deflationary theory of truth.
Table of Contents
First published: August 28, 1997
Content last modified: August 28, 1997