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Propositional Attitude Reports

A person can be cognitively related to a proposition in many ways. These cognitive relations might be attributed in sentences like the following:
Alicia believes that people walked on the Moon.
Boris knows that people walked on the Moon.
Carla fears that people walked on the Moon.
Denzel hopes that people walked on the Moon.
Believing, knowing, fearing and hoping are four different attitudes towards the proposition that people walked on the moon.

Most propositional attitude attributions use a propositional attitude verb that is followed by a that-clause, a clause that includes a full sentence expressing a proposition. Attributions of cognitive relations to propositions can also take other kinds of clauses, though: Alicia wanted to swim, Juan wanted Mary to succeed, for example. These still attribute propositional attitudes, cognitive relations to an identifiable proposition (Alicia will swim, Mary will succeed), though the proposition is not so directly expressed.

In this discussion, we will look at some of the attempts to deal with a puzzle about propositional attitude attributions that was posed by Gottlob Frege in [1892]. Developing a semantic theory that deals satisfactorily with propositional attitude attributions has proved to be a very difficult project, and no fully satisfactory theory exists. In what follows, we will explore some of the theories developed to deal with the puzzle and note some of the problems with each theory.

The Fregean Puzzle

The attribution of propositional attitudes raises problems in our attempts to provide a systematic semantics for language. Powerful considerations developed by Gottlob Frege [1892] suggest that words in propositional attitude ascriptions cannot function as they ordinarily do. Frege presents his puzzle as one about the relationship between the cognitive value of expressions and their ordinary reference. Developing a systematic semantics for belief attribution that responds adequately to Frege’s puzzle has proved to be very difficult. Every theory seems to have problems that seriously compromise its viability.

The principle of semantic compositionality is fundamental to the Fregean puzzle. We can’t learn language by learning each sentence’s meaning individually, because mastering a language involves being able to recognize the meanings of an infinite variety of new sentences that we encounter. So our ability to understand language seems to require that we be able to discern the meaning of a sentence on the basis of our knowledge of the meanings of its parts and the way that they are put together. In a word, linguistic meaning must be compositional (or at least largely compositional).

The Fregean puzzle can be posed as a question about propositional attitude attributions. (We will use the verb ‘believe’ in the discussion of these puzzles. Similar puzzles arise with all propositional attitudes.) Consider the situation of Lois Lane, who is very familiar with Clark Kent, her fellow employee, and Superman, the hero she most admires, but who does not recognize that ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ refer to the same person. We would ordinarily accept these claims about Lois:

(1) Lois believes that Superman is strong.

(2) Lois believes that Clark Kent is not strong.

It would even seem to be true that:
(3) Lois does not believe that Clark Kent is strong.
When we compare the belief attribution (1) with the belief attributions (2) and (3), it seems apparent that the names ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ make different semantic contributions to the sentences in which they appear. In particular, it appears that if we replace ‘Superman’ in (1) by the ‘Clark Kent’, it will change a true sentence to a false one.
(4) Lois believes that Clark Kent is strong.
Sentence (4) seems false, even though it results from (1) by replacing one name by another that refers to the same individual. Since the names have the same reference, it seems that something other than the reference of the name must be relevant to the semantic evaluation of the belief attribution.

Without propositional attitude attributions, we might hope for a simpler situation for semantics, in which only the referent of a name is relevant to the evaluation of sentences that contain it.

(5) Superman is strong.

(6) Clark Kent is strong.

If (5) is true, then (6) is true as well. Even if Lois and others do not realize it, these sentences must have the same truth-value. So their objective semantics can be the same: each involves a reference to an individual and each predicates the same property of that individual.

However, if we expect semantics to account for the difference in cognitive value of (5) and (6) (Lois accepts one but not the other, and they play different roles in her reasoning), we must recognize a semantic difference in the contribution of the two different names.

So Frege calls our attention to two problems, (i) the problem of the the difference in truth-value of corresponding belief attributions (such as (1) and (4)), and (ii) the problem of the difference in the cognitive significance of sentences composed in the same way of elements with the same reference (such as (5) and (6)). If distinct belief attributions indicate differences in cognitive value of the sentences in their ‘that’ -clauses, then these are the same issue, presumably with a single solution.

[For a more complete description of these problems, see the subsection on Frege’s Puzzles in the entry on Gottlob Frege.]

Frege’s theory

Frege held that correct belief attributions must indicate the way that individuals are represented by the believer (the believer’s mode of presentation of the referent) and that our use of a referential expression within a belief context refers to a way of representing an object rather than to the expression’s ordinary referent. [Frege 1892] When we use ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark’ in (1) and (4), we use them to refer to two different ways that Lois has of representing these individuals.

Frege also held that the ordinary sense of an expression --- the way that the expression indicates its referent --- becomes a part of the truth-conditions for a sentence in which the expression occurs, if that expression is used within a belief context.

On the face of it, these are two different theories about terms in belief contexts --- that they refer to the believer’s way of representing the object, and that they refer to the ordinary sense. Frege unifies these by holding that the ordinary sense is a way of representing an object.

Thus he can explain why the truth-value of the sentence as a whole can vary in (1) and (4), even though the constituents of the sentences ordinarily make the same contribution to the truth-values of sentences. Belief contexts are not ordinary in that regard, so we must look to the usual sense, not the usual referent, in determining the truth-value of a belief attribution.

Difference in sense also explains the difference in cognitive value of sentences (5) and (6). Though they must have the same truth-value, because the constituents are co-referential, they have different senses, because the names ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ have different senses, according to Frege. Though the truth-value depends on the referents of terms, the cognitive value depends on the sense attached to the terms involved in a sentence.

[For a more complete description of Frege’s theory, see the subsection on Frege’s Theory of Sense and Denotation in the entry on Gottlob Frege.]

Problems for the simple Fregean solution

Frege’s solution fails when we try to extend it to all types of propositional clauses that can occur in belief contexts. In referring to individuals, one of our most common ways of doing it is to use demonstratives, such as ‘this’, ‘she’, ‘they’ and similar expressions that can get their reference from an accompanying demonstration. Another common way to refer is by the use of indexicals, such as ‘I’, ‘you’, and ‘now’, that get their reference from features of the context in which they are used. It is dificult to accommodate the use of such terms with a Fregean theory that requires that the mode of presentation is the semantic value of a singular term in a propositional attitude clause. (Kaplan 1977, Perry 1977.) When I point at someone and say:
(7) Alice believes that he will solve an important problem in physics,
my use of ‘he’ does not indicate anyhing about the way in which Alice represents the individual indicated. Since Frege holds (i) that indicating the sense is indicating the way the believer represents the individual and (ii) that belief attributions indicate the sense, this appears to be a grave problem for his theory. This is perhaps even more evident if I say
(8) Alice believes that I will solve an important problem in physics.
My use of ‘I’ tells us nothing about how Alice represents me, and it does not refer to anything that we would ordinarily call the sense of ‘I’.

Attributions of a common belief to many people also highlight the problems in the Fregean idea that a belief attribution must indicate the way in which the believer represents an individual in belief. If different people have different modes of representation associated with a name, then the belief attributer can’t be responsible for the many modes of representation when he ascribes a common belief.

(9) Many people believe that Tom McKay will solve an important problem in physics.
Someone attributing such a belief cannot be responsible for the many modes of representation that the various believers associate with ‘Tom McKay’. The theory could work in this case only if we could find a sense for ‘Tom McKay’ that does not vary from person to person and that can serve as the mode of presentation of that individual for each person. That seem unlikely. When we use indexicals in such attributions, the problem is perhaps clearest of all:
(10) Many people believe that I will solve an important problem in physics.
(Similar problems are raised in Schiffer 1992, 507-508.) It seems quite implausible that the truth-conditions for my uterance involve either the many modes of representation that the believers have of me when I assert (10). Only the referent, not its mode of presentation, seems relevant with ordinary uses of indexical expressions like ‘I’, ‘you’, ‘now’, ‘yesterday’ and demonstratives like ‘that’ and ‘he’. [See Perry 1977, 1979].

It appears, then, that our fundamental responsibility in belief attributions is to get the referent right -- i.e., to indicate the individuals the beliefs are about and the properties that the believer attributes to them. The Fregean theory that requires only a reference to the mode of presentation seems wrong or irrelevant in many of our most common sorts of belief attribution. Yet focus on the referent alone seems wrong when we consider the contrast between (1) and (4).

The Russellian theory

Bertrand Russell proposed a view very different from Frege’s, arguing that names contribute only their referents to the propositions that contain them. More recent Russellians, (McKay 1980, Salmon 1986 and many subsequent papers, and Soames 1989 and 1995, for example) have followed this much of Russell’s view, arguing that the fundamental truth-conditions for belief attributions involve only the objects and properties, not the way those are represented. [Our formulation of the puzzle does not use definite descriptions --- noun phrases of the form the F. Russell’s own approach to these issues involves, in part, his analysis of definite descriptions. That is explored in the linked discussion of definite descriptions .] According to these Russellians, we are wrong when we say that (1) is true and (4) is false. They are composed in the same way from elements with the same semantic value, and problems like those that we have just considered for the Fregean approach can be a part of arguments for the view that most people’s ordinary judgments here are incorrect.

Many Russellians (McKay and Salmon, for example) go on to try to explain why people make those incorrect judgments about truth-values.

There may often be additional responsibilities for indicating the way in which the believer represents the individuals that the beliefs are about, but these go beyond the truth-conditions of the attributions. Any additional responsibilities are pragmatic, not semantic, requirements on the speaker. They may be conditions that a speaker must ordinarily fulfill when making a belief attribution, but they are not part of the semantic content of the attribution.

As we saw in the discussion of the problems in the Fregean approach, indexical cases show clearly that indicating the believer’s mode of representation cannot be a general requirement of belief attribution. In addition, we often use names in ways that clearly do not fulfill that requirement. For example, I may say:

(11) The students believe that John is a great teacher.
even if I know that they refer to him only as ‘Professor Adams’, and none know his first name. In using a name in the attribution, I am not required to use a name that indicates the students’ way of representing John in order to say something true.

We sometimes have responsibilities that go beyond just avoiding falsehood. For example, it is true but inappropriate to say ‘John is sober today’ if John is always sober. That sentence is misleading because it suggests a contrast where there is none, though the sentence is true. Confounding pragmatic responsibilities with our responsibility to avoid falsehood can lead people astray concerning the fundamental semantics of belief attribution.

The Russellian must say that (4) is true (given that (1) is), but (4) may be very misleading, depending on the details of the context of attribution. Although Lois believes that Clark Kent is strong, she would never accept the sentence ‘Clark Kent is strong’. She does not accept that sentence, because she does not recognize that it expresses a proposition that she believes. There is a particular individual, who is known both as Clark Kent and as Superman, and she believes that he is strong. (1) and (4) both attribute that belief, but (4) does it in a misleading way, because it uses a sentence that she would not accept. According to this pragmatic explanation of why people go wrong here, the recognition that some utterances of (4) are very misleading and therefore inappropriate produces the feeling that those utterances of (4) are wrong. Though an utterance can feel wrong, we can’t trust that feeling to tell us just how it is wrong. On this view, then, (4) is a true but misleading report of Lois’s belief. Belief attribution may be guided by a pragmatic rule such as "Do not use a sentence that the believer would not accept, if possible". However, that cannot be a part of the semantics of belief attribution, according to the Russellian.

The Russellian disagrees with the Fregean about what is part of the truth-conditions or the content for belief attributions. This is also a disagreement about the elements of the objects of belief. However, there need not be a very substantive disagreement about what is involved in having a belief. For example, a Russellian might agree with Frege that in order for Bernie to have a belief about an individual, say Carla, Bernie must have a way of representing Carla (a mode of presentation of Carla). Where they disagree: the Russellian holds that the truth-conditions for the belief sentence

(12) Bernie believes that Carla is pretty.
do not include anything about Bernie’s way of representing Carla, while the Fregean holds that the use of ‘Carla’ in that sentence refers only to that mode of presentation. Still, they can agree that Bernie must have some way of representing Carla for this to be right. They might even agree that a belief attributer should avoid referring to Carla in a way that would mislead us about how Bernie represents her (in the way that (4) is at least misleading about Lois’s state of mind). The difference may just be in whether that last responsibility is a part of the truth-conditions or only the appropriateness conditions of the belief attribution.

Problems for Russellian theories

There are several problems and puzzles for this Russellian view, and a thoroughly worked out view will need to respond to all of them.

Pragmatic principles. It seems that the Russellian should have some account of what leads so many people astray in their judgments that (1) and (4) differ in truth-value. If the Russellian wishes to give a pragmatic account of people’s ordinary judgments about the truth-value, the Russellian must clearly identify the pragmatic principles that make these incorrect judgments are so pervasive and stubborn.

Asymmetric relations. There are cases that are much less intuitive than even the claim that (4) is true. If names really are inter-substitutable, and if it is true that:

Lois believes that Superman is stronger than Clark Kent.
then these must also be true:
Lois believes that Superman is stronger than Superman.

Lois believes that Clark Kent is stronger than Superman.

Can it really be that these are true, and that the typical strong feeling that they are false is really a feeling of pragmatic inappropriateness? Must Lois also believe that Superman is stronger than himself, or can we differentiate this from the previous claims? (See Salmon 1992, McKay 1991)

Negation. According to Russellians, the belief attribution:

(1) Lois believes that Superman is strong.
ordinarily conveys the meaning that Lois believes of that individual that he is strong. However, according to some, it is also a conversational implicature of that sentence that Lois would accept ‘Superman is strong’, and an ordinary use of the sentence conveys that too. On the other hand
(4) Lois believes that Clark Kent is strong.
is also true, but it implicates something false, and that leads to our judgment that the sentence is inappropriate or even false.

What about negation?

(3) Lois does not believe that Clark Kent is strong.
This is a false sentence, according to the Russellian, but it would ordinarily be judged true. In addition, it would ordinarily convey the idea that there is a particular way of representing the individual (as Clark Kent) such that Lois does not represent him as strong in association with that mode of representation. How does a use of a false sentence like this produce such judgments? The Russellian who wishes to provide a pragmatics-based account of how people’s ordinary judgments go astray needs to explain this, and it is not so evident how to do that. (See Recanati, 1993, pp. 341-345)

Mixed theories

Mark Richard [1990], Crimmins and Perry [1989], Crimmins [1992], and many others have interpreted belief attributions in a way that holds us responsible for both the Russellian propositional content and for the believer’s way of representing the content. The standards for getting the mode of representation right vary with context, and tend to fade to nothing in cases invoving attributions like (9) and (10). However, they do more than just hold us responsible --- they agree with Frege that a belief attributer will say something false if the singular term in the attribution does not appropriately represent the believer’s way of representing the object. They differ from Frege in that they also regard the Russellian proposition as a part of the content of the belief attributed. (Some views of this kind have been called "hidden-indexical theories," because they make reference to a type of mode of representation without having any word that explicitly refers to that does just that job. See Schiffer 1992, p. 503.)

This can provide for results that many people find satisfying. For example, on this kind of view:

(13) Lois believes that Superman is strong
is true in ordinary contexts; but
(14) Lois believes that Clark Kent is strong
is false in ordinary contexts. On the other hand, pointing to Clark Kent naked in the sauna and saying
(15) Lois believes that he is strong
one may speak truly or falsely, depending on a variety of contextual factors. (Whether the audience knows about the Superman disguise, what kind of information about Lois is required in the context, etc..)

Objections of Bach [1993], Braun [1991], Rieber [1995], Schiffer [1992, 1994], Saul [1992, 1997] and Soames [1995] have raised difficulties for such views. The principal problem is how to incorporate the mode of presentation.

(A) If the mode of presentation must be referred to (as Frege required), then we get incorrect results concerning the possibility of belief attribution, because our attributions are too particular. For example, we often wish to say that distinct individuals share a belief even though they have different modes of presentation of the individuals the belief is about. Lois Lane and Lex Luthor share the belief that Superman flies, even though they have somewhat different modes of presentation for Superman. This is a problem that also arose for the pure Fregean theory.

(B) If the truth of a belief attribution requires only that the mode of presentation is of some general sort, without a reference to a particular mode of presentation, still that cannot be a part of the content of the belief attribution. When we attribute beliefs, we are not attributing acceptance of a claim that there are modes of presentation of a certain sort. In saying that Lois Lane believes that Superman flies, a speaker does not take on a commitment to the metaphysical claim that there exist modes of presentation. Belief attributions just don’t seem to be making the kind of claim that such a view would require.

(C) Could the mode of presentation be a part of the truth-conditions without being a part of the content? Could it be like the situation with indexicals, where, for example it is part of the truth-conditions for an utterance of ‘You are bald’ that the addressee of the utterance is bald, but it is not a part of the content of that utterance that there is an addressee or that that there are utterances? That doesn’t seem to work. If I point to Smith and say

(16) You are bald.
it is never a part of the content of the utterance that there is an addressee of my utterance, even though there must be an addressee if that sentence is to succeed in expressing the intended meaning. Other utterances, by other speakers (‘He is bald’, ‘I am bald’ and ‘Smith is bald’), could have the same content, (and they clearly do not have as part of their content the claim that there are utterances and addressees of those utterances). When I say
(1) Lois believes that Superman is strong
the analogue would be to say that it is never a part of the content of my utterance that Lois represents this individual in a certain way. That, though, is the Russellian theory, not the view we are currently considering.

Ambiguity theories

Ambiguity theories share many features of the mixed theories just described. Consideration of such views is useful, even if we find the views ultimately unsatisfactory.

First I want to consider the view that ‘believe’ is ambiguous. In one use, the verb is used to relate us to a Fregean proposition, a way of representing the world. On the other use, it relates us to a Russellian proposition or state of affairs, something that has individuals, properties, relations, etc. as contituents.

When there is an ambiguity, usually the most useful thing is to introduce two terms, one for each of the two different meanings involved. Thus, for a time, I will introduce ‘accept’ and ‘doxate’. Since it is natural to say that we ‘accept’ sentences and other sentence-like representations, let us extend this usage to say that we ‘accept’ Fregean thoughts, which include modes of presentation of individuals. By contrast, let us say that we ‘doxate’ Russellian propositions. For example, using quoted sentences to refer to Fregean thoughts:

(17) Lois Lane accepts ‘Superman is strong’.

(18) Lois does not accept ‘Superman is not strong’.

(19) Lois accepts ‘Clark Kent is not strong’.

(20) Lois does not accept ‘Clark Kent is strong’.

(21) Lois doxates the Russelian proposition that Clark Kent is strong. (Because of (1).)

(22) Lois doxates the Russellian proposition that Clark Kent is not strong. (Because of (3).)

It is natural to hold that there are two standards of consistency. One applies to sentences, according to which the sentences ‘Superman is strong’ and ‘Clark Kent is not strong’ are consistent. Nothing in the form of the sentences rules out the possibility that both are true. There is nothing about the use of negation that would create inconsistency between the quoted sentences within (17) and (19), in the way that it does for the quoted sentences within (17) and (18). The Russellian propositions that the quoted sentences in (17) and (19) express, on the other hand, are propositionally inconsistent. They cannot both be true. That cannot be seen just by inspecting the sentences that express those propostions; one must also know the co-reference relations among the terms used. Thus the sentences that Lois accepts are consistent (by the first standard), but the Russellian propositions that she doxates in virtue of accepting those sentences (in the world we imagine for her story) are inconsistent. Because ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ refer to the same individual, the two sentences that Lois accepts express Russellian propositions that cannot both be true.

The puzzles that arise when we consider the question of whether Lois has consistent beliefs can at least be addressed if we instead ask about what she accepts and about what she doxates, for use of these two terms helps to make it clear that two standards of consistency apply. One standard applies to the form of the sentences accepted, without taking account of co-reference relations among terms, and the other considers the content of terms and applies to Russellian objects of doxation. The sentences she accepts are consistent by the first standard -- they are the kinds of sentences that could be used to express propositions that are both true, and Lois has no reason to believe that that is not the case in the current situation. She is wrong, however, because these sentences express propositions that cannot both be true. By identifying an ambiguity, we provide resources for an answer to the vexing puzzles.

Some philosophers have connected the de dicto -de re distinction with such an ambiguity in ‘believe’. That view, though, has many difficulties, and the de dicto -de re terminology is used in other ways, to mark distinctions among beliefs or distinctions among belief attributions. Rather than trying to sort out different interpretations of that terminology, though, let’s stick with the invented disambiguating verbs ‘accept’ and ‘doxate’, briefly, for heuristic purposes. [Interested readers may with to pursue a more in-depth discussion of the de re/de dicto distinction.]

The ambiguity theory of belief attribution has a certain appeal. In ordinary cases of belief attribution, the sentence attributing the belief can do both things at once. It can indicate the Russellian proposition that is the object of doxation, and it can indicate the sentence (or sentence-like representation) that is accepted by the believer. (When I say "Alice believes that George Eliot was a great novelist", I indicate the way that Alice represents the novelist and the individual her belief is about.) Those are paradigm cases of the use of ‘believe’. Treating ‘believe’ as univocal, however, would leave us with a problem in cases like Lois’s, where we need to say different things about acceptance and doxation. (For example, regarding what she accepts, she is epistemically in the clear. Her view meets the appropriate standard of consistency. However, the propositions that she doxates are inconsistent. And she rejects certain sentences that express propositions that she doxates (such as (2) and (4)).)

The situation with ‘believe’, on this view, is something like the situation with ‘is heavier than’ as ordinarily used. That expression could be talking about greater weight or greater mass. Ordinarily it doesn’t matter; we can express both propositions at the same time, since for the most part their truth-conditions vary together. (We can have polysemy, where the two meanings are simultaneously expressed, not just ambiguity.) But if we are comparing objects that are on different planets, or even at very different elevations on this planet, then we will have to make it clear whether we are concerned with mass or weight. Similarly, we can often indicate what is accepted and what is doxated, but in some situations we cannot do both, and so we must make it clear which we are concerned with. We can make it clear by employing the language of acceptance and doxation instead of the language of belief.

This first ambiguity view, then, just claims that ‘believe’ is ambiguous (in the way that ‘is heavier than’ is ambiguous) and that the ambiguity can be resolved by recognizing the two different things that are ordinarily captured in successful belief attributions. The strategy suggested here is the ordinary one for dealing with an ambiguity; we find or invent two terms and stipulate which will go with each of the meanings. Thus we might firmly stipulate that ‘is heavier than’ will be associated with weight comparisons and introduce ‘has more mass than’ for comparisons of mass.

Ultimately such a strategy will not work for ‘believe’ however, because the situation is more complicated. Some belief attributions involve sentences that use one singular term in a purely referential way but use other terms in a way that seems to require getting the mode of representation right. For example, it could bethat Lois spots a man walking in the corridor, and makes a height judgment that leads her to say two things:

(23) He is taller than Superman.

(24) He is not taller than Clark Kent.

I might recognize the man in question as Rudy Sanchez, someone known to me and the people I am speaking to, but unknown to Lois (outside of the brief sighting in the corridor). I can then make these attributions:
(25) Lois believes that Rudy Sanchez is taller than Superman.

(26) Lois believes that Rudy Sanchez is not taller than Clark Kent.

Is this acceptance or doxation? It seems that it must be both, because the name ‘Rudy Sanchez’ is not being used to indicate Lois’s mode of representation of the individual, but the names ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ are (according to a theorist who might find this ambiguity theory attractive). With the following pair, where Rudy Sanchez is the speaker, the situation is perhaps even clearer.
(27) Lois believes that I am taller than Superman.

(28) Lois believes that I am not taller than Clark Kent.

This cannot be an ambiguity located in the verb ‘believe’ after all. Our intuitions support the idea that there are two different kinds of uses of singular terms (de re and de dicto) in belief attributions, but that will not divide belief attributions into the de re and de dicto, because names being used in different ways can occur in a single attribution.

Edward N. Zalta has suggested a different approach that involves ambiguity in belief attributions. [Zalta 1983]

Non-compositional accounts

Our ability to understand the sentences of a language is open-ended. Our semantic theory must provide for that fact, and this is the basis for holding firm to the idea of semantic compositionality. We can understand an infinity of novel sentences, based on our understanding of words and how they are put together. Any account that breaches the principle of compositionality must provide an alternative account of how this understanding is possible.

Mark Crimmins [Crimmins 1998] has recently suggested an approach that gives up on compositionality, in at least a limited way. The truth conditions of complex expressions are not determined simply by the meanings of their parts and how they are composed. Instead, in some cases, the truth-value of a sentence is determined by the truth-value it would have in a certain fictional situation. This is based on a theory of fiction that says, for example, that

Santa Claus wears a red suit
is true as we usually use it, because it is true in a certain fictional situation that serves as the background for the utterance.

Applied to belief attributions, we imagine a certain pretense that goes with sentences like these:

(1) Lois believes that Superman is strong.

(2) Lois believes that Clark Kent is not strong.

The pretense is that there are people, Superman and Clark Kent, corresponding to Lois’s modes of presentation, and associated with our use of ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’. The pretense makes the differing attributions possible, even though ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ both refer to the same person. At the same time, in order for Lois’s first belief to be true and the second false, we must keep the terms firmly attached to that person as the object of his belief. Thus, this theory gives us the dual interpretation of names required in the mixed theories of belief attribution discussed earlier. It supplements the theory by providing a specific, non-compositional account of the truth-conditions for such sentences. Although this account is non-compositional, it is clear how we can understand new belief attributions, by applying our ordinary compositional semantics to interpret sentences with respect to non-actual situations. (Note: in using the Superman example throughout our discussion, we have already taken advantage of our ability to do engage in some pretense --- the pretense that Clark and Lois exist. Perhaps this is similar.)

This account provides no evident way to avoid problems like those that come up for the mixed theories, however. If we are engaging in pretenses that correspond to particular people’s modes of presentation when we use names, then we cannot take agreement to be sharing a belief. Different people may share a belief even though they represent the object of belief in different ways. If many people know that ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ are co-referential and many don’t know that, then we cannot attribute common beliefs, like "Almost everyone believes that Superman is the most important citizen of Metropolis." [See Crimmins 1998]

William Taschek has also developed a theory that he says is non-compositional, in another recent attempt to deal with the Fregean puzzles. [Taschek 1998]

Concluding note

Ultimately, a response to Frege’s puzzle must fit with a broader theory of human interaction. People communicate their beliefs, they agree when they share a belief, and beliefs play a role in motivating and explaining action. Any account of belief attributions must say how these attributions can accurately reflect these many roles.


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Related Entries

descriptions | Frege, Gottlob | indexicals | intentionality | propositions: singular | propositions: structured | Quine, Willard van Orman | reference | Russell, Bertrand

Copyright © 2000 by
Thomas J. McKay

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First published: February 16, 2000
Content last modified: February 16, 2000