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Notes to Quantum Mechanics

1. Indeed, when pressed, we find we can’t even say explicitly (in the terms provided by the theory, in terms that apply directly to the entities, quantities, and relations of which the world is, by its lights, composed) which systems count as macroscopic (or what would be just as good, which are ‘classical’, which are fit to act as measuring apparatuses, or which interactions count as measurements).

2. It is also sometimes used to refer to a mathematical model that represents that space, a mathematical model that provides a kind of map of the set of possible states.

3.There will, of course, be arbitrariness in the coordinate description of the state-space, thus obtained, precisely as much arbitrariness as there is in the choice of mathematical names for the values of basic quantities.

4. Another way to put this: if you consider the set of states associated with any quantum mechanical system, you would find that it had the structure of the set of vectors in a Hilbert space.

5. Notice the relations between bases and coordinate systems; vectors of norm 1 pointing along the perpendicular coordinate axes of an N-dimensional point space constitute an orthonormal basis for the associated N-dimensional vector space, and there are as many bases for the vector space as possible coordinatizations of the point space.

6.The reader can satisfy
herself that since (*v*_{i}^{A},
*u*_{j}^{B}) spans
H_{A}H_{B}, the equation
defines, by linearity, an inner product on the whole space, and also
that, since |*v*| = 0 just in case *v* is the zero
vector, it follows that
*v*^{A}0
= 0
= 0*u*^{B}.

7. The correspondence isn’t unique; any vectors |A> and @|A> where @ is any complex number of absolute value 1 correspond to the same state. There may be other redundancies; some interpretations, for instance, invoke what are called superselection rules that identify states represented by distinct normalized vectors. (i) is modified below, when mixed states are defined.

8. The equation is usually
expressed in the form *i* *dv*/*dt* =
**H***v*, where *v* is the system’s
state vector and **H** the operator representing its
energy, but, again, the details aren’t immediately
important.

9. The quotes are to recommend caution about reading too much of one’s ordinary understanding of this word into its use in quantum mechanics; one usually thinks of measurement as a way of obtaining information about a system, but the only information one takes away from an individual quantum-mechanical ‘measurement’ about the state of the measured system before the interaction is that it was not (or, at least, there is a measure zero probability that it was) in an eigenstate of the measured observable with an eigenvalue other than the one observed. Of course, if the Collapse Postulate is correct, one knows the state of the system after measurement, but if I shoot someone at close range, I can be pretty sure that they are dead afterward; that doesn’t make the interaction a measurement of the state of their health.

10. The two are not independent, of course; a system’s state is just a specification of the values of those quantities pertaining to it that change over time. Internal relations between a set of elements are relations that supervene on their intrinsic natures; they do not include nomological relations.

11. These are strong assumptions: the first denies the existence of superselection rules, and the second, known as the eigenstate-eigenvalue link, is the principle that defines the orthodox Copenhagen interpretation of the theory. I make them here only to illustrate some of the implications of (P2) in an interpretive context.

12. It is inessential that the reduced state of S after the interaction be what it was beforehand; that is so only in the special case of measurements that leave the value of the measured observable undisturbed.

Jenann Ismael

*First published: November 28, 2000*

*Content last modified: November 28, 2000*