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Some sets, such as the set of all teacups, are not members of
themselves. Other sets, such as the set of all non-teacups, are members
of themselves. Call the set of all sets that are not members of
themselves *S.* If *S* is a member of itself, then by
definition it must not be a member of itself. Similarly, if *S*
is not a member of itself, then by definition it must be a member of
itself. Discovered by
Bertrand Russell in
1901, the paradox prompted much work in logic, set theory and the
philosophy and foundations of mathematics during the early part of the
twentieth century.

- History of the paradox
- Significance of the paradox
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

Russell wrote to
Gottlob Frege
with news of his paradox on June 16, 1902. The paradox was of
significance to Frege’s logical work since, in effect, it showed
that the axioms Frege was using to formalize his logic were
inconsistent. Specifically, Frege’s Rule V, which states that
two sets are equal if and only if their corresponding functions
coincide in values for all possible arguments, requires that an
expression such as *f(x)* may be considered to be both a
function of the argument *f* and a function of the argument
*x.* In effect, it was this ambiguity that allowed Russell to
construct *S* in such a way that it could be a member of
itself.

Russell’s letter arrived just as the second volume of
Frege’s Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (The
Basic Laws of Arithmetic, 1893, 1903) was in
press. Immediately appreciating the difficulty that the paradox
posed, Frege hastily added an appendix to the
Grundgesetze to discuss Russell’s discovery. In
this appendix Frege observes that the consequences of Russell’s
paradox are not immediately clear. For example, "Is it always
permissible to speak of the extension of a concept, of a class? And
if not, how do we recognize the exceptional cases? Can we always
infer from the extension of one concept’s coinciding with that of a
second, that every object which falls under the first concept also
falls under the second? These are questions," Frege notes, that have
been "raised by Mr Russell’s
communication."^{[2]}

Because of these kinds of worries, Frege eventually felt forced to abandon many of his views. Russell himself was also concerned about the paradox and so, like Frege, he hastily composed an appendix for his soon to be released Principles of Mathematics. Entitled "Appendix B: The Doctrine of Types", the appendix represents Russell’s first attempt at developing a workable theory of types.

Russell’s paradox stems from the idea that any coherent
condition may be used to determine a set. Attempts at resolving the
paradox therefore have typically concentrated on various means of
restricting the principles governing the existence of sets. Naive set
theory contained the so-called unrestricted comprehension (or
abstraction) axiom. This is an axiom, first introduced by Georg
Cantor, to the effect that any predicate expression, *P(x)*,
containing *x* as a free variable will determine a set. The
set’s members will be exactly those objects that satisfy
*P(x)*, namely every *x* that is *P*. It is now
generally agreed that such an axiom must be either abandoned or
modified.

Russell’s response to the paradox is contained in his so-called
*theory of types.* His basic idea is that we can avoid
reference to *S* (the set of all sets that are not members of
themselves) by arranging all sentences into a hierarchy. This
hierarchy will consist of sentences (at the lowest level) about
individuals, sentences (at the next lowest level) about sets of
individuals, sentences (at the next lowest level) about sets of sets
of individuals, etc. It is then possible to refer to all objects for
which a given condition (or predicate) holds only if they are all at
the same level or of the same "type".

This solution depends upon the assumption, often called the
*vicious circle principle,* that the meaning of a
propositional function is not specified until one specifies the exact
range of objects which are candidates for satisfying it. From this it
follows that these objects cannot meaningfully include anything that
is defined in terms of the function itself. The result is that
propositional functions, and their corresponding propositions, will
need to be arranged in a hierarchy of the kind Russell proposes.

Although Russell first introduced the idea of a theory of types in his Principles of Mathematics, type-theory found its mature expression five years later in his 1908 article "Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types" and in the monumental work he co-authored with Alfred North Whitehead, Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913). In its details, Russell’s type theory thus came to admit of two versions, the "simple theory" and the "ramified theory". Both versions have been criticized for being too ad hoc to eliminate the paradox successfully.

Other responses to the paradox include those of David Hilbert and the formalists (whose basic idea was to allow the use of only finite, well-defined and constructible objects, together with rules of inference that were deemed to be absolutely certain), and of Luitzen Brouwer and the intuitionists (whose basic idea was that one cannot assert the existence of a mathematical object unless one can also indicate how to go about constructing it).

Yet a fourth response to the paradox was Ernst Zermelo’s 1908 axiomatization of set theory. Zermelo’s axioms were designed to resolve Russell’s paradox by restricting Cantor’s naive comprehension principle. ZF, the axiomatization generally used today, is a modification of Zermelo’s theory developed primarily by Abraham Fraenkel.

These four responses to the paradox have helped logicians develop an explicit awareness of the nature of formal systems and of the kinds of metalogical results that are today commonly associated with them.

- Frege, Gottlob (1902) "Letter to Russell", in van Heijenoort, Jean, From Frege to Gödel, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1967, 126-128.
- Frege, Gottlob (1903) "The Russell Paradox", in Frege, Gottlob, The Basic Laws of Arithmetic, Berkeley: University of California Press, 1964, 127-143. Abridged and reprinted in Irvine, A.D., Bertrand Russell: Critical Assessments, vol. 2, London: Routledge, 1999, 1-3.
- Russell, Bertrand (1902) "Letter to Frege", in van Heijenoort, Jean, From Frege to Gödel, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1967, 124-125.
- Russell, Bertrand (1903) "Appendix B: The Doctrine of Types", in Russell, Bertrand, Principles of Mathematics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1903, 523-528.
- Russell, Bertrand (1908) "Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types", American Journal of Mathematics, 30, 222-262. Repr. in Russell, Bertrand, Logic and Knowledge, London: Allen & Unwin, 1956, 59-102, and in van Heijenoort, Jean, From Frege to Gödel, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1967, 152-182.
- Russell, Bertrand (1944) "My Mental Development", in Schilpp, Paul Arthur, The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, 3rd edn, New York: Tudor, 3-20.
- Russell, Bertrand (1959) My Philosophical Development, London and New York: Routledge, 1995.
- Russell, Bertrand (1967, 1968, 1969) The Autobiography of Bertrand Russell, 3 vols, Boston and Toronto: Little, Brown and Company.
- Whitehead, Alfred North, and Bertrand Russell (1910, 1912, 1913) Principia Mathematica, 3 vols, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. Second edition, 1925 (Vol. 1), 1927 (Vols 2, 3). Abridged as Principia Mathematica to *56, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1962.

*First published: December 7, 1995*

*Content last modified: June 11, 2001*