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- Introduction
- The Measurement Problem
- Everett’s Proposal
- The Bare Theory
- Many Worlds
- Many Minds
- Many Histories
- Relative Facts
- Summary
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

Everett’s no-collapse formulation of quantum mechanics was a reaction to problems that arise in the standard von Neumann-Dirac collapse theory. Everett’s proposal was to drop the collapse postulate from the standard theory, then deduce the empirical predictions of the standard theory as the subjective experiences of observers who are themselves treated as physical systems described by his theory. It is, however, unclear precisely how Everett intended for this to work. Consequently, there have been many, mutually incompatible, attempts at trying to explain what he in fact had in mind. Indeed, it is probably fair to say that most no-collapse interpretations of quantum mechanics have at one time or another been attributed to Everett.

In what follows, I will describe Everett’s worry about the standard collapse formulation of quantum mechanics and his proposal for solving the problem as it is presented in his 1957 paper. I will then very briefly describe a few approaches to interpreting Everett’s theory.

In order to understand what Everett was worried about, one must first understand how the standard theory works. The standard von Neumann-Dirac theory is based on the following principles (see von Neumann 1955):

It is worth noting that according to the eigenvalue-eigenstate link (3) a system would typically neither determinately have nor determinately not have a particular given property (a specific property might be represented by a line in the state space: in order to determinately have the property the state of a system must be parallel to the line, and in order to determinately not have the property the state of a system must be orthogonal to the line, and most state vectors are neither parallel nor orthogonal to any given line). Further, the deterministic dynamics (4a), as we will see below, does nothing to guarantee that a system would either determinately have or determinately not have a particular property when one observes the system to see whether the system has that property. This is why the collapse dynamics (4b) is needed: in the standard theory it is what guarantees that a system will either determinately have or determinately not have a property whenever one observes the system to see whether or not it has the property. This is why the standard theory has two dynamical laws: a random, discontinuous one (4b) that describes what happens when a measurement is made and a deterministic, continuous one (4a) that describes what happens the rest of the time.1. Representation of States: The possible physical states of a systemSare represented by the unit-length vectors in a Hilbert space (which for present purposes one may regard as a vector space with an inner product). The physical state at a time is then represented by a single vector in the Hilbert space.

2. Representation of Properties: For each physical propertyPthat one might observe of a systemSthere is an operator(on the vectors that represent the possible states ofPS) that represents the property (in a way determined by the following principle).

3. Eigenvalue-Eigenstate Link: A systemSdeterminately has physical propertyPif and only ifoperating onP(the vector representingSS’s state) yields. We say then thatSSis in an eigenstate ofwith eigenvalue 1.PSdeterminately does not have propertyPif and only ifoperating onPyieldsS0.

4. Dynamics:(a). If no measurement is made, then a system evolves continuously according to the linear, deterministic Schroedinger dynamics, which depends only on the energy properties of the system.(b). If a measurement is made, then the system instantaneously and randomly jumps to a state where it either determinately has or determinately does not have the property being measured (according to the eigenvalue-eigenstate link). The probability of each possible post-measurement state is determined by the system’s initial state.

But what does it take for an interaction to count as a
*measurement*? Unless we know this, the standard theory is at
best incomplete, since we do not know when each dynamical law obtains.
Moreover, and this is what worried Everett, if we suppose that
observers and their measuring devices are constructed from simpler
systems that each obey the deterministic dynamics, then the composite
systems, the observers and their measuring devices, must evolve in a
continuous deterministic way, and nothing like the random,
discontinuous evolution described by rule 4b can ever occur. That is,
if observers and their measuring devices are understood as being
constructed of simpler systems each behaving as quantum mechanics
requires (each obeying 4a), then the standard theory is logically
inconsistent since it says that together the systems must obey 4b. In
order to preserve the consistency of the theory, Everett concluded
that the standard theory cannot be used to describe systems that
contain observers--it can only be used to describe systems where all
observers are *external* to the described system. This
restriction on the applicability of the theory was unacceptable.
Everett wanted a theory that could be applied to any physical system
whatsoever, one that described observers and their measuring devices
the same way that it described every other physical system.

This is what Everett says: "We shall be able to introduce into [the
relative-state theory] systems which represent observers. Such
systems can be conceived as automatically functioning machines
(servomechanisms) possessing recording devices (memory) and which are
capable of responding to their environment. The behavior of these
observers shall always be treated within the framework of wave
mechanics. Furthermore, we shall deduce the probabilistic assertions
of Process 1 [rule 4b] as *subjective* appearances to such
observers, thus placing the theory in correspondence with experience.
We are then led to the novel situation in which the formal theory is
objectively continuous and causal, while subjectively discontinuous
and probabilistic. While this point of view thus shall ultimately
justify our use of the statistical assertions of the orthodox view, it
enables us to do so in a logically consistent manner, allowing for the
existence of other observers." (1973, 9)

Everett’s goal then was to show that the memory records of an observer as described by his no-collapse theory would match those predicted by the standard theory with the collapse dynamics. The main problem in understanding what Everett had in mind is in figuring out how this correspondence between the predictions of the two theories was supposed to work.

Suppose that *J* is a good observer who measures the
*x*-spin of a spin-1/2 system *S* (spin is a property of
fundamental particles and other quantum-mechanical systems; if one
specifies a particular axis (like *x* or *z*), then a
spin-1/2 system will be found, on measurement, to be either "spin up"
or "spin down" with respect to the particular axis). For Everett,
being a good *x*-spin observer means that *J* has the
following two dispositions (the arrows below represent the
time-evolution described by the deterministic dynamics 4a):

That is, if

Now consider what happens when *J* observes the
*x*-spin of a system that begins in a *superposition* of
*x*-spin eigenstates:

The initial state of the composite system then is:

Given

Let’s call this state

Everett confesses that such a post-measurement state is puzzling:
"As a result of the interaction the state of the measuring apparatus
is no longer capable of independent definition. It can be defined
only *relative* to the state of the object system. In other
words, there exists only a correlation between the states of the two
systems. It seems as if nothing can ever be settled by such a
measurement." (1957b, 318)

And he describes the problem he faces: "This indefinite behavior seems to be quite at variance with our observations, since physical objects always appear to us to have definite positions. Can we reconcile this feature of wave mechanical theory built purely on [rule 4a] with experience, or must the theory be abandoned as untenable? In order to answer this question we consider the problem of observation itself within the framework of the theory." (1957b, 318)

Then he describes his solution to the determinate-experience
problem: "Let one regard an observer as a subsystem of the composite
system: observer + object-system. It is then an inescapable
consequence that after the interaction has taken place there will not,
generally, exist a single observer state. There will, however, be a
superposition of the composite system states, each element of which
contains a definite observer state and a definite relative
object-system state. Furthermore, as we shall see, *each* of
these relative object system states will be, approximately, the
eigenstates of the observation corresponding to the value obtained by
the observer which is described by the same element of the
superposition. Thus, each element of the resulting superposition
describes an observer who perceived a definite and generally different
result, and to whom it appears that the object-system state has been
transformed into the corresponding eigenstate. In this sense the
usual assertions of [the collapse dynamics (4b)] appear to hold on a
subjective level to each observer described by an element of the
superposition. We shall also see that correlation plays an important
role in preserving consistency when several observers are present and
allowed to interact with one another (to ‘consult’ one another) as
well as with other object-systems." (1973, 10)

Everett presents a principle of the fundamental relativity of
states: one can say that in state * E*,

when a measurement is made, and that there is thus a single, simple matter of fact about which measurement result

The problem is that there is a gap in Everett’s exposition between
what he sets out to explain (why observers have precisely the same
experiences as predicted by the standard theory) and what he
ultimately ends up saying. Since it is unclear exactly how he intends
for his theory to explain an observer’s (apparently?) determinate
measurement records, it is also unclear how he intends to explain why
one should expect one’s determinate measurement records to exhibit the
standard quantum statistics. This gap in Everett’s exposition has led
to the many mutually incompatible reconstructions of his theory--each
can be taken as presenting a different way of explaining how one’s
records can be determinate (or at least* appear* to be
determinate) in a post-measurement state like
** E**.

So how does the bare theory account for *J*’s determinate
experience? The short answer is that it doesn’t. Rather, on the bare
theory, one tries to explain why *J* would *falsely*
believe that he has an ordinary determinate measurement record. The
trick is to ask the observer not what result he got, but rather
whether he got *some* specific determinate result. If the
post-measurement state was:

then

So, by the linearity of the dynamics,

Thus, one might argue, it would

The idea is to try to account for all of *J*’s beliefs about
his determinate experiences by appealing to such *illusions*.
Rather than predicting the experiences that we believe that we have, a
proponent of the bare theory tells us that we do not have many
determinate beliefs at all and then tries to explain why we
nonetheless determinately believe that we do.

While one can tell several suggestive stories about the sort of illusions that an observer would experience, there are at least two serious problems with the bare theory. One problem is that the bare theory is not empirically coherent: that is, if the bare theory were true, it would be impossible to ever have empirical evidence for accepting it as true. Another is that if the bare theory were true, one would most likely fail to have any determinate beliefs at all (since on the deterministic dynamics one would almost never expect that the global state was an eigenstate of any particular observer being sentient), which is presumably not the sort of prediction one looks for in a successful physical theory (for more details on how experience is supposed to work in the bare theory and some the problems it encounters see Bub, Clifton, and Monton 1998 and Barrett 1994 and 1998).

DeWitt and Graham describe their reading of Everett as follows:
"[Everett’s interpretation of quantum mechanics] denies the existence
of a separate classical realm and asserts that it makes sense to talk
about a state vector for the whole universe. This state vector never
collapses and hence reality as a whole is rigorously deterministic.
This reality, which is described *jointly* by the dynamical
variables and the state vector, is not the reality we customarily
think of, but is a reality composed of many worlds. By virtue of the
temporal development of the dynamical variables the state vector
decomposes naturally into orthogonal vectors, reflecting a continual
splitting of the universe into a multitude of mutually unobservable
but equally real worlds, in each of which every good measurement has
yielded a definite result and in most of which the familiar
statistical quantum laws hold." (1973, v)

DeWitt admits that this constant splitting of worlds whenever the states of systems become correlated is counterintuitive: "I still recall vividly the shock I experienced on first encountering this multiworld concept. The idea of 10^100 slightly imperfect copies of oneself all constantly spitting into further copies, which ultimately become unrecognizable, is not easy to reconcile with common sense. Here is schizophrenia with a vengeance." (1973, 161)

But while the theory is counterintuitive, it does (unlike the bare
theory) explain why observers end up recording determinate measurement
results. In the state described by ** E** there
are two observers each occupying a different world and each with a
perfectly determinate measurement record. There are, however, other
problems with the many-worlds theory.

A standard complaint is that the theory is ontologically
extravagant. One would presumably only ever need one physical world,
*our* world, to account for *our* experience. The idea
behind postulating the actual existence of a different physical world
corresponding to each term in the quantum-mechanical state is that is
allows one to explain our determinate experiences while taking the
deterministically-evolving quantum-mechanical state to be in some
sense a complete and accurate description of the physical facts. But
again one might wonder whether the sort of completeness one gets
warrants the vast ontology of worlds.

Perhaps more serious, in order to explain our determinate
measurement records, the theory requires one to choose a preferred
basis so that observers have determinate records (or better,
determinate *experiences*) in each term of the
quantum-mechanical state as expressed in this basis. The problem is
that not just any old preferred basis will do this--indeed, we
presumably do not know what basis would make our experiences and
beliefs determinate in every world. Indeed, the right preferred basis
would presumably depend on such things as our physiology and
experimental practice, so even if we did know which one to choose,
this choice of a fundamental part of our most basic physical theory
(the part that tells us when worlds split) would have to be contingent
on accidents of biology and practice. We tend to think that our
physical laws are independent of such accidental features of the
world.

Another problem concerns the statistical predictions of the theory.
The standard collapse theory predicts that *J* will get the
result "spin up" with probability *a-*squared and "spin down"
with probability *b-*squared in the above experiment. But the
many-worlds theory cannot, as it stands, make any statistical
predictions concerning an observer’s future experiences. Indeed, the
question "What is the probability that *J* will record the
result ‘spin up’?" is strictly nonsense since one cannot identify
which of the two future observers is *J*. The upshot is that
one cannot capture the standard probabilistic predictions of quantum
mechanics. And the moral is that if one does not have transtemporal
identity of observers in a theory, then one cannot assign
probabilities to their future experiences.

Perhaps the oddest thing about this theory is that in order to get the
observer’s mental state in some way to supervene on his physical
state, Albert and Loewer associate with each observer a continuous
infinity of minds. The physical state always evolves in the usual
deterministic way, but each mind evolves randomly (with probabilities
determined by the particular mind’s current mental state and the
evolution of the global quantum-mechanical state). On the mental
dynamics that they describe, one would expect *a-*squared of
*J*’s minds to end up associated with the result "spin up" (the
first term of * E*) and

An advantage of this theory over the many-worlds theory is that there
is no *physically* preferred basis. To be sure, one must
choose a preferred basis in order to specify the mental dynamics
completely (something that Albert and Loewer never completely
specify), but as Albert and Loewer point out, this choice has
absolutely nothing to do with any physical facts; rather, it can be
thought of as part of the description of the relationship between
physical and mental states. Another advantage of the many-minds
theory is that, unlike the many-worlds theory, it really does make the
usual probabilistic predictions for the future experiences of a
particular mind (this, of course, requires that one take the minds to
have transtemporal identities, which Albert and Loewer do as part of
their unabashed commitment to a strong mind-body dualism).

The main problems with the many-minds theory concern its commitment
to a strong mind-body dualism and the question of whether the sort of
mental supervenience one gets is worth the trouble of postulating a
continuous infinity of minds associated with each observer.
Concerning the latter, one might well conclude that a
*single*-mind theory would be preferable (see Barrett 1995).

One problem concerns whether and in what sense environmental
interactions can select *a physically preferred basis for the
entire universe*, which is what we presumably need in order to
make sense of Everett’s formulation. After all, in order to be
involved in environmental interactions a system must have an
environment, and the universe, by definition, has no environment.
Another problem is that it is unclear that the environment-selected
determinate quantity at a time is a quantity that would explain
*our* determinate measurement records and experience.
Proponents who argue for this approach often appeal to biological or
evolutionary arguments to justify the assumption that sentient beings
must record their beliefs in terms of the environment-selected (or
decohering) physical properties (see Gell-Mann and Hartle 1990 and
Zurek 1991 for this sort of argument). The short story is that it is
not yet clear how the account of our determinate experience is suppose
to work when one relies on decoherence to select a preferred basis
(see Dowker and Kent 1996 for an extended discussion of some of the
problems one encounters in such an approach).

If one allows oneself the luxury of stipulating a preferred basis (a
basis where every observer’s measurement records are determinate), one
can construct a many-histories theory from Albert and Loewer’s
many-minds theory. One might, for example, take the trajectory of
each of an observer’s minds to describe the history of a possible
physical world. One might then stipulate a measure over the set of
all possible histories (trajectories) that would represent the prior
probability of each history being *ours*. Note that since such
worlds (and everything in them) would have transtemporal identities,
unlike the many-worlds theory, there would be no special problem here
in talking about probabilities concerning one’s future experience--the
quantum probabilities in such a theory might naturally be interpreted
as *epistemic* probabilities.

So how do we account for our determinate experience? On this approach, one simply denies that there is any simple matter of fact concerning what an observer’s experience is. Which means, of course, that insofar as one believes that there really is a simple matter of fact about what one’s experiences is, the relative-fact theory provides no account of one’s experience. Similarly, one cannot make sense of the usual statistical predictions of quantum mechanics insofar as one takes these to be predictions concerning the probability that a particular measurement outcome will in fact occur. Again, there are typically no such simple facts in such a theory.

It has been argued that since there is no simple matter of fact
concerning whether a particular event does or does not occur, quantum
mechanics (in fact?) concerns only the probabilistic correlations
between events. It seems to me, however, that any coherent talk about
the probabilistic correlations between events presupposes that there
are determinate matters of fact concerning what events occur
(otherwise what are the probabilities probabilities *of*?).

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*First published: June 3, 1998*

*Content last modified: June 3, 1998*