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A trope is an instance or bit (not an exemplification) of a property or a relation; e.g. Clinton’s eloquence, Sydney’s beauty, or Pierre’s love of Heloïse. Clinton’s eloquence is understood here not as Clinton’s participating in the universal eloquence, nor as the peculiar quality of Clinton’s eloquence, but simply as Clinton’s bit of eloquence, the eloquence that he and he alone has. Similarly, Pierre’s love is not his participation in love as such, nor the special way he loves, but the loving peculiar to Pierre as directed toward Heloïse. The appeal of tropes for philosophers is as an ontological basis free of the postulation of obscure abstract entities such as propositions and universals.

Name and Incidence in Philosophy

The ontological theory of tropes holds that properties and relations subsist as so many instances or tropes, one for each exemplification. These tropes are particulars, not universals, distinct from the concrete particulars they characterize. By other names, trope ontologies have been espoused throughout the history of Western philosophy. According to D. W. Mertz (1996, ch. IV), variants can be found in the writings of Plato, Aristotle, Boëthius, Avicenna, Averroës, Thomas, Scotus, Buridan, Suárez, Leibniz, Husserl, the early Russell (1911), Stout, Cook Wilson, and Strawson. Tropes have been variously called "property (and relation) instances", "abstract particulars", "concrete properties", "unit properties (and relations)", "quality (and relation) bits", "individual accidents", and (in German) "Momente". (Parenthesized years refer to the Bibliography below.)

The most compelling advocate of such objects in our time has been D. C. Williams (1953), who is responsible for the regrettable term trope. It has nothing to do with figures of speech in rhetoric, Leitmotive in music, or tropisms in plants. Williams coined it as a sort of philosophical joke: Santayana, he says, had employed ‘trope’ pointlessly for ‘essence of an occurrence’. Williams would go him one better and press it into service for ‘occurrence of an essence’ (1953: 78). [Far from poking fun at Santayana, Williams published an appreciation of his views on essence and occurrence in a memorial issue of the Journal of Philosophy (1954).] Ironically, the word ‘trope’ is to be heard correctly these days mainly from the lips of poststructuralists. Meanwhile, many trope theorists have adopted Williams’ usage, but some avoid it (e.g. Mertz). Williams acknowledged the close affinity between his trope theory and G. F. Stout’s theory of abstract particulars (1921, 1923).

Approaches to Univerals

Obviously one could see tropes as complexes of some sort, perhaps composed of particulars and universals. (I use ‘universal’ here to cover both properties and relations.) Such a construction is, indeed, very strongly suggested by the subject-predicate form of our language. Philosophical ontologists have, however, long since considered departing from this linguistic pattern in various ways. Nominalists recognize the particulars as subjects, but hold that there really are no universals beyond the linguistic predicates themselves. Plato held, by contrast, that certain universals, the Forms, are the only realities, the particulars being mere figments of belief (-380). A less radical variant of nominalism recognizes properties and relations, but as mere set-theoretic constructs out of individuals. This approach is usual in model-theoretic semantics. A less otherworldly version of Platonism takes particulars to be bundles of universals; cf. Russell (1940, ch. 6, 8, 24) and Blanshard (1939, ch. 16, 17). For those students of ontology who are not obsessed with parsimony, however, the most natural course would probably seem to be to take a leaf from our language and to recognize both exemplifying individuals and repeatedly exemplified universals. Such a view is so common that it has no particular name; Armstrong calls it the "substance-attribute view" (1989: 59 et seq.). This view need not deny that there are tropes, but it denies that they are basic or simple or primitive. Rather they must be composite structures involving a property or relation, some individuals, and an exemplification nexus. An ontology based on tropes takes the opposite approach. It recognizes tropes as basic, not as constructed. Individuals and properties then require further analysis. Ontological theories thus based on primitive tropes may be called versions of tropism or trope theory. A major attraction of tropism has been its promise of parsimony; some adherents go so far as to proclaim a one-category ontology (Campbell, Mertz).

Varieties of Trope Theory

Trope theories divide according to their treatment of universals and individuals. What I should like to regard as the classic trope theory (Stout, Williams) treats universals and individuals as constructs or bundles of tropes. This is the trope-bundle theory, called by some (Simons, Mertz) trope nominalism or moderate nominalism (Hochberg). (‘Nominalism’ because it repudiates primitive universals; ‘moderate’ because it still recognizes unit properties). Then there are trope theories that retain either primitive individuals or primitive universals. The former position, substratum tropism, was taken in a way by Leibniz, who recognized individual substances (monads), but correlated with complete individual concepts comprising nonrelational tropelike representations of the whole world (1686: §§9, 14; 1714: §§8, 14, 17-19). A similar view is hailed by C. B. Martin (1980) in Locke (1690: 159) and noted approvingly by Armstrong (1989: 114, 136). The latter view, tropes plus primitive universals, was held by Cook Wilson (1926, vol. 2, 713 et passim) and may be represented also by Mertz (1996), with the important qualification that his universals are given conceptual, not Platonic status. Such a position might be called trope universalism; Mertz calls his version "moderate realism". (‘Realism’ because universals are recognized; ‘moderate’ because they are immanent: only their instances really exist.) Finally, there is the possibility of combining tropism with a full substance-attribute view. Husserl (1913-21: 430f, 436f) may perhaps be read in this way, and certain truthmaker theories may come close. (Truthmakers, like tropes, may be posited in addition to states of affairs, complexes made up of particulars and universals.)

Another significant division among trope theories separates the actualists from the meinongians. (The term alludes to no specific teaching of Meinong, just the preparedness to recognize nonexistents.) For the actualist, there is a trope, say, of Old Faithful’s heat, only if Old Faithful is actually hot. The only property instances are actual ones. For the meinongian, on the other hand, there are also tropes of Old Faithful’s coldness, Bill Clinton’s shyness, etc. (The contrast mirrors the traditional dispute over false facts or nonobtaining states of affairs.) These days actualism is popular. Meinongian tropism has, however, one great advantage: it affords a straightforward account of possible worlds (deemed by many hopelessly obscure). A possible world, on this approach, is simply a set of tropes. (There are problems with nonlogically incompatible tropes, such as a’s redness and a’s greenness, but similar problems beset other theories. Not every trope set need be a possible world.)

Trope-Bundle Theory

Classic tropism, the trope-bundle theory, would seem to hold the greatest promise of economy. For this theory dispenses with both primitive individuals and primitive universals, leaving at first glance only tropes. However, second-level bundling relations of tropes prove necessary. Tropes belong to the same individual if they are all compresent (concurrent) with one another. Tropes belong to the same universal (property or relation) if they exactly resemble one another. The two second-level trope relations of compresence and exact resemblance are essential to the bundle theory. They are similarity relations (reflexive and symmetric); compresence is also transitive, an equivalence relation on tropes. Thus universals become similarity classes and individuals equivalence classes of tropes: both are products of abstraction. (This is a first approximation: individuals may ultimately have be taken as more complicated; see Individuals Refined.) Exemplification (as expressed by predication) is then simply overlapping. On the actualist approach, Clinton is eloquent iff he (his compresence class) overlaps eloquence (the set of eloquences). The meinongian approach brings in possible worlds: Clinton is eloquent in w iff he, eloquence, and w all overlap.

Trope-bundle theory can be further developed to include a treatment of compound universals (also requiring further complications in the structure of individuals and universals) and a construction of what Bacon calls states of affairs (essentially, world sets) (1995, ch. III). The whole question of the relation of tropes to states of affairs is a vexed one, partly because intuitive conceptions of states of affairs diverge. For some, it is analytic that states of affairs are complexes, making it unthinkable for them to be tropes. Others see an extensive parallel between the two notions. The latter view is ruled out if the tropes are assumed as basic. But there is some interest in seeing what results if we plug states of affairs (complexes) into trope theory in place of tropes. Connections both to situation semantics and to Armstrong’s later theory of universals (1989: 94) are revealed.


The seemingly parsimonious trope-bundle theory, as we saw, is pushed to acknowledge at least a second category besides tropes, the second-level relations. There are probably more such relations, e.g. temporal precedence and betterness. Williams advocated the obvious therapy here without working out the details. The second-level relations, he suggested, crumble into second-level tropes (1953: 84). But it should be clear that in order to bundle second-level tropes into the requisite relations, third-level relations will be needed, and so forth. It turns out that a significant simplification is actually achieved at the third or fourth level, so the regress is not vicious. At least one unpulverized relation is still needed though, and the third- or fourth-level tropes ultimately assumed are scarcely plausible candidates for basic constituents of reality.

Mertz points out how hostile the Western tradition has been to recognizing genuine relations (1996, ch. 6). Only Russell’s early insistence on their importance turned the tide in our century. Few trope theories have a well worked out treatment even of first-level (ordinary) relations. Campbell holds that while relational discourse is ineliminable, relations themselves come down to their foundations, the properties of their relata in which they are grounded (1990: 98ff). As Mertz has pointed out (1996: 63-67), this general approach goes back at least as far as Ockham. Although Campbell does not give details, the project is not to be regarded as hopeless.

Bacon, on the other hand, retains first-level relations in the same status as properties, bundled into universals by exact resemblance (1995, ch. II). But whereas modern predicate logic treats the semantic values of relational predicates as complicated (as sets of n-tuples), Bacon complicates individuals. He multiplies compresence into indexed 1-compresence, 2-compresence, . . . An individual (in the new extended sense) is then a chain (sequence) of a 1-compresence-equivalence class, a 2-compresence-equivalence class, and so on. This inobvious extension makes a unified treatment of predication possible. On the actualist approach, Yeltsin is healthy iff his first compresence class overlaps health. Pierre loves Heloïse iff his first compresence class, her second compresence class, and love all overlap. The meinongian approach brings in possible worlds: Yeltsin is healthy in w iff his 1-compresence class, health, and w all overlap. The dyadic case is similar. Williams considered the explication of exemplification to be one of the important achievements of tropism, "do[ing] much to dispel the ancient mystery of predication" (1953: 82). Bacon extends that explication to relational predication.

Individuals Refined

For some trope theorists, a mere set of tropes, or even a chain of such, has too little inner coherence and unity to qualify as an individual. Thus Williams takes an individual to be the mereological sum of a compresence class (1953: 81). Martin writes, "An object is not a collectable out of its properties or qualities as a crowd is collectable out of its members. For each and every property of an object has to be had by that object to exist at all" (1980: 8). Mertz constructs individuals with the help of what he calls integrated networks (1996: 76). The integrated network of a particular t comprises all the atomic facts about t. Since the integrated network is itself a nonrepeatable individual, it can have its own integrated network, and so on. A hierarchy of such integrated networks is then an ordinary individual. Mertz appears to leave it open whether the hierarchy ever terminates. He is also vague about facts (states of affairs): they are complexes consisting of a trope and its exemplification or relata, the latter apparently also tropes. Facts serve as truthmakers. Mertz’s account is developed partly to avoid positing individuals as bare particulars. The price would seem to be to obscure the truth condition for simple predication sentences.

A further refinement of bundles is offered in Simons’ nuclear theory (1994). In place of compresence, Simons takes over Husserl’s foundation relation (1913-22.478f). A trope s is founded on t if t’s existence is necessary for the existence of s. s and t are directly foundationally related if either is founded on the other. Foundational relatedness, the ancestral of direct foundational relatedness, is an equivalence relation on tropes. Its equivalence classes are foundational systems. An integral whole [Husserl: whole in the pregnant sense (1913-22.475)] is the mereological fusion of a foundational system. An integral whole forms the nucleus or individual nature of a substance. Its accidents are a nimbus of tropes dependent (founded) on the nucleus, generically though not individually required by it. Thus Simons envisions a tight bundle within a loose bundle, the whole constituting a thick particular. The tight bundle (the nucleus) is like a substratum, but is not assumed as basic.

Objections to the Bundle Theory

The assault on the trope-bundle theory has been led by Mertz. His objections appear to stem from two deeply held intuitions, which I will call the predication intuition and the glue intuition. According to the former, it is unacceptable to conceive of tropes as free-floating (Mertz 1996.26). They are not genuine property instances unless they are saturable, properties of something. Compresence classes do not possess enough unity to be genuine subjects of predication. At the same time, as we have seen, Mertz hesitates to posit primitive individuals lest they turn out to be bare particulars, which would be incoherent by his lights. Hence his hierarchies of integrated networks of tropes (see previous section).

According to the glue intuition, complexes need to be held together, and relations are the glue. They are "ontoglial", Mertz says, i.e., from the Greek, the glue of being (1996: 25). Sets and bundles as such lack unity. Thus Mertz is obliged to reject the bundle theory of relations as well as that of individuals. Only genuine relations can be ontoglial. Together with the predication intuition, this yields Mertz’s distinctive dualism about relations, his trope universalism or moderate realism. The basic universals do the gluing, but the basic tropes get predicated. What is the connection between the two? They are both aspects of the trope, the relation instance. The instance aspect is the fundamental ontic unit; the repeatable aspect is conceptual. It might seem that this makes the glue unreal, but Mertz speaks also of extra-conceptual intensions (universals) as goals of total science (1996: 32).

D. H. Mellor, citing Ramsey (1931), and Thomas Hofweber have objected that the above tropist account of predication in terms of overlapping makes exemplification symmetric: it fails to explain which is the subject and which is the the predicate, or which is the individual and which is the universal. So long as compresence classes can be distinguished from exact-resemblance classes (particulars from universals), there is no problem. But what if the same class could be both a particular (or a link in its bundle chain) and a universal? Bacon rules out this possibility, but seemingly ad hoc. Might it not be, for example, on a radically monotheistic scheme, that the trope God’s divinity was the sole trope in the individual God as well as the sole trope in the property of divinity?

Applications of Trope Theory

Various applications have been proposed for trope theory. Campbell suggests that tropes are the natural relata of causation (1981: 480f). Although events are often cast in that role, Williams affirms that they are a kind of trope (1953: 90). It remains to see whether this insight will shed any real light on the nature of causation. [Bacon sketches a treatment of causation in trope theory, but it is not clear that he makes any essential use of tropes, other than to form possible worlds (1995, ch. VIII).] Campbell further suggests that tropes are the natural subjects of evaluation (1981: 481). Again, while this seems feasible, it is not clear where it takes us. [Bacon tries to develop this idea too (1995, ch. IX), but his treatment would seem to work equally well with states of affairs rather than tropes.] Campbell suggests a trope-theoretic interpretation of the fields recognized by modern physics, but a lot is expected of his field-tropes. Why not have just one trope, the-world’s-being-the-way-it-is?

Mertz puts forward a distinctive system of logic, particularized predicate logic (PPL), exploiting the opportunity of quantifying over tropes in many places where we should expect second-order quantification over properties (1996, ch. IX). Impressive claims are made for PPL. It is said to be a provably consistent type-free extension of second-order logic, admitting impredicative definitions. Diagonal arguments and Gödel’s incompleteness proofs are allegedly defeated, and solutions are proffered to Russell’s paradox, the various liar paradoxes, and the generalized Fitch-Curry paradox.

While tropism, like any other theory, must stand or fall on its merits, it may be asking too much to expect metaphysical arguments to establish its pre-eminence. The substance-attribute view, the property-bundle theory, the trope-bundle theory, and even perhaps model-theoretic particularism are apparently all capable of modeling each other (Bacon 1988). If tropes deserve first place in first philosophy, it may be for epistemological or even pragmatic reasons. As we knock about the world, it is tropes we encounter in the first instance. An intelligible theory can start there.


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individual | Meinong, Alexius | nominalism: in metaphysics | ontology | Plato | Platonism: in metaphysics | predication and instantiation | properties | realism | Russell’s paradox | situation | state of affairs | substance

Copyright © 1997 by
John Bacon

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First published: February 19, 1997
Content last modified: February 20, 1997