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That there should be a modal logic of time-distinctions has been suggested in our own day by Professor Findlay.Findlays paper Time: A Treatment of Some Puzzles had appeared in the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy in 1941. Prior became aware of it as a result of its appearance in Flews 1951 collection Essays on Logic and Language, which arrived in New Zealand just as Prior was writing the final chapters of The Craft. The suggestion Prior refers to is barely more than a passing comment: "[O]ur conventions with regard to tenses are so well worked out that we have practically the materials in them for a formal calculus", wrote Findlay. He continued in a footnote:
The calculus of tenses should have been included in the modern development of modal logics. It includes such obvious propositions as thatx present (x present) present;also such comparatively recondite propositions as that
x future (x future) present (x present) future;(x).(x past) future; i.e., all events, past, present and future, will be past.
Priors first paper on the logic of tenses, Three-Valued Logic and Future Contingents, appeared in the Philosophical Quarterly for 1953. In 1949 he had learned from Geachs review of Julius Weinbergs Nicolaus of Autricourt: A Study in 14th Century Thought that for the scholastics an expression like Socrates is sitting down is complete, in the sense of being assertable as it is, and is true at certain times, false at others. Prior had been brought up on the view -- prevalent even today -- that such an expression is incomplete until a time-reference is supplied, and hence that one cannot speak of the truth-value of the expression as altering with the passage of time. This was a crucial discovery for Prior: the idea that propositions which are subject to tense-inflections are liable to be true at one time and false at another was to become central to his philosophy. In a summary of his mature views on temporal realism composed nearly two decades later he wrote:
Certainly there are unchanging truths, but there are changing truths also, and it is a pity if logic ignores these, and leaves it ... to comparatively informal dialecticians to study the more dynamic aspects of reality. (Prior 1996a: 46.)
Geachs review sent Prior to the sources, and he found that the Socrates is sitting down example is not only in the scholastics but in Aristotle. Moreover, he discovered that Aristotle speaks of some propositions about the future - namely those about such events as are not already predetermined - as being neither true nor false when they are uttered, on the ground that there is as yet no definite fact with which they can accord or conflict. Prior quotes Aristotles argument for believing that there are such events (De Interpretatione, ch.9): if there were not "there would be no need to deliberate or take trouble, on the supposition that if we should adopt a certain course, a certain result would follow, while, if we did not, the result would not follow" (1953: 232-3). This appealed to Prior, once a Barthian Calvinist but now on the side of indeterminism and freewill. There can be no doubt that Priors interest in tense logic was bound up with his belief in the existence of real freedom (see, for example, Prior 1996b).
Over thirty years earlier, inspired by these same passages of Aristotle, Lukasiewicz had devised a three-valued calculus whose third value, , attached to propositions referring to future contingencies (Lukasiewicz 1920). Priors 1953 article Three-Valued Logic and Future Contingents is an exposition and defence of Lukasiewiczs system (which he had read about in Lewis and Langfords Symbolic Logic and in Jordans monograph The Development of Mathematical Logic and of Logical Positivism in Poland Between the Two Wars). Prior thought, at this stage, that the logic of tensed propositions could be three-valued and that of tenseless propositions two-valued (1967: 16).
In sum, three-valued logic does seem to bring new precision to our handling of statements with tenses (as opposed to the fundamentally tenseless propositions of the common systems); and we may say that Lukasiewicz has, by means of it, done for Aristotles chapter on future contingents what he has done elsewhere for the Aristotelian theory of the syllogism. (Prior 1953: 325.)
However, the Lukasiewicz system is far from being the calculus of tenses at which Findlay had hinted. The system contains explicit syntactic representations of the alethic modalities but there is no syntactic representation of tense. Moreover, the simple addition of another truth value is hardly the means by which to do justice to Priors key insight that propositions subject to tense-inflection can change in truth value with the passage of time: Socrates is sitting down can be true at one time, false at another, and adding a third value does not help represent this change. It was some months before Prior realised that the use of off-the-shelf modal syntax was all that was required for the representation of this dynamical feature of tensed propositions. It was simply a matter of taking seriously the idea that he had discussed in The Craft: tense is a species of modality.
In 1953 Prior read of the work of the Megarian logician Diodorus Chronos in Benson Mates book Stoic Logic. Prior later wrote of Diodorus that he "seems to have been an ancient Greek W.V. Quine, who regarded the Aristotelian logic of possibility and necessity with some scepticism, but offered nevertheless some harmless senses that might be attached to modal words" (1967: 16). Diodorus defined the possible as what is or will be true: according to Diodorus, what actually happens is all that can happen. Prior found this deterministic definition uncongenial and set himself the task of locating a fallacy in the argument that Diodorus used to support it, the so-called Master Argument:
The aim of the Master Argument, as I conceive it, was to refute the Aristotelian view that while it is now beyond the power of men or gods to affect the past, there are alternative futures between which choice is possible. Against this, Diodorus held that the possible is simply what either is or will be true. (1962a: 138; see also 1967: 33.)
Consideration of the Master Argument brought together three of Priors great interests: indeterminism, modal logic, and the logic of time. In the course of his reflections on the argument, Findlays footnote pushed its way to the front of his mind. His wife Mary remembers "his waking me one night, coming and sitting on my bed, and reading a footnote from John Findlays article on time, and saying he thought one could make a formalised tense logic." His first explorations of this calculus of tenses appeared in his article Diodoran Modalities, completed by early 1954 and published in 1955. (Diodoran is Priors term, Diodorean is Matess. In 1958 Prior switched to the latter.) In it he wrote:
I here propose to do something a little different, namely to employ the ordinary propositional variables p, q, r etc., for propositions in the Diodoran sense [i.e. propositions which may be true at one time and false at another] and to use certain operators which take such propositions as arguments, and which form functions taking such propositions as values. I shall use Fp for It will be the case that p. (1955b: 205.)
The axioms and rules of the calculus that Prior sets out in this article owe much to von Wrights 1951 axiomatisation of Lewis modal system S4 (An Essay in Modal Logic, Appendix II). Von Wright obtains S4 by adding the following axioms and rules to the classical propositional calculus (Lp is defined as -M-P):
W1. p MpSubstituting his new operator F for M throughout the axioms produced, in the case of W1, a clear falsehood and in the case of W2 and W3, formulae which he found obvious enough. The result of substituting F into RE also made good sense to him. To deal with RL he introduced a tense-prefix G by means of a definition paralleling von Wrights definition of L, viz. Gp=-F-p; he read G as it will be always be the case that. Thus his 1953/54 calculus of tenses was the system produced by adding the F-analogues of W2, W3 and RE, and the G-analogue of RL, to the classical propositional calculus. (Prior remarks that an operator P may be introduced for It has been the case that p but states no axioms or rules concerning it.) He shows that if, following Diodorus, Mp is defined as pvFp, von Wrights three modal axioms and two rules are all derivable in his calculus.
W2. M(pvq) (Mp)v(Mq)
W3. MMp Mp
RE. If X Y is a thesis, so is MX MY
RL. If X is a thesis so is LX.
In a matchless piece of philosophical reconstruction Prior expresses the conclusion of the Master Argument, that what neither is nor will be true is not possible, as (-p&-Fp) -Mp and derives it in his calculus from Diodorus premisses, Pp -M-Pp and -Mq (L(p q) -Mp), together with two broad assumptions about time, likely to have been taken for granted both by Diodorus and by his main opponents: p HFp and (-p&-Fp) P-Fp. So the Master Argument is indeed valid. The fallacy, Prior tells us, lies with the second broad assumption, (-p&-Fp) P-Fp (which says: when anything neither is nor will be the case, it has been the case that it will not be the case). This, Prior tells us, is not true if p refers to a future contingency (and thus has the truth value or indeterminate). Where p is indeterminate both Fp and -Fp are indeterminate, so the consequent of the disputed formula, P-Fp, is false. -p must also be indeterminate (for if the negation of p were determinate p could not be indeterminate). Thus the antecedent of the disputed formula, -p&-Fp, is indeterminate, since both its conjuncts are indeterminate. According to the Lukasiewicz truth-table, an indicative conditional with a false consequent and an indeterminate antecedent is not true but indeterminate.
Thus Prior is able to "deny that propositions of the form [(-p & -Fp) P-Fp] are in all cases true".
This reasoning of Priors is persuasive only if one accepts the Lukasiewicz truth-table. Yet are there not indicative conditionals with false consequents and indeterminate antecedents that are true? For example, let Fp be I will kill myself, and let us suppose that Fp is indeterminate (since I have not yet decided). So PFp is false: there has as yet been no time at which Fp is true. Yet it seems excessively harsh always to withhold the value True from the indicative conditional If Fp then PFp (harsh given, at any rate, that temporal succession is transitive and that atypical moments such as the first moment of time are not under consideration). The difficulty is that in the conditional form a statement that is actually indeterminate in value, Fp, is supposed true. If Fp is now true then the present moment lies in an epoch throughout which it is the case that ps future truth is determined. Unless the moment of utterance happens to be the very first moment of this epoch there are past moments at which Fp is true, so PFp is now true. So, given some suitable assumption concerning such epochs, which for the present purposes may be chosen ad libitum (for example, it will suffice to assume that such epochs are always open intervals in continuous linear time), it is the case that if Fp is true then PFp is true. The claim that the conditional if Fp then PFp is indeterminate simply because its antecedent happens to be so (and its consequent false) cannot be sustained in the present situation, for what the above reasoning shows is that (under the assumption) the combination antecedent True, consequent False cannot arise.
At bottom what this indicates, of course, is that the two-valued equivalence between -pvq and p q does not extend to the three-valued case. -pÃq may be indeterminate and yet, as in the present example, there be no principled reason for withholding the value True from p q. Lukasiewiczs idea that propositions about the future may be assigned a third truth-value is not as straightforward as it may seem. Prior himself later came to see that "[t]he truth-functional technique seems simply out of place" where indeterminate propositions are concerned (1967: 135). It was the treatment of conjunction that particularly troubled Prior. According to the Lukasiewicz truth-table, p&q is indeterminate where p and q are both indeterminate, yet as Prior remarks, if q is the negation of an indeterminate p then p&q is not indeterminate even though both its constituents are. The proposition There both will and wont be a sea battle tomorrow is, Prior says, "plain false".
The Master Argument for determinism continued to exercise Prior for the rest of his life, and some of the most useful and mathematically most interesting parts of his work were inspired by his thoughts on it. To choose just one example, from computer science, the calculi that Prior developed in response to the idea that the Master Argument is defeated if time is conceived as branching into the future have become useful for describing and verifying the behaviour of concurrent and distributed processing systems.
The tense calculus that Prior worked out in Diodoran Modalities was hardly complete. For one thing there were no axioms or rules for the past tense operator P, and for another the calculus two axioms, FFp Fp and F(pvq) (Fp)v(Fq), had been chosen in an almost haphazard manner, by transforming certain axioms of a calculus designed for a rather different purpose. Prior duly set about expanding his calculus. He worked fast, and in August 1954 he presented a system of far greater sophistication in his Presidential Address to the second New Zealand Congress of Philosophy, held in Wellington. (Prior himself had organised the first Congress in Christchurch the previous year.)
His first step was to add two additional axioms concerning futurity, Gp Fp and Fp FFp. The former is the tense-analogue of Lp Mp, a thesis whose derivation involves von Wrights axiom W1 (which is false under a tense-logical interpretation). The second of the new axioms is the converse of one of the original axioms. Prior remarks that it is suggested by common notions on the subject of time. Next he made a simplification which drew on a recent proof by Sobocinski that von Wrights weakest system M is equivalent to Feys system T: by taking G as undefined and defining F as -G-, he was able to replace the somewhat unwieldy axiom F(pvq) (Fp)v(Fq) by G(p q) (Gp Gq) (Sobocinski 1953).
This calculus of pure futurity can be transformed into a calculus of pure pastness by replacing F by P and G by H (It has always been the case that) throughout the axioms, rules and definition. (Charles Hamblin was later to describe this process and its reverse as producing the mirror-image of what one starts with.) Like the alethic systems, both these pure calculi are monomodal. That is, each contains only one undefined modal operator. Prior wanted a full tense calculus in F and P: a bimodal logic (i.e. a logic containing two undefined modal operators). To obtain the bimodal system it was not enough to simply bundle together the futurity axioms and rules with their mirror images, for the two tense operators would then remain independent of one another. Some interactive axioms, "laws which relate to the interaction of pastness and futurity", were also required. Prior chose p GPp and p HFp. He found the first of these in William of Ockhams Tractatus de Praedestinatione and the second was one of the formulae he himself had used in his reconstruction of the Master-Argument. Thus Prior constructed the first multimodal system.
Prior honoured Findlay by proving one of the propositions stated in his footnote as the first theorem of the full tense calculus: all events, past, present and future, will be past. In tense-logical notation this is (pvPpvFp) FPp, a formula that Prior was later to refer to simply as Findlays law. (Prior describes Findlays own suggested symbolisation of the proposition, (x).(x past) future, as unfortunate, since "the formula suggests that everything will have been the case (even permanent falsehoods)" (1967: 9).)
In Diodoran Modalities Prior was content to describe FFp Fp as obvious enough. By the time of the Wellington Congress his thinking had moved forward considerably. In a strikingly original section of a strikingly original paper he set out what he called the l-calculus (he was later to prefer the term U-calculus). In the l-calculus the propositions of the tense calculus are treated as predicates expressing properties of dates, the latter being represented by name-variables x, y, z. The concatenation px is read as p at x. l is a binary relation taking dates as arguments and is read is later than. Using an arbitrary date z to represent the time of utterance, Fp is equated with (x)(lxz & px) (p at some time later than z), and Pp with (x)(lzx & px) (p at some time earlier than z). Gp and Hp are equated with the universal quantifications (x)(lxz px) and (x)(lzx px), respectively. Priors key idea was that by imposing various conditions on the relation l, analogues of the axioms of the tense calculus can be derived in the l-calculus. (It was this idea that he and Carew Meredith were to exploit two years later in devising the possible worlds semantics for modal logic.)
Prior discovered that FFp Fp and its mirror-image require for their derivation the condition lxy (lyz lxz), asserting that the later-than relation is transitive. Fp FFp and its mirror-image require the condition lxz (Ey)(lxy&lyz), which asserts that between any two dates there is another date. Gp Fp requires the condition that there is a date later than any given date, (Ex)lxz (mutatis mutandis for the mirror-image). Prior notes that no conditions are required for the derivation in the l-calculus of the two interactive axioms p GPp and p HFp nor for the axioms G(p q) (Gp Gq) and H(p q) (Hp Hq): in the case of these formulae the standard machinery of truth-functional and quantificational logic suffices for their derivation (this applies also to the two rules of the calculus). It was these latter formulae that Lemmon later took as axioms for his minimal tense logic Kt, a system making no assumptions concerning contingent properties of the later-than relation.
Prior closes this section with a warning against regarding this interpretation of the tense calculus within the l-calculus as "a metaphysical explanation of what we mean by is, has been and will be": the l-calculus is not "metaphysically fundamental". His reason is that F(Socrates is sitting down) means It is now the case that it will be the case that Socrates is sitting down, and there is no genuine way of representing the indexical now in the l-calculus (the free variable z is a complete sham). He continues: "If there is to be any interpretation of our calculi in the metaphysical sense, it will probably need to be the other way round; that is, the l-calculus should be exhibited as a logical construction out of the PF-calculus rather than vice versa." This idea of the primacy of the tense calculus over the l-calculus - or, as he was later to put it, of McTaggarts A-series over the B-series - was to become a central and distinctive tenet of his philosophy. Priors thesis is perhaps even more radical in its application to modal logic: the language of possible worlds is to be interpreted in terms of a language with modal operators and not - as is popularly held - vice versa. These issues form the theme of his final book Worlds, Times and Selves (edited by Kit Fine).
The text of the Wellington address was not published until 1958 (in the journal Franciscan Studies, under the title The Syntax of Time-Distinctions). It was the 1956 John Locke lectures and the ensuing book Time and Modality (published in 1957) that brought Priors discoveries in tense and modal logic before a wider audience. A number of logicians - notably Thomas, Geach, Lemmon, Meredith and Kripke - took an immediate interest in Priorean modal logic, in particular his Diodorean system and his system Q, a multivalued logic admitting the existence of contingent beings. Less immediate attention was paid to his tense logic. The bibliography of the subject in Priors 1968 volume Papers on Time and Tense reveals that up until 1965 the only publications in the field were either by Prior himself or were reviews of his work (chiefly of Time and Modality). Yet a momentum was slowly gathering.
At a colloquium on modal and many-valued logics held in Helsinki in 1962 Hintikka proposed a tense-logical construal of his possible worlds semantics, maintaining that if we do not want to tie our logic to old-fashioned physics, we are undoubtedly wiser if we ... no longer require that the alternativeness relation (in this case it could perhaps be more appropriately termed "futurity relation") effect a linear ordering (1963: 76). (Prior had happily tied his 1954 l-relation to old-fashioned physics. He made it clear that he did not think much of the view of time embodied in twentieth century physics (1996b: 49-51).) A pupil of von Wright, Hintikka had been stimulated by the latters proposals for the wide application of modal logic (see the next section) and had come to appreciate the possibility of applying modal notions to the study of the logic of time before he read of Priors sophisticated work in Time and Modality (which he reviewed in 1958). Hintikka was perhaps the first to stress the importance of a semantical approach to the tenses. During the early 1960s Hintikka travelled regularly between Helsinki and California. His ideas on tense influenced a number of logicians working in California, in particular Dana Scott.
Also in 1962, Scott gave a lecture on tense logic in Amsterdam. Among his audience was Hans Kamp, then an undergraduate. Scotts work on tense logic was one aspect of his study of the semantics of natural language, which he pursued in close collaboration with Richard Montague. Scott was aware of Priors work, and was also influenced in his understanding of tense by Reichenbach, who had been a powerful figure at UCLA until his death in 1953. (Prior himself was critical of Reichenbachs analysis of the tenses, and described it as having been in some ways a hindrance rather than a help to the construction of a logic of tenses (Prior 1967: 13, Reichenbach 1948).) Scotts tense logic was rather different in style from Priors. Scott established the completeness and decidability of various axiomatic tense logics. He also showed that the temporal predicate logic of the reals is non-axiomatisable. His work in tense logic is cited widely but remains unpublished. Prior learned of Scotts work in a letter from Lemmon dated January 1964. (Lemmon had left Oxford in 1963 for Claremont, near Los Angeles. Scott was then at Stanford.)
In 1965 Prior visited California for several months, as Flint Professor of Philosophy at UCLA. For the first time Prior found himself among a group of enthusiasts for tense logic. Shortly after the visit ended he was to write: "I suppose that California is the most logically mature place in the world, and now that the logic of tenses is pursued so widely and so vigorously there, its raw pioneering days can be considered over" (1967: vi). When Prior arrived at UCLA Nino Cocchiarella was just completing a Ph.D. thesis on quantified modal and tense logic under Montagues supervision (Tense and Modal Logic: A Study in the Topology of Temporal Reference). Cocchiarellas interest in the philosophy of time had initially been aroused by Reichenbachs work on space and time but it was his acquaintance with Priors Time and Modality that swept him into tense-logical research. (Only later did he learn of Scotts work.) Priors visit coincided with Hans Kamps arrival at UCLA as a graduate student. Kamp attended Priors lectures on tense logic in his first semester and became deeply interested in the subject. These lectures led more or less directly to the topic of Kamps Ph.D. thesis, written under Montagues supervision and entitled On Tense Logic and the Theory of Order (1968). In Kamps work the development of tense logic achieved a new level of formal sophistication. Segerberg, too, had just arrived in California, to study under Scott at Stanford. (Segerberg had become interested in tense logic in Finland in 1964 at a series of summer seminars given by von Wright, who was independently pursuing a tense logic that had arisen from his study of the logic of action and which was later shown to be equivalent to a system Prior had discussed in Time and Modality (Prior 1957: 23-4; see von Wright 1965 and Segerberg 1967, 1989).) In December of 1965 Scott delivered his famous talk to the Hume Society at Stanford entitled The Logic of Tenses. A multilith of Scotts handwritten notes for this talk has been circulating ever since among tense logicians. Four days later Prior himself addressed the Society, again on tense logic. It was in this fecund atmosphere that Prior completed the manuscript of his book Past, Present and Future, which remains to this day one of the most important references in the field.
The years 1965-7 saw the publication of work in tense logic by &Aqvist, Bull, Clifford, Cocchiarella, Garson, Geach, Hamblin, Luce, Makinson, Rescher, Segerberg, von Wright - and, of course, Prior. In a little over a decade Priors invention had become an internationally pursued branch of logic.
Prior always had a firm belief that his tense logic would one day find useful application in other disciplines (possibly in mathematical physics, he thought). When the outside demand for tense logic did come it was from computer science. An early and influential application was by Pnuelli, who employed tense logic in formal reasoning about the behaviour of concurrent programs (Pnuelli 1977). (A concurrent program is one that governs the behaviour of a number of interacting processors running in parallel.) Pnuelli is sometimes mistakenly credited with having originated tense logic but in fact he first learned of it from the classic volume Temporal Logic by Rescher and Urquhart (1971) (Ohrstrom and Hasle 1995: 344). This volume is dedicated to Prior and is an elegant introduction to his work.
Prior would not have been completely surprised to learn how useful tense logic is proving to be in computer science. He himself took little interest in computing beyond including material on elementary boolean circuit theory in his undergraduate lectures, but a number of the logicians with whom he was in touch were more deeply involved (Dov Gabbay and Dana Scott, for instance). Through others Prior knew something of the potential. He wrote "There are practical gains to be had from this study too, for example in the representation of time-delay in computer circuits" (1996a: 46). In Past, Present and Future he remarked concerning logics of discrete time that their usefulness "does not depend on any serious metaphysical assumption that time is discrete; they are applicable in limited fields of discourse in which we are concerned only with what happens next in a sequence of discrete states, e.g. in the workings of a digital computer" (1967: 67). Other logics from the group that he and von Wright pioneered are also finding computational applications, for example epistemic logic in Artificial Intelligence and knowledge-base engineering, and the logic of action in programming theory.
It is noteworthy that two of the major forces in the genesis of
these software technologies were a love of ancient and medieval logic
and a concern to make conceptual room for freedom of the human
will. Only people who know little of the history of ideas will find
any incongruity here. Would that those who now control and administer
the funding of university research were less unaware of the oblique
ways in which idea gives rise to idea.
Early in 1951 Prior read von Wrights article Deontic Logic, and the penultimate chapter of The Craft contains a cameo discussion of this topic. Von Wrights influence is also clear in the paper Prior read in August of that same year to the AAP Conference in Sydney, entitled The Ethical Copula. Here Prior discusses and defends the parallel von Wright drew in Deontic Logic between moral words and modal words. No doubt Prior found in deontic logic a significant connection between his existing interest in ethics and his fast-developing interest in modal logic.
Priors reading of von Wright reinforced in his mind an idea that he had come across in Peter of Spain, Isaac Watts and the Port Royal Logic, an idea that was to be of considerable importance for his own future work. What von Wright calls the alethic modes - necessity, possibility, impossibility and contingency - are members of an extended group of concepts that includes the epistemic modes (it is known that, it is not known to be false that, etc.), the doxastic modes (for example it is believed that), and the deontic modes (such as it is permitted that and it is obligatory that). In The Craft Prior also lists Watts it is written that and it is said that, noting that "one could think of innumerable others" (p.749). Later von Wright was to draw attention to what may be called the agentive modes: the agent brings it about that, the agent makes it true that, and the like (von Wright 1963). Prior introduces the collective term quasi-modals for the non-alethic modes (p.749) and remarks, accurately, that "there is a hint of a large field here" (p.752). He was later to refer to his own tense operators as quasi-modal operators (1968: 138). By the time he wrote Formal Logic he was advocating the study of "the general modal form It is -- that p; ... as a distinct propositional form", observing that "this field has not been much cultivated" (1955a: 218). Between them Prior and von Wright pioneered the now much investigated field of general intensional logic, as it may be called, in which the syntax, and latterly the semantics, developed for the study of the alethic modalities is used in the analysis of a wide range of quasi-modal concepts. Von Wrights deontic logic and Priors tense logic were the first major successes in this field. Another has been the logic of action or the logic of the agentive modes.
Prior was convinced that no satisfactory metalinguistic analysis can be given of sentences having the general modal form It is -- that p. In Formal Logic he writes "It is quite plain, for example, that I am not talking about the sentence Socrates is dead; when I say I wish that Socrates were dead; " (1955a: 219). In Time and Modality he reiterates the point, now in connection with the tenses: "Professor Carnap will be flying to the moon; ... is quite obviously a statement about Professor Carnap, and quite obviously not a statement about the statement Professor Carnap is flying to the moon" (1957: 8). What, then, is the semantic value of an expression replacing p in a sentence of the general modal form It is -- that p? Certainly not a truth value, as is the case with the standard extensional propositional calculus, for substituting a different expression with the same truth value into the sentence of the form It is -- that p may alter the truth value of the latter sentence. Priors answer - and in a sense it amounts to a rejection of the question - is that modal functions take propositions as arguments, but propositions are logical constructions. All sentences containing the word proposition - including such sentences as A modal operator expresses a function from propositions to truth values - mean no more and no less than sentences which contain neither that word nor an equivalent. In essence Priors view is that there are intensional contexts but no intensions. For the last six years of his life Prior worked on a book that was to give systematic expression to his views on propositions. The incomplete manuscript, which Prior had entitled Objects of Thought, was published posthumously in 1971.
Of the four technical papers that marked the explosive beginning of Priors career as a formal logician in 1952, two concern modal logic. Modality De Dicto and Modality De Re is a discussion of this distinction as it appears in Aristotle, Ockham and Peter of Spain together with a comparison of these earlier views with those of von Wright in An Essay on Modal Logic. In What Sense is Modal Logic Many-Valued? proposes an interpretation of Lukasiewiczs four-valued matrices for modal logic. This paper marked the beginning of Priors study of Lukasiewiczs work on modality. Thereafter he read Lukasiewicz widely - even material in Polish, of which he said "the symbols are so illuminating that the fact that the text is incomprehensible doesnt much matter". In the Preface to Time and Modality he wrote "[W]hile I differed radically from the late Professor Lukasiewicz on the subject of modal logic, my debt to him will be obvious on almost every page".
Priors detailed contributions to the development of modal logic are legion. At least one aspect of his work has not received the recognition it deserves. Prior and his collaborator Carew Meredith invented crucial elements of the possible worlds semantics for propositional modal logic several years ahead of Kripke, including the all-important binary relation which opens the way to modelling systems of different strengths. (Meredith was a lecturer in mathematics at Trinity College, Dublin, whose interest in logic was stimulated by the arrival of Lukasiewicz in Dublin shortly after the war.)
The invention is foreshadowed in the penultimate chapter of The Craft.
For the similarity in behaviour between signs of modality and signs of quantity, various explanations may be offered. It may be, for example, that signs of modality are just ordinary quantifiers operating upon a peculiar subject-matter, namely possible states of affairs ... It would not be quite accurate to describe theories of this sort as reducing modality to quantity. They do reduce modal distinctions to distinctions of quantity, but the variables to which the quantifiers are attached retain something modal in their signification - they signify possibilities, chances, possible states of affairs, possible combinations of truth-values, or the like. (pp. 736-7.)As sources for this idea Prior cites John Wallis (a seventeenth century logician) and the account of logically necessary and logically impossible propositions given by Wittgenstein in the Tractatus (p.737). Interestingly, he mentions Carnap only in a footnote: "Professor Carnap has a similar definition of logical necessity in terms of what he calls state-descriptions" (ibid). Prior does not refer to, and presumably had not at that time read, Carnaps 1946 paper Modalities and Quantification, which attempted a semantics for quantified S5 in terms of state-descriptions. (A state-description is a class of sentences satisfying certain conditions. Each state-description represents a possible state of affairs.) Carnap too cites the Tractatus account of modal propositions as his inspiration (1946: 47). Prior goes on to defend his account of modality as quantification over possible states of affairs against various alternatives, for example the Andersonian account, according to which Every table here is necessarily brown means There is a property which every table here in fact possesses, and of which it is true that everything that possesses it is in fact brown. (John Anderson, Professor at the University of Sydney, was a leading figure in the development of philosophy in Australasia.)
In 1956 Prior wrote up his and Merediths formal work on what he later described (1962a: 140) as the logic of world-accessibility, in a paper entitled Interpretations of Different Modal Logics in the "Property Calculus" (Meredith and Prior 1996). It carries the attribution C.A.M., August 1956; recorded and expanded A.N.P.. Prior circulated the paper in mimeograph form. He mentions it in Past, Present and Future (1967: 42-5) and in his 1962 articles Possible Worlds and Tense-Logic and the Continuity of Time. This paper is one of the earliest to employ a binary relation between possible states of affairs in order to discriminate between S5 and weaker systems. (Carnaps 1946 paper concerned only S5 and contained no such relation.)
The property calculus is essentially a variation of Priors 1954 l-calculus described above. In the l-calculus tense-modal propositions are treated as predicates expressing properties of dates, and quantification theory is supplemented with various special axioms for a binary relation l taking dates as arguments. In the modal version of the calculus sentences of modal logic are treated as if they express properties of certain objects a, b, c, etc. Objects are related by a binary relation U. (Prior and Meredith supply no account of what a formula of form Uab might express.) The following definitions of necessity L and possibility M are given (pa indicates that object a has the property expressed by the sentence p):
(Lp)a = (b)(Uab pb)The calculus consists of ordinary quantification theory supplemented by these definitions, together with certain axioms governing the relation U, and the following clauses:
(Mp)a = (b)(Uab & pb).
(-p)a = -(pa)It is implied that a modal proposition A is to be called a theorem of the calculus if and only if Aa is provable for an arbitrarily chosen object a.
(p q)a = (pa) (qa).
Axioms for U are selected from a list containing (amongst others):
1. Uaa (U is reflexive)(Axiom 2 is also present in the l-calculus.) Prior and Meredith establish that the distribution principle L(p q) (Lp Lq) is a theorem in the absence of any special axioms for U; that Lp p is a theorem if axiom 1 is imposed; that axiom 2 gives the S4 principle Lp LLp; and that 2 together with 3 give the S5 principle MLp Lp. (Their approach is proof-theoretic in its basic orientation and they offer no completeness results.) In 1962a and 1962b Prior extends the approach to systems between S4 and S5 and systems independent of S4 between T and S5.
2. Uab (Ubc Uac) (U is transitive)
3. Uab Uba (U is symmetrical).
As previously remarked, the idea that the variables of quantification of the calculus should range over possible states of affairs or possible worlds is present in The Craft. In 1960, following a suggestion by Geach, Prior began thinking of U as a relation of accessibility between worlds. Prior tells us that Geach cashed out the notion of reaching one world from another in terms of some dimension-jumping vehicle dreamed up by science fiction (1962b: 36; see also 1962a: 140). (Geach referred to the whole business as Trans World Airlines.) With this interpretation of U to hand, the property calculus can be viewed as treating (Lp)a - or Necessarily-p in world a - as short for p is true in all worlds accessible from a. Lemmon, in a draft of material intended for his and Dana Scotts projected book Intensional Logic, mistakenly credits Geach with the idea that the binary relation may be intuitively thought of as a relation between possible worlds. In a letter to Scott, written after Lemmons death in 1966, Prior remarked: "What Geach contributed was not the interpretation of [U] as a relation between worlds (God knows when that started), but the interpretation of [U] as a relation of accessibility". When Prior says "God knows when that started" he is presumably referring to the idea that the objects of the calculus be regarded as possible worlds. Prior was right to think that the history of this idea is a tangled one. Priority is often assigned to Leibniz, but scholars have now traced the idea back to Duns Scotus and William of Ockham (Knuuttila 1993).
It seems that the binary relation first made its appearance in a 1951 article by Jonsson and Tarski, Boolean Algebras with Operators. In their Theorem 3.14 they establish that every closure algebra is isomorphic to an algebraic system formed by a set and a reflexive and transitive relation between its elements; their Theorem 3.5 considers also a symmetry condition. In hindsight these theorems (which explicitly concern boolean algebras, of course) can be viewed as in effect a treatment of all the basic modal axioms and corresponding properties of the accessibility relation. Concerning this article Saul Kripke has remarked:
Had they known they were doing modal logic, they would have had the completeness problem for many of the modal propositional systems wrapped up, and some powerful theorems. Mathematically they did this, but it was presented as algebra with no mention of semantics, modal logic, or possible worlds, let alone quantifiers. When I presented my paper at the conference in Finland in 1962, I emphasized the importance of this paper. Tarski was present, and said that he was unable to see any connection with what I was doing!
During the next eight years the binary relation was reinvented by a number of logicians. Prior, in his address to a conference in Wellington in 1954, seems to have been the first to use the binary relation in an explicitly tense-modal context. Other landmarks were an address by Montague to a conference held at UCLA in 1955, Prior and Merediths property calculus of 1956, and Kanger (1957), Hintikka (1957, 1961) and Kripke (1959a, 1959b, 1963). Kripke was familiar with Kangers work involving the binary relation at the time he obtained his own results. Kanger himself had read the 1951 paper by Jonsson and Tarski and he describes his results as similar to theirs (Kanger 1957: 39). My forthcoming paper Possible Worlds: the Pre-Kripkean Era gives a fuller account of the history of the possible worlds semantics.
It was through reading Priors paper Modality and Quantification in S5 in 1956 that Kripke first became interested in modal logic. He was at this time still a schoolboy, working on logic in almost complete isolation in Omaha, Nebraska. In 1958 he read Time and Modality and was impressed by the parallel Prior drew between tense and the alethic modalities. (At almost exactly the same time Prior was reading Kripkes first paper, A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic, in his capacity as referee for The Journal of Symbolic Logic.) Kripke suspects that it was his reading of Time and Modality that first interested him in the problem of treating variable domains (a constant domain is assumed in A Completeness Theorem in Modal Logic). Kripke worked on Priors idea that variable domains might lead to truth-value gaps even at the level of propositional logic, although he did not pursue this approach in his published material. (This idea was the motivation for Priors system Q.) Kripke thinks it probable that it was Priors work on many-valued matrices in Time and Modality which gave him the idea that a possible worlds model can be converted to a many-valued matrix (an idea he developed in his 1963 paper Semantical Analysis of Modal Logic I: Normal Modal Propositional Calculi).
Kripke wrote to Prior (September 3, 1958) pointing out an error in Time and Modality: contrary to Priors claim, the Diodoran matrix (1957: 23) is not characteristic of S4. In his letter Kripke gave a characteristic matrix for S4 involving the idea that in a non-deterministic universe time branches into the future. He wrote:
[I]n an indetermined system, we perhaps should not regard time as a linear series, as you have done. Given the present moment, there are several possibilities for what the next moment may be like - - and for each possible next moment, there are several possibilities for the moment after that. Thus the situation takes the form, not of a linear sequence, but of a tree.This is essentially no more than a tensed interpretation of Kripkes relational semantics for S4, as he himself points out in the letter. Prior was excited by the letter and passed it on to Ivo Thomas and John Lemmon. Kripke wrote again on October 13, 1958. (The letters may still be seen in the Bodleian Library, Oxford. They are discussed in Ohrstrom and Hasle (1993).)
Priors M.A. thesis, in which he criticised subjectivist and formalist approaches to logic, was awarded only a second by the external examiner. Fortunately Findlay knew a budding logician when he saw one and secured Prior an assistant lectureship at Otago. During 1937 Prior gave courses on logic, ethics, and probability theory. In December of that year his first published paper - arguing that a nation is a logical construction out of individuals - appeared in the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy.
At this point Prior temporarily abandoned his academic career and spent three bohemian years wandering in Britain and Europe. He returned to New Zealand at the end of 1940, and on emerging from the air force in 1945 he applied for a vacant lectureship at Canterbury University College in Christchurch. By now he had a further three articles in the Australasian Journal of Psychology and Philosophy (Can Religion be Discussed?, The Meaning of Good and The Subject of Ethics) and with a strong recommendation from Findlay Prior got the job. He started work in February 1946. (The vacancy Prior filled was created by the departure from New Zealand of Karl Popper. Prior and Popper were never colleagues. Apart from Priors attendance at some of Poppers Workers Educational Association lectures in 1943 there was no contact between the two men.)
At Canterbury Prior was thrown entirely on his own resources, being as he put it "the only philosopher about the place". He bore the responsibility for providing a broad and balanced philosophy curriculum, yet his own formal education in philosophy had stopped short nine years previously. Priors one recourse in the face of isolation was to read, and read he did. In logic he began by returning to W.E. Johnson. Next came J.N. Keyness Studies and Exercises in Formal Logic and then (in his own phrase) he got stuck into Principia Mathematica. He learned a lot about the history of the subject from Peirce, whom he found "unexpectedly magnificent". An important discovery, in 1950, was Bochenskis Precis de Logique Mathematique. Prior was fascinated by the very neat symbolic notation due to Lukasiewicz, and before long he turned his back completely on the more usual Peano-Russell notation. Bochenski was later to describe Prior as even more of a CCCC-logician than he was himself. (In Lukasiewiczs parenthesis-free notation Cpq is written for If p then q, Kpq for Both p and q, Apq for Either p or q, Epq for If and only if p then q, Np for Not p.) Lukasiewiczs own Aristotles Syllogistic and Tarskis Introduction to Logic soon followed. By now the logic bug had well and truly bitten. Prior saw from the work of the Poles that formal precision is possible in philosophy and this delighted him. The upshot of Priors reading for the curriculum was that his students learned Aristotelian and medieval logic, using Polish notation and with Bochenskis Precis de Logique Mathematique as a text. "Despite the language difficulty, I have found this a first-class textbook to accompany lectures to New Zealand students", he declared (1952c: 35).
An exuberant, playful man of seemingly inexhaustible vitality, Prior made an excellent teacher. He had no trace of pomposity or pretension. His students appreciated the friendly welcome they would receive at his home, not to mention his relaxed attitude toward the administrative paraphernalia of roll-taking and the like. In those days Canterbury University College was a formal, stuffy place and Prior was a breath of fresh air for his students. In a milieu where jacket and tie were the norm even in a sweltering New Zealand summer, Prior would lecture in baggy khaki shorts and roman sandles. Jim Wilson recalls the friendly informality of Priors first-year classes:
The strained precision of clock time was alien to him, so he was usually late for his own lectures (or anyone elses for that matter - he was very egalitarian about it). But he almost always turned up eventually, thinning hair blown vertical by his dash on his bike when he remembered the time. He would pull cycle clips off his trousers and plonk an ancient shopping bag on the desk in front of him. Out of this bag would come ... a cabbage, a bunch of carrots, a loaf of bread, a bottle of milk ... until, always at the bottom, he would find the book he was looking for. Back into the bag went the rest of the goodies, then he would look up at us, apologise for being late if he was more than usually so, and ask: "Now where were we last time?" Someone in the front row would consult her or his notes - Arthur couldnt as he never had any - and would say "You were just dealing with such and such." "Ah yes, thank you" Arthur would respond, and forthwith launch into an extempore exposition which followed on perfectly from the previous session and was beautifully structured and clear even though he was just thinking along with us. And of course we could stop him and ask for clarification or elaboration at any time, without in the slightest affecting the overall structure and direction of his thoughts.Soon after his discovery of Precis de Logique Mathematique Prior wrote to Bochenski in Fribourg and then, a little later, to Lukasiewicz in Dublin. He was excited to receive replies. "We are, all of us, very isolated, being few and scattered", wrote Bochenski. "It is a real pleasure to hear that a Colleague so far away is interested in the same problems you are working at and that he finds ones little writings may be of some use." Thus began Priors voluminous correspondence with logicians the world over. There were other ways, too, in which his isolation lessened. In 1951 he met and became friends with John Mackie and Jack Smart, at a conference in Sydney. This was Priors first experience of being among a large gathering of philosophers and Mary Prior describes the conference as his entry into a wider world. In the same year George Hughes was appointed to the Victoria University of Wellington. Prior and Hughes had to make the most of their all-too-infrequent meetings, sometimes talking until the birds woke. Prior was fortunate in having a number of excellent students during these early years, among them Jonathan Bennett, Ronald Butler and (a little later) Robert Bull. For Prior they were oases in the desert. In 1952 he gained an assistant lecturer, Sandy Anderson. The following year philosophy became a department in its own right and Prior was made Professor.
1949 saw the publication of Priors first book, a slim but potent volume entitled Logic and the Basis of Ethics. It was published by the Clarendon Press and soon became prominent in Oxford. Austin liked it and Ryle approved of "Priors complete lack of mugwumpery". In the Introduction Prior explains that by the logic of ethics he means "not a special kind of logic, nor a special branch of logic, but an application of it", and the book is a vigorous examination of the arguments of each side in the naturalism/anti-naturalism debate.
Logic and the Basis of Ethics contains no symbolism, and Priors phrase the logic of ethics is little more than a battle cry. The few technical concepts that are introduced all pertain to syllogistic logic. It was not until 1952 that Prior began publishing papers in symbolic logic - four of them, suddenly, in the same year. At the unusually late age of 38 Prior had become a formal logician. He wrote these papers while completing the manuscript of what was intended to be his second book, The Craft of Formal Logic. (The manuscript of The Craft of Formal Logic is deposited in the Bodleian Library, Oxford.) This began life in 1949 as a Dictionary of Formal Logic, but at the advice of the Clarendon Press Prior soon switched to a more orthodox format. His logical interests veered sharply while he was writing The Craft. To sixteen chapters on the logic of categoricals, hypotheticals, terms and relations are added, almost as an afterthought, one on modal logic and one on the axiomatic method. Prior finished the manuscript in December 1951 and sent it to the Clarendon Press; fourteen months later they wrote agreeing to publish the book if Prior would both shorten it and give greater emphasis to modern logic. He undertook to make the changes but ended up writing a completely different book. This was finally published in 1955 with the title Formal Logic; it ran into a second edition in 1962. Parts of The Craft not absorbed into the later work were published posthumously under the title The Doctrine of Propositions and Terms.
Steeped in Polish notation and the axiomatic method, Formal Logic typifies Priors mature work. It teaches, enthusiastically yet without fuss, that there was life - fascinating life - before the here and now of logic. What Prior once wrote admiringly of Lukasiewicz is no less true of Prior himself: having done very distinguished work as a mathematical logician in the modern style, [he] is at the same time interested in the history of his subject ... and contrives both to use modern techniques to bring out more clearly what the ancients were driving at, and to learn from the ancients useful logical devices which the moderns have in general forgotten (1952c: 37).
After Findlay, Lukasiewicz was the greatest single influence on Priors development as a logician. Priors 1952 review article Lukasiewiczs Symbolic Logic is one of the first papers in which he makes extensive use of symbolism. (He discusses Lukasiewiczs book Aristotles Syllogistic From the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic (published in 1951) and two articles, The Shortest Axiom of the Implicational Calculus of Propositions and On Variable Functions of Propositional Arguments.) Prior seems to have first learned of Lukasiewiczs work through Bochenskis writings (Bochenski was a pupil of Lukasiewicz). Lukasiewicz had devised an axiomatic treatment of Aristotles reduction of the imperfect syllogistic moods to those of the first figure, which Prior encountered in Bochenskis Precis de Logique Mathematique (published in 1949). This enchanted Prior. He was taking his students through the derivations as early as 1951, and he summarises Lukasiewiczs system in the final chapter of The Craft. Throughout this chapter he makes extensive use of Lukasiewiczs symbolic notation. It was Lukasiewiczs axiomatic treatment of traditional logic that fully brought home to Prior the power of modern symbolic methods. Moreover it was probably his reading of Lukasiewicz that made clear to him the fundamental importance of propositional logic. "It seems that Aristotle did not suspect the existence of another system of logic besides his theory of the syllogism", Lukasiewicz had written, "[y]et he uses intuitively the laws of propositional logic ..." (1951: 49). (Lukasiewiczs axiomatisation of the syllogistic incorporates his own three-axiom formalisation of propositional logic (1951: 80).) In his review Prior quotes approvingly Lukasiewiczs assertion that "the logic of the Stoics, the inventors of the ancient form of the propositional calculus, was much more important than all the syllogisms of Aristotle" (1951: 131). In The Craft propositional logic is barely mentioned until the final chapter, whereas Formal Logic begins with a thorough introduction to the subject. On page 3 of Formal Logic Prior states that the logic of propositions is "basic, and the rest of logic built upon it". Priors interest in economical bases for propositional and pure implicational logics, initially aroused by his study of Peirce, was stimulated by Lukasiewiczs article The Shortest Axiom of the Implicational Calculus of Propositions and the opening chapters of Formal Logic draw heavily on Lukasiewiczs work in this area.
In 1954 Gilbert Ryle visited New Zealand. He brought Prior an invitation to visit Oxford and deliver the John Locke lectures. Prior arranged a twelve month leave of absence from Canterbury and arrived in Oxford at the beginning of 1956. Rather quickly a small group began to form around him: Ivo Thomas, John Lemmon, Peter Geach. (These meetings with Prior were Lemmons first introduction to modal logic.) Hughes summarises the news of him that was arriving back home: "this wild colonial boy just hit Oxford and started to gather around him the main people [interested in] logic, and he started to organise a lot of parties, almost, for the serious doing of logic." Prior kitted out his tiny rented flat with a toyshop blackboard and held open house. On Mondays during Hilary and Trinity terms Prior lectured on modal logic, his great passion, and on tense logic, his great invention. The lectures were published the following year, under the title Time and Modality.
In the summer break following the John Locke lectures Prior organised a Logic Colloquium in Oxford. In Britain in the 1950s logic was deeply out of fashion and its practitioners were isolated and somewhat demoralised. As Prior wrote shortly after the Colloquium "There are logicians in England and Ireland; but it must be admitted that they are somewhat scattered, and so far as I could gather they had never had any general get-together" (1956b: 186). Priors Colloquium brought together Lemmon, Thomas, Geach, M. Kneale, W.C. Kneale, Lewy, Smiley, Bennett, Lejewski, M.W. Dick, Faris, Nidditch, Carew Meredith, David Meredith, and others. It was all a huge success, and the Colloquium became a regular fixture. Through his John Locke lectures, the Colloquium, and his numerous visits around the country, Prior helped to revitalise British logic. The group he left behind saw similarities between themselves and the close-knit group of researchers that existed in Warsaw before 1939.
Priors heart may have been heavy as he journeyed back to New Zealand. After twelve months of logical companionship on a grand scale, life at Canterbury must have seemed a bleak prospect. He was seething with enthusiasm for logic and threw himself once more into a massive correspondence, but it could no longer satisfy him. Prior pined. When the offer arrived of a newly established second chair at the University of Manchester he snatched it up. Prior left New Zealand in December 1958.
He was at Manchester for seven years. In 1966 Anthony Kenny recommended him for a fellowship at Balliol. The move would mean a drop in both status and salary, not to mention an increase in teaching, but Prior did not hesitate. His sabbatical in Oxford had been one of his happiest years. This is the good life, he told George Hughes once he was settled in at Balliol. He felt he simply belonged. Prior soon built up a reputation for being one of the best teachers in Oxford - though his students were sometimes surprised to be given eighteenth century moralists to read instead of books by the currently fashionable.
Just before his departure from Manchester Prior told Tom Richards, a visiting New Zealander, that he was going to Oxford with a mission. Priors own work was an exemplary fusion of philosophy and logic, and he went to Oxford with the intention of interesting the mathematical logicians in philosophy and the philosophers in mathematical logic. The time was right; and Prior spared no energy in preaching his message:
[F]ormal logic and general philosophy have more to bring to one another than is sometimes supposed. I do not mean by saying this to underrate the work of those who have explored the properties of symbolic calculi without any concern as to what they might be used to mean ... Nor do I mean to underrate what recent philosophers have done in the way of exploring the obstinate and intricate logic embedded in common discourse, even when they have not derived or sought to derive anything like a calculus from it ... But these activities are, or can be, related to one another very much as theory and observation are in the physical sciences; and I must confess to a hankering after well-constructed theories which much contemporary philosophy fails to satisfy. (1957: vii.)
Prior did not live to enjoy the entente cordiale between philosophy and logic that he helped usher in. His health began to let him down during his second year at Balliol. He was found to have both angina pectoris and polymyalgic rheumatism. During the autumn of 1969 the rheumatism grew steadily worse. He was at this time on sabbatical at the University of Oslo. The pain left him with no zest for work. He dutifully gave his weekly seminars and spent the remainder of his time brooding savagely on how painful it was to do such elementary things as put on a coat. His hosts made him an appointment with a rheumatologist, who prescribed cortisone. In a letter written a few days later, and a few days before his heart failed, Prior described himself as one of the miracles of modern medicine. "Ive been sleeping well ... running up and down stairs ... I can stand on one leg and put a sock on the other (first time for months) ... theyve got me cured now and Im fine."
Table of Contents
First published: October 7, 1996
Content last modified: November 29, 1999