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Charles Sanders Peirce

Charles Sanders Peirce (1839-1914) was the founder of American pragmatism (later called by Peirce "pragmaticism"), an extender of the Scotistic theory of signs (called by Peirce "semeiotic"), an extraordinarily prolific logician and mathematician, and a developer of an evolutionary, psycho-physically monistic metaphysical system. A practicing chemist and geodesist by profession, he nevertheless considered scientific philosophy, and especially logic, to be his vocation. In the course of his polymathic researches, he wrote on a wide range of topics, ranging from mathematical logic to psychology.

Brief Biography

Charles Sanders Peirce was born on September 10, 1839 in Cambridge, Massachusetts, and died on April 19, 1914 in Milford, Pennsylvania. His writings extend from about 1857 until near his death, a period of approximately 57 years. His published works run to about 12,000 printed pages and his known unpublished manuscripts run to about 80,000 handwritten pages. The topics on which he wrote have an immense range, from mathematics and the hard sciences at one extreme, to economics, psychology, anthroplogy, history of science, and the theory of signs, at the other extreme.

Peirce’s father Benjamin was Professor of Mathematics at Harvard University and was one of the founders of the U. S. Coast and Geodetic Survey as well as one of the founders of the Smithsonian Institution. The department of mathematics at Harvard was essentially built by Benjamin. From Bejamin Peirce Charles Sanders Peirce received most of the substance of his early education as well as a good deal of intellectual encouragement and stimulation. Benjamin’s didactic technique mostly took the form of setting interesting problems and checking Charles’s solutions of them, and in this instructional atmosphere Charles learned his lifelong habit of thinking through problems entirely on his own. To this habit, perhaps, is to be attributed Charles Peirce’s originality.

Peirce graduated from Harvard in 1859 and received the bachelor of science degree in chemistry in 1863. From 1859 until late 1891 he was employed by the U. S. Coast and Geodetic Survey, mainly doing geodetic investigations. From 1879 until 1884, Peirce maintained a second job teaching logic in the Department of Mathematics at Johns Hopkins University. At the time the Department of Mathematics was headed by the famous mathematician J. J. Sylvester. This job suddenly evaporated for reasons apparently connected with the fact that Peirce’s second wife was a gypsy, and a gypsy moreover with whom he had apparently cohabited before marriage. This was Peirce’s only academic employment, and after losing it Peirce worked thereafter only for the U. S. Coast and Geodetic Survey. This employment was lost in late 1891 because of funding worries generated in Congress. Thereafter, Peirce eked out a living doing odd-jobs and consulting work (mainly in chemical engineering and analysis). For the remainder of his life Peirce was often in dire financial straits, and sometimes he managed to survive only because of the charity of friends, for example William James.

At age 12 Charles read a standard textbook on logic by Bishop Richard Whately, and he began reading Immanuel Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason at age 13. After three years of careful study of Kant, Peirce concluded that Kant’s system was vitiated by what he called its "puerile logic," and about the age of 16 he formed the fixed intention of devoting his life to the study of and research in logic. Although it was impossible to earn a living as a research logician, his adoption of the profession of chemistry and his practice of the profession of geodesy allowed Charles to continue for many years to engage in researches on logic. One of his logical systems was the basis for Ernst Schroeder’s three-volume treatise on logic, the Vorlesungen ueber die Algebra der Logik, and Peirce became widely regarded as the greatest logician of his day. By all who are familiar with his work he is considered one of the greatest logicians who ever lived.

Despite Peirce’s early disagreements with Kant’s position, Peirce continued to respect and read the first Critique throughout his life, and his ultimate philosophical position has much in common with the transcendental idealism of Kant, as well as with the objective idealism of Hegel. Like Kant, Peirce even developed a set of ultimate categories (more on which later).

Difficulty of Access to Peirce’s Writings

Peirce’s extensive publications are scattered among various publication media, and have been difficult to collect. Shortly after his death in 1914, his widow Juliette sold his unpublished manuscripts to the Department of Philosophy at Harvard University. Initially they were under the care of Josiah Royce, but after Royce’s death in 1916, and especially after the end of the First World War, the papers were poorly cared for. Many of them were misplaced, lost, given away, scrambled, and the like. Carolyn Eisele, one of several heroes in a great effort to locate and assemble Peirce’s writings, reports having found a lost trunk of Peirce’s papers only in the mid-1950’s; it had, apparently for decades, been secreted in an unlit, obscure part of the basement in Harvard’s Widener Library.

In the 1930’s volumes of The Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce began to appear, and for almost three decades these volumes, and collections of entries culled from them were the only generally available source for Peirce’s thoughts. Unfortunately, many of the entries in the Collected Papers are not integral pieces of Peirce’s own design, but rather pieces that were cobbled together by the editors from different Peircean sources. Often a single entry will consist of stretches of writing from very different periods of Peirce’s intellectual life, and the stretches may be in tension or outright contradition with each other. Such entries not only make very difficult reading if one tries to regard them as consistent sustained passages of argument, but also tend to give a false picture of Peirce as unsystematic, desultory, and much more obscure than he really is.

The only intelligent way to publish the works Peirce is chronologically and with extremely careful editing. In such a fashion, entire Peircean works can be presented, and presented in their natural temporal setting. At last, but not until the 1980’s, there began to appear such a chronological edition of carefully selected works of Peirce: the Writings of Charles S. Peirce: a Chronological Edition. Though currently somewhat slowed by lack of proper funding, the Chronological Edition has succeeded in covering quite well in five volumes the major writings from 1857 to 1886. This achievement is finally making it posssible to assess the real Peirce, and in particular the development of his thinking from its earliest to its later stages. Questions long vexed in Peirce scholarship are finally beginning to be debated usefully by Peirce scholars: whether there is genuine systematic unity in Peirce’s thought, whether his ideas changed or developed over time and in what particulars his thought did change, when certain notions were developed by Peirce, whether there were definite "periods" in Peirce’s intellectual development, what exactly Peirce meant by some of his more obscure notions such as his universal categories (on which see below).

Deduction, Induction, and Abduction

Prior to about 1865, thinkers on logic commonly had divided arguments into two subclasses: the class of deductive arguments (a.k.a. necessary inferences) and the class of inductive arguments (a.k.a. probable inferences). About this time, Peirce began to hold that there were two utterly distinct classes of probable inferences, which he referred to as inductive inferences and abductive inferences (which he also called hypotheses and retroductive inferences). Peirce reached this conclusion by entertaining what would happen if one were to interchange propositions in the syllogism AAA-1 (Barbara): All M’s are P’s; All S’s are M’s; therefore, All S’s are P’s. This valid syllogism Peirce accepted as representative of deduction. But also seemed typically to regard it in connection with a problem of sampling theory. Let us regard being an M as being a member of a population of some sort, say being a ball of the population of balls in some urn. Let us regard P as being some property a member of this population can have, say being red. And, finally, let us regard being an S as being a member of a random sample taken from the population. Then our syllogism in Barbara becomes: All balls in this urn are red; All balls in this particular random sample are taken from this urn; therefore, All balls in this particular random sample are red. Peirce regarded the major premise here as being the Rule, the minor premise as being the particular Case, and the conclusion as being the Result of the argument. The argument is a piece of deduction (necessary inference): an argument from population to random sample.

Let us now see what happens if we form a new argument by interchanging the conclusion (the Result) with the major premise (the Rule). The resultant argument becomes: All S’s are P’s (Result); All S’s are M’s (Case); therefore, All M’s are P’s (Rule). This is the invalid syllogism AAA-3. But let us now regard it as pertaining to sampling theory. The argument becomes: All balls in this particular random sample are red; All balls in this particular random sample are taken from this urn; therefore, All balls in this urn are red. What we have here is an argument from sample to population, and this is what Peirce understood to be the core meaning of induction: argument from random sample to population.

Let us now go further and see what happens if, from the deduction AAA-1, we form a new argument by interchanging the conclusion (the Result) with the minor premise (the Case). The resultant argument becomes: All M’s are P’s (Rule); All S’s are P’s (Result); therefore, All S’s are M’s (Case). This is the invalid syllogism AAA-2. But let us now regard it as pertaining to sampling theory. The argument becomes: All balls in this urn are red; All balls in this particular random sample are red; therefore, All balls in this particular random sample are taken from this urn. What we have here is nothing at all like an argument from population to sample or an argument from sample to population: it is a form of probable argument entirely different from both deduction and induction. This new type of argument Peirce called abduction (also, retroduction, and also, hypothesis).

Over many years Peirce modified his views on the three types of arguments, sometimes changing his views but mostly just extending them. He seemed to have some hesitation, for example, about whether arguments from analogy were inductions (on properties of things) or abductions. The main extension of his earliest views involved integrating the argument forms into his view of the scientific method. In fact, his most mature position seemed almost to equate the three types of argument with three phases of the scientific method.

Pragmatism, Pragmaticism, and the Scientific Method

Probably Peirce’s best-known works are the first two articles in a series of six that were collectively entitled Illustrations of the Logic of Science and published in Popular Science Monthly in 1877 and 1878. The first is entitled "The Fixation of Belief" and the second is entitled "How to Make Our Ideas Clear." In the first Peirce defended, in a manner consistent with idealism, the superiority of the scientific method over other methods of overcoming doubt by "fixing belief." In the second Peirce defended the pragmatic/pragmaticistic notion of clear concepts.

Perhaps the single most important fact to keep in mind in understanding Peirce’s philosophy is that Peirce was a practicing physical scientist all his life, and that as he understood them, philosophy and logic were themselves also sciences. Moreover, he understood philosophy to be the philosophy of science and logic to be the logic of science (where "science" has its broadest sense, which is best captured by the German word Wissenschaft).

It is in this light that his specifications of the nature of pragmatism (which he later called "pragmaticism" in order to distinguish his own scientific philosophy from other conceptions and theories that were trafficked under the title "pragmatism") are to be understood. When he said that the whole meaning of a (clear) conception consists in the entire set of its practical consequences, he had in mind that a meaningful conception must have some experiential "cash value," capable of being specified as some sort of collection of possible empirical observations under specifiable conditions. Peirce insisted that the entire meaning of a meaningful conception consisted in the totality of such specifications of possible observations. For example, Peirce tended to spell out the meaning of dispositional properties such as "hard" or "heavy" by using the same sort of counterfactual constructions that, say, Hempel would use. Peirce was not a simple operationalist or verificationist, but his views were akin to operationalism and verificationism.

The previous point is related to the fact that Peirce was always a philosopher who had broad and deep affinities with idealism. Indeed, having rejected a great deal in Kant, Peirce nevertheless shared with Kant the view that the Ding an sich plays no role in philosophy or science other than that of a Grenzbegriff, or, perhaps a bit more accuratedly, a limiting concept. The notion can play no direct role in the sciences; science can deal only with phenomena, and all concepts must somehow be traceable back to phenomenological roots. Toward the end of his life Peirce began to regard himself as a thinker somewhat akin to Hegel, one of the avowed philosophical enemies of his youth. Peirce’s brand of idealism is of the Kantian "transcendental" sort; and, even when Peirce called himself or is called by others a "realist," it must be kept in mind that Peirce was always a realist of the Kantian "empirical" sort. His realism is similar to what Hilary Putnam has called "internal realism." (Peirce was also a realist in another sense: anti-nominalist. More on this is given below.)

From his earliest to his latest writings Peirce attacked all forms of epistemological foundationalism and in particular all form of Cartesianism. Philosophy must begin wherever it happens to be at the moment, he thought, and not at some ideal foundation, for example in private references. The only important thing in thinking scientifically is applying the scentific method itself. This method he held to be essentially public and reproducible in its activities, as well as self-correcting in following sense: No matter where different researchers may begin, as long as they follow the scientific method, their results will eventually converge toward the same result. (The pragmatic conception of meaning implies that two theories with exactly the same empirical content must have, despite superficial appearances, the same meaning.) This ideal point of convergence is what Peirce means by "the truth," and "reality" is simply what is meant by "the truth." That these notions of reality and truth are inherently idealist rather than realist in nature should need no special pleading.

Connected with Peirce’s anti-foundationalism is his insistence on the fallibility of particular achievements in science. Although the scientific method will eventually converge to something, nevertheless at any temporal point in inquiry we are only at a provisional stage of it and cannot ascertain how far off we may be from the limit to which we are somehow converging. This insistence on the fallibilism of human inquiry is connected with several other important ideas of Peirce’s, such as his tychism, his evolutionism, and his anti-determinism. (These will be discussed below.) Despite Peirce’s insistence on fallibilism, he is not an epistemological pessimist: indeed, quite the opposite: he tends to hold that every genuine question (that is, every question whose possible answers have empirical content) can be answered in principle, or at least should not be assumed to be unanswerable. For this reason, one his most important dicta is "Do not block the path of inquiry!"

Peirce described the scientific method as consisting of abduction, deduction, and induction, plus the economics of research. His understanding of the scientific method is not far different from the standard idea of the scientific method (which perhaps derives historically from William Whewell and Peirce) as being the method of constructing hypotheses, deriving consequences from these hypotheses, and then experimentally testing these hypotheses. (The main Peircean factor left out is Peirce’s notion of the economics of research.) Conversely, he increasingly came to understand the three types of inference as being the stages of the scientific method. For example, as Peirce came to extend and generalize his notion of abduction, abduction became defined as inference to and provisional acceptance of an explanatory hypothesis for the purposes of testing it. Abduction is not always inference to the best explanation, but it is always inference to some explanation or at least to something that clarifies or makes routine some information that has previously been "surprising," in the sense that we would not have routinely expected it, given our then-current state of knowledge. Deduction came to mean for Peirce the drawing of conclusions as to what observable phenomena should be expected if the hypothesis is correct. Induction came for him to mean the entire process of experimentation performed in service of hypothesis testing.

Peirce’s idea of the economy (or: the economics) of research is an ineliminable part of his idea of the scientific method. He understood that science always operates in some given historical and socio-economic context, in which context certain problems are paramount and other problems trivial or frivolous. He understood that in such a context some experiments may be crucial and others insignificant. He understood that the economic resources of the scientist are severely limited, while the "great ocean of truth" that lies undiscovered before us is infinite. Research resources, such as personnel, time, and apparatus, are costly; and it is irrational to squander them. He proposed, therefore, that careful consideration be paid to the problem of how to obtain the biggest epistemological "bang for the buck." In effect, the economics of research is akin to a cost/benefit analysis in connection with states of knowledge. Although this idea has been only little explored by Peirce scholars, Peirce himself regarded it as central to the scientific method and to the idea of rational behavior. It is connected with what he called "speculative rhetoric" or "methodeutic" (which will be discussed below).

Anti-determinism, Tychism, and Evolutionism

Against powerful currents of determinism that derived from the Enlightenment philosophy of the eighteenth century, Peirce urged that there was not the slightest scientific evidence for determinism and that there was considerable scientific evidence against it. Always by the words "science" and "scientific" Peirce understood reference to actual practice by scientists in the laboratory and the field, and not reference to entries in scientific textbooks. In attacking determinism, therefore, Peirce appealed to the evidence of the actual phenomena in laboratories and fields. Here, what is obtained as the actual observations (e.g. measurements) does not conform to some exact point or smooth function. For example, if we take, however carefully we may do so, a thousand measurements of some physical quantity, we will not obtain a thousand equal results, but rather only a distribution (usually a normal or Gaussian distribution of hundreds) of different results. Again, if we measure the value of an independent variable that we assume to depend on some given parameter, and if we let the parameter vary while we take successive measurements, the result will never be a smooth function (for example, a straight line or an ellipse); rather it will be a "jagged" result, to which we can at best fit a smooth function by using some clever method (for example, least-squares fitting). Moreover, the variation and inexactness of measurements become, Peirce maintained, the more pronounced and obtrusive the more refined and microscopic are our measurements. (Obviously, Peirce would not have been the least surprised by the results of measurements at the quantum level.)

What the facts of scientific practice tell us, then, is that, although the universe displays varying degrees of habit, that is to say of partial, varying, approximate, and statistical regularity, the universe does not display deterministic law, that is to say total, exact, non-statistical regularity. Moreover, the habits that nature displays appear in varying degrees of entrenchment: from the almost pure freedom and spontaneity of some processes of thought, at one end of the spectrum, to the nearly law-like behavior of large physical objects like planets, at the other end of the spectrum.

Science shows, then, that not everything is fixed by exact law (even if everything should be constrained to some extent by habit) and that spontaneity has an objective place in the universe. Peirce called this doctrine "tychism," a word taken from the Greek word for "chance" or "luck" or "what the gods choose to lay on one." Tychism is a fundamental part of Peirce’s view, and reference to his tychism provides an added reason for Peirce’s insisting on the irreducible fallibilism of inquiry. For nature is not a static world of law but rather a dynamic world that manifests considerable spontaneity. (Peirce would have regarded the irreducibility of quantum mechanics to some "hidden-variables" theory as being a mere matter of course.)

Three figures from the history of culture loomed exceedingly large in the intellectual atmosphere of the period in which Peirce was most active: Hegel in philosophy, Lyell in geology, and Darwin (along with Watson) in biology. These thinkers have a single theme in common: evolution. Hegel described an evolution of ideas, Lyell an evolution of geological structures, and Darwin an evolution of biological species and varieties. Peirce’s thinking is deeply permeated with the evolutionary idea, which he extended beyond the confines of any particular subject matter. For Peirce, the entire universe is an evolutionary product; indeed, he conceived that even the most firmly entrenched of nature’s habits (for example, even those habits typically called "natural laws") have themselves evolved, and accordingly should be subjects of inquiry. One can sensibly seek evolutionary explanations of the existence of particular natural laws.

One possible path along which nature acquires its habits was explored by Peirce using statistical analysis in situations of non-Bernoullian trials. Peirce showed that, if we posit a primal habit in nature, viz. the tendency however slight to take on habits, then the result is often a high degree of regularity in the long run. For this reason, Peirce suggested that in the remote past nature was considerably more spontaneous than it later became, and that in general the habits nature has come to exhibit have evolved, just like ideas, geological formations, and biological species have evolved.

In this evolutionary notion of nature and natural law we have an additional support of Peirce’s insistence on the inherent fallibilism of scientific inquiry. Nature may simply change sometimes, even in its most entrenched fundamentals. Thus, even if scientists were at one point in time to have accurate conceptions about nature, this fact would not ensure that at some later point in time these same concpetions would remain accurate.

An especially intriguing and curious twist that Peirce’s evolutionism takes is what is called its "agapeism." According to Peirce, the most fundamental engine of the evolutionary process is not struggle, strife, greed, or competition. Rather it is nurturing love, in which an entity is prepared to sacrifice its own perfection for the sake of the wellbeing of its neighbor. This doctrine had both a social significance for Peirce, who apparently had the intention of arguing against the popular socio-economic Darwinism of the late nineteenth century, and a cosmic significance, which Peirce associated with the doctrine of the Gospel of John and with the mystical ideas of Swedenborg and Henry James. Peirce even argued that logicality in some sense presupposes the ethics of self-sacrifice.

Synechism, the Continuum, Infinites, and Infinitesimals

Peirce was the first scientific thinker, or at least one of the first scientific thinkers, to argue in favor of the actual existence of infinite sets. His criterion of the difference between finite and infinite sets was that the so-called "syllogism of transposed quantity" introduced by de Morgan applied only to finite sets and not to infinite ones. The syllogism of transposed quantity runs as follows. We have a binary relation R defined on a set S, such that the relation satisfies the following two properties (where the quantifications are taken over the set S). For all x there is a y such that Rxy. And for all x, y, z, Rxz and Ryz implies that x = y. The conclusion (of the syllogism of transposed quantity) is that for all x there exists a y such that Ryx. One of Peirce’s favorite examples helps elucidate the idea, even if it perhaps be not perfectly politically correct: Every Texan kills some Texan; no Texan is killed by more than one Texan; therefore every Texan is killed by some Texan. The argument’s conclusion follows only if the set of Texans is finite.

If for the relation R in question we take f(x) = y, where the function is defined on and has values in the set S, we can easily see that the syllogism of transposed quantity then says that no one-one function can map a set to a proper subset of itself. This assertion holds, of course, only for finite sets. So, as it turns out, Peirce’s definition of the difference between finite and infinite sets is (pretty close to) equivalent to the standard one.

Peirce held that the continuity of space, time, ideation, feeling, and perception is an irreducible deliverance of science, and that an adequate conception of the continuous is an extremely important part of all the sciences. This doctrine he called "synechism," a word deriving from the Greek preposition that means "(together) with." In mid-1892, somewhat under the influence of reading Cantor’s works, Peirce defined a (linear) continuum to be a linearly-ordered infinite set C such that (1) for any two distinct members of C there exists a third member of C that is strictly between these; and (2) every countably infinite subset of C that has an upper (lower) bound in C has a least upper bound (greatest lower bound) in C. The first property he called "Kanticity" and the second "Aristotelicity." (Today we would likely call these properties "density" and "closedness," respectively.) The second condition has the corollary that a continuum contains all its limit points, and sometimes Peirce used this property in conjunction with "Kanticity" to define a continuum. Toward the end of the nineteenth century Peirce remarked that he had framed an updated conception of continua by loosening his attachment to Cantor’s ideas, but what this new approach is has not yet been explored by Peirce scholars.

Not only did Peirce defend infinite magnitudes, but also he defended infinitesimal magnitudes. Moreover, he argued for the consistency of introducing infinitesimals into the number system, and he wanted to use infinitesimals to justify the traditional pre-Gaussian definitions and underpinnings of the differential calculus. He also made a number of remarks that suggest that, in connection with the foregoing enterprise, he had a novel conception of the topology of the real numbers. All these remarks he connected with his notion of the continuum and his previous defenses of infinite sets. For these reasons some Peirce scholars have suggested that his ideas were an anticipation of Abraham Robinson’s non-standard analysis. Whether this be so or not is, however, at the present time far from clear: so far no commentator has provided anything close to being a careful and detailed exposition of this point, and most of Peirce’s published writing on this topic is extremely obscure. The entire analysis of Peirce’s notion of an infinitesimal, as well as the exact bearing this notion has on his concept of continuity and on his idea of the topology of the real numbers, still awaits meticulous mathematical discussion.

Theory of Probability

In light of Peirce’s tychism and his view that statistical information is often the most exact information we can have about phenomena, it should not be surprising that Peirce devoted close attention to probability theory and statistical analysis. Indeed, Peirce not only extensively used the concept of probability but also offered a pragmatistic account of the notion of probability itself.

Peirce vigorously attacked the view of de Morgan that probability was a measure of our confidence or degree of belief: a view known today as the subjectivist theory of probability. Along with this attack, Peirce ridiculed various Bayesian-type analyses of the problem of induction (for example, the work of Quételet), on the grounds that the relevant Bayesian "prior probabilities" cannot be assigned unless one first assumes a subjectivist view and thus equates complete lack of information about something with that something’s having a probability of 1/2, which equation is an egregious error in Peirce’s estimation.

Rather than holding probability to be a measure of degree of confidence or belief, Peirce adopted an objectivist notion of probability that he likened to the doctrine of John Venn. Indeed, he held that probability is actually a notion with clear empirical content and clear empirical procedures for ascertaining that content, as follows. First, what is assigned a probability, insofar as the notion is used scientifically, is neither a proposition nor an event nor a type of event. Rather, what is assigned a probability is an argument, with premisses (Peirce insisted on this spelling rather than the spelling "premises") and a conclusion. Second, in order to ascertain the probability of a particular argument, the observer notes all occasions on which all of its premisses are true, case by case, just as they come under observation. For each of these occasions the observer notes whether the conclusion is true or not. The observer keeps an ongoing ratio whose numerator is the number of occasions so far observed on which the conclusion as well as the premisses are true and whose denominator is the number of occasions so far observed on which simply the premisses are true (irrespective of whether the conclusion is also true). At each observation the observer computes this ratio, which then encompasses all the observer’s past observations of occasions on which the premisses are true. The probability of the argument in question is defined by Peirce to be the limit of the crucial ratio as the number of observations tends to grow infinitely large (if this limit exists).

It might be thought that, when Peirce adopted the view of objective spontaneity and more or less entrenched objective habit in the universe (tychism), he perforce gave up the foregoing account of probability. Such a thought, however, would be a mistake; it rests failing to realize that objective attributions of probability for Peirce are consequent upon rather than inconsistent with his commitment to the pragmatistic account of probability that was given above.

Psycho-physical Monism and Anti-nominalism

Peirce held that science suggests that the universe has evolved from a condition of maximum freedom and spontaneity into its present condition, in which it has taken on a number of more and less entrenched habits. With pure freedom and spontaneity Peirce tended to associate mind, and with entrenched habits he tended to associate matter (or, more generally, the physical). Thus he tended to see the universe as the end-product-so-far of a process in which mind has acquired habits and has "congealed" (this is the very word Peirce used) into matter.

This notion of all things as being evolved psycho-physical unities of some sort places Peirce well within the sphere of what might be called "the grand old-fashioned metaphysicians," along with such thinkers as Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, Spinoza, Leibnitz, Hegel, Schopenhauer, Whitehead, et al. Some contemporary philosophers might be inclined to reject Peirce out of hand upon discovering this fact. Others might find his notion of psycho-physical unities not so offputting or indeed even attractive. What is crucial is that Peirce argued that mind pervades all of nature in varying degrees, and is not found merely in its most advanced animal species.

This pan-psychistic view, combined with synechism, meant for Peirce that mind is extended in some sort of continuum throughout the universe. Peirce tended to think of ideas as existing in mind in somewhat the same way as physical forms exist in physically extended things, and he even spoke of ideas as "spreading" out through the same continuum in which mind is extended. This set of conceptions is part of what Peirce regarded as (his version of) Scotistic realism, which he opposed to nominalism. He tended to blame what he regarded as the errors of much of the philosophy of his contemporaries as owing to the nominalistic disregard for the objective existence of form.

Triadism and the Universal Categories

Merely to say that Peirce was extremely fond of placing things into groups of three, of trichotomies, and of triadic relations, would fail miserably to do justice to the overwhelming obtrusiveness in his philosophy of the number three. Indeed, he made the most fundamental categories of all "things" of any sort whatsoever the categories of "Firstness," "Secondness," and "Thirdness," and he often described "things" as being "firsts" or "seconds" or "thirds." For example, with regard to the trichotomy "possibility," "actuality," and "necessity," possibility he called a first, actuality he called a second, and necessity he called a third. Again: quality was a first, fact was a second, and habit (or rule or law) was a third. Again: entity was a first, relation was a second, and representation was a third. Again: rheme (by which Peirce meant a relation of arbitrary adicity or arity) was a first, proposition was a second, and argument was a third. The list goes on and on. Let us refer to Peirce’s penchant for describing things in terms of trichotomies and triadic realtions as Peirce’s "triadism."

If Peirce had a general rationale for his triadism, Peirce scholars have not yet made it clear what this rationale might be. He seemed to base his triadism on what he called "phaneroscopy," by which word he meant the mere observation of phenomenal appearances. He regularly commented that the phenomena just do fall into three groups and that they just do display irreducibly triadic relations.

Although there are many examples of phenomena that do seem more or less naturally to divide into three groups, Peirce seems to have been driven by something more than mere examples in his insistence on applying his categories to almost everything imaginable. Perhaps it was the influence of Kant, whose twelve categories divide into four groups of three each. Perhaps it was the triadic structure of the stages of thought as described by Hegel, or even the triune commitments of orthodox Christianity (to which Peirce seemed to subscribe). Certainly involved was Peirce’s commitment to the ineliminability of mind in nature, for Peirce closely associated the activities of mind with a particular triadic relation that he called the "sign" relation. (More on this topic appears below.) Also involved was Peirce’s so-called "reduction thesis" in logic (on which more will given below), to which Peirce had concluded as early as 1870.

It is difficult to imagine even the most fervently devout of the passionate admirers of Peirce, of which there are many, saying that his account (or, more accurately, his various accounts) of the three universal categories is (or are) clear and compelling. Yet, in almost everything Peirce wrote from the time the categories were first introduced, they found a place. Their analysis and an account of their general rationale, if there be such, constitute chief problems in Peirce scholarship.

Mind and Semeiotic

Connected with Peirce’s insistence on the ubiquity of mind in the cosmos is the importance he attached to what he called "semeiotic," the theory of signs in the most general sense. Peircean semeiotic is almost totally different what has come to be called "semiotics," and which hales not so much from Peirce as from Saussure and Charles W. Morris. Peircean semeiotic derives ultimately from the theory of signs of Duns Scotus and its later development by John of St. Thomas (John Poirot). In Peirce’s theory the sign relation is a triadic relation, a special species of the genus: the representing relation. Whenever the representing relation has an instance, we find one thing (the "object") being represented by another thing (the "representamen") to (or: in) a third thing (the "interpretant"), and represented in such a way that the interpretant is thereby determined to be also a representamen of the object to yet another interpretant in the representation relation. Obviously, Peirce’s definition entails that we have an infinite sequence of representamens of an object whenever we have any one representamen.

The sign relation is the representing relation whenever the first interpretant (and consequently each member of the whole infinite sequence of interpretants) is a cognition of a mind. In any instance of the sign relation an object is signified by a sign to a mind. One of Peirce’s central tasks was that of analyzing all possible kinds of signs.

Semeiotic and Logic

Peirce’s settled opinion was that logic in the broadest sense is to be equated with semeiotic, and that logic in a much narrower sense (which he typically called "logical critic") is one of three major divisions or parts of semeiotic. Thus, in his later writings, he divided semeiotic into speculative grammar, logical critic, and speculative rhetoric (also called "methodeutic"). Peirce’s word "speculative" is his Latinate version of the Greek-derived word "theoretical," and should be understood to mean exactly the word "theoretical." Peirce’s tripartite division of semeiotic is not to be confused with Charles W. Morris’s division: syntax, semantics, and pragmatics (although there may be some commonalities in the two trichotomies).

By speculative grammar Peirce understood the analysis of the kinds of signs there are and the ways that they can be combined significantly. For example, under this heading he introduced three trichotomies of signs and argued for the real possibility of only certain kinds of signs. Signs are qualisigns, sinsigns, or legisigns, accordingly as they are mere qualities, individual events and states, or habits (or laws), respectively. Signs are icons, indices (also called "semes"), or symbols (sometimes called "tokens"), accordingly as they derive their significance from resemblance to their objects, a real relation (for example, of causation) with their objects, or are connected only by convention to their objects, respectively. Signs are rhematic signs (also called "sumisigns" and "rhemes"), dicisigns (also called "quasi-propositions"), or arguments (also called "suadisigns"), accordingly as they are predicational/relational in character, propositional in character, or argumentative in character. Because the three trichotomies are orthogonal to each other, together they yield the abstract possibility that there are 27 distinct kinds of signs. Peirce argued, however, that 17 of these are logically impossible, so that finally only 10 kinds of signs are genuinely possible. In terms of these 10 kinds of signs, Peirce endeavored to construct a theory of all possible natural and conventional signs, whether simple or complex.

What Peirce meant by "logical critic" is pretty much logic in the ordinary, accepted sense of "logic" from Aristotle’s logic to present-day mathematical logic. As might be expected, a crucial concern of logical critic is to characterize the difference between correct and incorrect reasoning. Some of Peirce’s accomplishments in this area will be discussed below.

By "speculative rhetoric" or "methodeutic" Peirce understood all inquiry into the principles of the effective use of signs for producing valuable courses of research and giving valuable expositions. Methodeutic studies the methods that researchers should use in investigating, giving expositions of, and creating applications of the truth. This idea may overlap to some small extent Morris’s notion of "pragmatics," but the spirit of Peirce’s notion is much wider than that of Morris’s. Moreover, Peirce handled the notion of indexical reference under the heading of speculative grammar and not speculative rhetoric, whereas the topic certainly belongs to Morris’s pragmatics. So far as is known, Peirce did not develop details of the topic of speculative rhetoric to any great extent, but it is clear that the important topic of the economy of research is closely affiliated with it.

The Classification of the Sciences

Peirce maintained an interest in the topic of classification or taxonomy in general, and he considered biology and geology the foremost sciences to have made progress in developing genuinely useful classifications of things. In his own theory of classification, he seemed to regard some sort of cluster analysis as holding the key to creating really useful classifications. He regularly strove to create a classification of all the sciences that would be as useful to logic as the systems of the biologists and geologists were to these scientists.

As with many of Peirce’s divisions, his classification of the sciences is a taxonomy consisting of triads. For example he classifies all the sciences into those of discovery, review, and practicality. Sciences of discovery he divides into mathematics, philosophy, and what he calls "idioscopy" (by which he seems to mean the class of all the particular or special sciences like physics, psychology, and so forth). Mathematics he divides into mathematics of logic, of discrete series, and of continua and pseudo-continua. Philosphy divides into phenomenology, normative science, and metaphysics. Normative science divides into aesthetics, ethics, and logic. And so on and on. Occasionally there is found a division into two: for example, he divides idioscopy into the physical sciences and the psychical (or human) sciences. But mostly the division is into threes.

Peirce scholars have found the topic of Peirce’s classification of the sciences a fertile ground for assertions about what is most basic in all thinking, in Peirce’s view. Whether or not such assertions run afoul of Peirce’s anti-foundationalism is itself a topic for further study.


In the extensiveness and originality of his contributions to mathematical logic, Peirce is almost without equal. His writings and original ideas are so numerous that there is no way to do them justice in a small article such as the present one. Accordingly, only a few of his achievements will be mentioned here.

Peirce’s special strength lay not so much in theorem-proving as rather in the invention and developmental elaboration of novel systems of logical syntax and fundamental logical concepts. He invented dozens of different systems of logical syntax, including a syntax based on a generalization of de Morgan’s relative product operation, an algebraic syntax that mirrored Boolean algebra to some extent, a quantifier-and-variable syntax that (except for specific symbols) is identical to the much later Russell-Whitehead syntax, and even two systems of two-dimensional syntax: the entitative graphs and the existential graphs, the latter being a syntax for logic using the mathematical apparatus of topological graph theory.

In 1870 Peirce published a long paper "Description of a Notation for the Logic of Relatives" in which he introduced for the first time in history, two years before Frege’s Begriffschrift a complete syntax for the logic of relations of arbitrary adicity (or arity). In this paper the notion of the variable (though not under the name "variable") was invented, and Peirce provided devices for negating, combining relations, and quantifying. By 1883, along with his student O. H. Mitchell, he had developed a full syntax for quantificational logic, only a little different in specific symbols (as was mentioned just above) from the standard Russell-Whitehed syntax that did not appear until 1910.

Peirce introduced the material-conditional operator into logic, developed the Shaffer stroke and daggar operators 40 years before Shaffer, and developed a full logical system based only on the stroke function. As Garret Birkhoff notes in his Lattice Theory it was in fact Peirce who invented the concept of a lattice (around 1883). (Quite possibly, it is Peirce’s lattice theory that holds the key to his technical theory of infinitesimals and the continuum.)

During his years teaching at Johns Hopkins University, Peirce began to research the four-color map conjecture and developed extensive connections between logic and topology, especially topological graph theory. Ultimately these researches bore fruit in his existential graphs, but probably his writings in this area contain a considerable number of other valuable ideas and results. He hinted that he had made great progress in the theory of provability and unprovability by exploring the connections between logic and topology.

Peirce’s Reduction Thesis

Peirce’s so-called "Reduction Thesis" is the thesis that all relations of arbitrary adicity may be constructed from triadic relations alone, whereas monadic and dyadic relations alone are not sufficient to allow the construction of even a single "non-degenerate" (that is: non-Cartesian-factorable) triadic relation. Although the germ of his argument for the Reduction Thesis lay in his 1870 paper "Description of a Notation for the Logic of Relatives," the Thesis was for over a century doubted by many, especially after the publication of a proof by Willard Van Orman Quine that all relations could be constructed exclusively from dyadic ones. As it turns out, both Peirce and Quine were correct: the issue all depends on exactly what constructive resources are to be allowed to be used in building relations out of other relations. (Obviously, the more extensive and powerful are the constructive resources, the more likely it is that all relations can be constructed from dyadic ones alone by using them.) An exact exposition and proof of Peirce’s Reduction Thesis was finally accomplished in 1988, and it makes clear that Peirce’s constructive resources are to be understood to include only negation, a generalization of de Morgan’s relative product operation, and the use of a particular triadic relation that Peirce called "the teridentity relation" and that we might today write as x = y = z.

Peirce felt that the teridentity relation was in some way much more fundamental than the usual dyadic identity relation x = y. He also felt that relative product was a much more fundamental operation than, say, Boolean product or Boolean sum. The full philosophical import of his Reduction Thesis, and the philosophical importance of his triadism insofar as this triadism rests on his Reduction Thesis, cannot be ascertained without a prior understanding of his theory of identity and his view of the nature of the relative product operation.

Contemporary Practical Applications of Peirce’s Ideas

Currently, considerable interest is being taken in Peirce’s ideas from outside the arena of academic philosophy. The interest comes from industry, business, technology, and the military; and it has resulted in the existence of a number of agencies, institutes, and laboratories in which ongoing research into and development of Peircean concepts is being undertaken.

This interest has arisen, apparently, in two ways. First, some two decades agao in the former Soviet Union interest in Peirce and Karl Popper led logicians and computer scientists like Victor Finn and Dmitri Pospelov to try to find ways in which computer programs could generate Peircean hypotheses (Popperian "conjectures") in semeiotic contexts (non-numerical contexts). Under the guide in particular of Finn’s intelligent systems laboratory in VINITI-RAN (the All-Russian Institute of Scientific and Technical Information of the Russian Academy of Sciences), elaborate techniques for automatic generation of hypotheses have been found and extensively utilized for many practical purposes. Among these are sociological prediction, pharmacological discovery, and the analysis of processes of industrial production. Interest in Finn’s work, and through it the practical application of Peirce’s philosophy, has spread to France, Germany, Denmark, and ultimately the United States.

Second, as the limits of expert systems in artificial intelligence contexts have become increasingly clear to computer scientists, they have begun to search for methods beyond those of the production rules of expert systems. One promising line of research has been in automating Peirce’s concept of the scientific method, complete with techniques for hypothesis-generation and making assessments of the costs and benefits of exploring hypotheses. In some areas of research added impetus has been provided by the similarity of Peircean techniques to techniques that have already proven useful. For example, in the field of automated multi-track radar, the similarity of Peircean scientific method to the so-called "Kalman filter" has been noted by many systems analysts. Again, those interested in military command-and-control often note the similarity of Peircean scientific method to the classic OODA loop ("observe, orient, decide, act") of comand-and-control-theory. The areospace industry, especially in France and the United States, is currently investigating Peircean ideas in connection with avionics systems that monitor aircraft "health."

Such practical applications of Peircean ideas may seem surprising to many philosophers, but they surely would not have surprised Peirce. Indeed, given his lifelong goals as a scientist-philosopher, he probably would have found the current situation entirely in accord with his expectations.


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Related Entries

Aristotle: logic | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | James, William | Kant, Immanuel | logic: classical | panpsychism | Peirce, Benjamin | Popper, Karl | Russell, Bertrand | universals: the medieval problem of | Whewell, William | Whitehead, Alfred North

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Robert W. Burch

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First published: June 22, 2001
Content last modified: June 22, 2001