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Paul of Venice

Paul of Venice was the most important Italian thinker of his times, and one of the most prominent and interesting logicians of the Middle Ages. His philosophical theories (culminating in a metaphysics of essences which states the ontological and epistemological primacy of universals over any other kind of beings) are the final and highest result of the preceding realistic tradition of thought. He fully developed the new form of realism started up by Wyclif and his Oxonian followers in the last decades of the 14th century, and renewed Burley’s attacks against nominalistic views. The metaphysical convictions at the basis of his philosophy are an original version of the most fundamental theses of Duns Scotus (viz. univocity of being; existence of universal forms outside the mind, which are at the same time identical with and different from their own individuals; real identity and formal distinction between essence and being; thisness as the principle of individuation; real distinction among the ten categories). But Paul puts much more stress on the ontological presuppositions and entailments of the doctrine. Simultaneously, he was open to influences from many other directions, as he held in due consideration also the positions of authors such as Albert the Great, Thomas Aquinas, and Giles of Rome, and critically discussed the doctrines of the main Nominalists of the 14th century, namely William Ockham, John Buridan, and Marsilius of Inghen, sometimes playing mutually incompatible theses against each other. This contributes to making his works stimulating and enriching from an historical point of view, but also makes it difficult to grasp his own ideas in their relationships and unity. These reflections help us to explain why for about one hundred and fifty years Paul was erroneously, but unanimously, believed to be an Ockhamist in logic and metaphysics and an Averroist in psychology and epistemology.

1. Life and Works

Paul of Venice (Paulus Nicolettus Venetus, Paolo Nicoletti Veneto), O.E.S.A. was born in Udine, Italy, around 1369. He joined the Augustinian order near the age of fourteen, when he entered the convent of Santo Stefano in Venice. He studied first at Padua, but in 1390 he was assigned to Oxford, where he spent three years. He became Doctor of Arts and Theology by 1405. He taught in Padua, Siena (1420-24), and Perugia (1424-28), and lectured in Bologna (1424). At various times he held positions of leadership in his order (Pope Gregory XII designated him Prior General of the Augustinians in May 1409) and served as ambassador of the Venetian Republic. He died in Padua on 15 June 1429, while commenting the De anima (On the Soul) of Aristotle.

Paul wrote many philosophical and theological treatises (the complete list of his writings and a guide to extant manuscripts are in Perreiah 1986; for the dating of his main philosophical works see Conti 1996, pp. 9-20), including: Logica parva (The Small Logic), ca. 1393-95; Logica magna (The Great Logic), ca. 1396-99; Sophismata aurea (Golden Sophisms), ca. 1399; a commentary on Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics (In Post.), A.D. 1406; Summa philosophiae naturalis (Summa of Natural Philosophy -- SN), A.D. 1408; a commentary on Aristotle’s Physics (In Phys.), A.D. 1409; a commentary on Aristotle’s On the Soul (In De anima), ca. 1415-20; Quaestio de universalibus (On Universals -- QdU), ca. 1420-24; a commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics (In Metaph.), ca. 1420-24; a commentary on the Ars Vetus, that is, on Porphyry’s Isagoge, Aristotle’s Categories, and the Liber sex principiorum (Expositio super Universalia Porphyrii et Artem Veterem Aristotelis -- In Porph., In Cat., and In Sex pr. respectively), A.D. 1428.

2. Logic

The main contributions of Paul of Venice to the history of logic in the Middle Ages concern the notion of formal distinction and the analysis of predication.

2.1 Identities and Distinctions

Paul’s formulation of the theory of identity and distinction is a further development of Duns Scotus’ and Wyclif’s doctrines on the subject. The Italian master recognizes two main types of identity: material (secundum materiam) and formal (secundum formam). There is material identity when the material cause is the same, either in number (it is a case of the same thing called in different ways) or by species (it is a case of two objects made of the same kind of stuff). There is formal identity when the formal cause is the same. This happens in two ways: if the form at issue is the singular form of the individual composite, then there is a unique object known in different ways; if the form at issue is the common essence instantiated by the singular form, then there are two distinct objects belonging to the same species or genus (In Metaph., book V, tr. 2, chap. 3, fol. 185ra). Correspondingly, the main types of distinction (or difference) are also two: material and formal. There is material distinction when the material cause is different, so that the objects at issue are separable entities. In general, there is formal distinction when the formal cause is different. This happens in two ways: if the material cause is also different, then it is a particular case of material distinction. If the material cause is the same, then a further analysis is necessary. If the material cause is the same by species only, then it is an improper case of formal distinction; but if the material cause is the same in number, then there is properly formal distinction, since the forms at issue have different definite descriptions but share the same substrate of existence, so that they are one and the same thing in reality. For example, there is a proper formal distinction in the case of the two properties of being-capable-of-laughing (risibile) and of being-capable-of-learning (disciplinabile), which are connected forms instantiated by the same set of individual substances (In Metaph., book V, tr. 2, chap. 3, fol. 185rb).

Material distinction is a necessary and sufficient criterion for real difference, traditionally conceived, whereas there is formal distinction if and only if there is one substance in number (i.e. material identity in the strict sense) and a multiplicity of formal principles with different descriptions instantiated by it. Paul therefore inverts the terms of the question in relation to what earlier approaches had done. By means of the formal distinction Duns Scotus and John Wyclif had tried to explain how it is possible to distinguish many different real aspects internal to the same individual substance (the passage is from one to many). On the contrary, Paul is attempting to reduce multiplicity to unity (the passage is from many to one). What Paul wants to account for is the way in which many different entities of a certain kind (i.e. of an incomplete and dependent mode of existence) can constitute one and the same substance in number.

2.2 Predication

The starting point of Paul’s theory of predication is his doctrine of universals. Just like Wyclif and his followers (Alyngton, Penbygull, Sharpe, Milverley, Whelpdale, Tarteys), the Augustinian master claims that

  1. There are real universals, which are common essences naturally apt to be present in and predicated of many similar individuals.
  2. Real universals and their individuals are really the same and only formally distinct.
  3. Predication is first of all a real relation between metaphysical entities (QdU, fols. 124ra, 124vb, 127va, 132va).
But his analysis of predication is different from those of both Wyclif and his followers. In fact, Paul divides predication into identical predication and formal predication and defines them in a different way than his sources do.

To speak of identical predication it is sufficient that the form signified by the subject-term of a (true) proposition and the form signified by the predicate-term share at least one of their substrates of existence. This is the case for propositions like ‘Man is (an) animal’ and ‘The universal-man is something white’ (‘Homo in communi est album’). One speaks of formal predication in two cases:

  1. When for the truth of the proposition it is necessary that the form signified by the predicate-term is present in all the substrates of existence of the form signified by the subject-term, in virtue of a formal principle (made clear in the proposition itself) that is in turn directly present in all the substrates of existence of the form signified by the subject-term. This is the case for propositions like ‘Man is formally (an) animal’ and ‘Socrates qua man is an animal’.
  2. Or else when the predicate of the proposition is a term of second intention, like ‘species’ or ‘genus’. This is the case for propositions like ‘Man is a species’ and ‘Animal is a genus’ (SN, part VI, chap. 2, fol. 93vab; QdU, fols. 124vb-125rb).

As is evident, identical predication is extensionally defined, whereas formal predication is intensionally defined, since formal predication entails a relation modally determined between the subject-thing and the predicate-thing. In fact, formal predication presupposes that there is a necessary connection between the subject-thing and the predicate-thing of the given proposition. For this reason, Paul denies that sentences like ‘(What is) singular is (what is) universal’ (‘Singulare est universale’), which Wyclif and his followers acknowledged as true, are in fact true propositions. For Wyclif and his followers, the sentence at issue is an example of predication by essence. But for Paul of Venice, it is an example of formal predication; no individual qua individual is an universal, or vice versa, as no second intention intensionally considered is any other second intention (QdU, fol. 133va; In Porph., prooem., fol. 3ra-b). As a consequence, Paul rewrites the preceding sentece in this form: ‘(What is) singular is this universal’ (‘Singulare est hoc universale’), where the presence of the demonstrative ‘this’ changes the kind of predication from formal to identical. So corrected, the sentence is true, since it signifies that a certain entity, in itself singular, is the substrate of existence of a universal essence (QdU, fol. 133va-b).

As a result, Paul builds up a mixed system, where the copula of the standard philosophical sentences he deals with can have a threefold value: it means a partial identity between the subject-thing and the predicate-thing in the case of identical predication; it means a necessary link between forms in the case of the first type of formal predication; it means that the subject-thing in virtue of itself is necessarily a member of a given class of objects, which the predicate-term of the proposition labels and refers to, in the case of the second type of formal predication -- that is, when the predicate is a term of second intention.

3. Ontology

Paul’s world consists of finite beings (that is, things like men or horses) really existing outside the mind, each made up of a primary substance and a host of forms existing in it and by it. The forms of a primary substance belong to ten different types of being, or categories. Therefore a finite being cannot be totally identified with the primary substance. (In fact no primary substance contains the whole being of a finite being.) Rather it is an ordered congeries of categorial items. Primary substances are not simple items but complex objects, since they are compounded of particular matter and form -- a form that is really identical with and formally distinct from the specific nature itself that the primary substance instantiates (SN, part VI, chap. 1, fols. 92vb-93ra). The concepts of matter and form are relative, since their meanings are connected with each other (In Post., fol. 40rb). Being the form of something and being the matter of something are converse relations of three different kinds, whose arguments and values are:

  1. the metaphysical constituents of the individual substance (i.e. singular matter and form);
  2. the metaphysical constituents of the specific natures (i.e. genus and difference); and
  3. the categorial items (i.e. individual and universal substances and accidents) considered according to their various degrees of generality.

The specific nature (or essence) can be conceived from a twofold point of view: intensionally (in abstracto) and extensionally (in concreto). Intensionally viewed, the specific nature simply expresses the set of essential properties that compose a categorial form, without any reference to the existence of individuals which, if there are any, instantiate it. Extensionally viewed, the specific nature is that same form conceived of as instantiated by at least one singular entity. For instance, human nature intensionally considered is humanity (humanitas); extensionally it is man (homo) (In Porph., prooem., fol. 9va). Both of them are substantial forms superordinated to the whole human compound, but while humanity is properly a form, i.e. something existentially incomplete and dependent, man is an existentially autonomous and independent entity. Thus they differ from each other in the same way as a predicate (for example ‘P’) differs from a formula (for example, ‘P(x)’).

Because of the complexity of the metaphysical composition of the finite corporeal being, every creature has four different levels of being: real, essential, temporal, and individual. The real being is nothing but the whole reality of the finite being. The essential being is the mode of being proper to the specific nature that a certain singular directly instantiates. The temporal being is the state of affairs designated by infinitival expressions like ‘being a man’ (‘hominem esse’) or ‘being white’ (‘esse album’) -- that is, the object of the act of judging. Finally, the individual being is the actual existence of the primary substance of a finite being as distinct from the whole reality of the finite being itself (SN, part VI, chap. 1, fol. 92vb).

According to Paul, who follows Duns Scotus and Wyclif on this subject, being is univocally shared by everything real, since it is the stuff that the ten categories modulate according to their own essence (In Phys., book I, tr. 1, chap. 2, t. c. 13; In Metaph., book IV, tr. 1, chap. 1, fols. 122ra-125vb, passim; In Porph., chap. De specie, fol. 22rb). In view of this position, Paul maintains no real distinction between essence and being (In Metaph., book IV, tr. 1, chap. 2, fol. 127rb; book VI, chap. 1, fol. 223vb). Like Duns Scotus and Wyclif, Paul speaks of a formal difference (or difference of reason) between essence and being in creatures, as the essence and the essential being of a thing are one and the same entity considered from two distinct point of view, intensionally (the essence) and extensionally (the being) (SN, part VI, chap. 1, fol. 93ra).

This analysis identifies the opposition between essence and being with the opposition between universals and individuals. Like Wyclif, Paul thinks of the essence as a universal form intensionally considered, and the existence (taken in the strict sense) as the mode of being proper to primary substances. Thus, when Paul affirms that essence and being are really identical and formally different, he simply restates the thesis of the real identity and formal distinction between universals and individuals that was typical of the Realists of the late Middle Ages. Consequently, like Burley and Wyclif, Paul holds that a formal universal actually (in actu) exists outside our minds only if there is at least one individual that instantiates it, so that without individuals common natures (or essences) are not really universals (SN, part VI, chap. 2, fol. 94ra).

This means that the relationship between common natures and singulars is ultimately grounded on individuation, since no actual universality and no instantiation is possible without individuation. On this subject Paul successfully reconciles the Scotistic approach with certain Thomistic theses. Paul claims that the principle of individuation is twofold, immanent and remote. The immanent principle is the one whose presence necessarily entails the existence of the individual it constitutes, and whose absence necessarily entails the non-existence (or disappearance) of the individual. The remote principle, on the other hand, is just what the immanent principle presupposes, but whose presence and absence alone are insufficient for causing the existence or disappearance of the individual, as it continues being after the corruption of the individual. Thisness (haecceitas) is the immanent principle of individuation, whereas form, matter, and quantity are the remote principle. Thisness in turn has a twofold origin, as it derives from matter and form together in the case of corporeal substances, and as it derives from the essence (quidditas) alone in the case of angelic intelligences (SN, part VI, chap. 5, fol. 95vb). Furthermore, according to Paul there is a close similarity between the thisness, which he now calls individual difference (differentia individualis), and the specific difference. The specific difference is what differentiates the species from the genus, since it is the determination or property which, once added to the genus, results in the species. On the other hand, the specific difference is really identical with the genus, from which it is distinct only in virtue of a formal principle. The same happens to the individual difference: it is what differentiates the individual from the species; from the ontological point of view, it is really identical with and formally distinct from the species itself; and it is the formal principle in virtue of which the individual is what it is, something particular, concrete, and perfectly determined in itself (SN, part VI, chap. 5, fol. 96rb; chap. 26, fol. 112rb-va; QdU, fol. 128va; fol. 129rb; In Metaph., book III, tr. 1, chap. 1, fol. 83vb).

As far as the problem of angelic individuation is concerned, the logical consequence deriving from such premisses is that it is impossible to find two angels who share the same specific nature and are numerically distinct, since only one haecceitas can spring up from an incorporeal species (SN, part VI, chap. 5, fol. 96ra). This solution is close to the inner meaning of Duns Scotus’ position and contrasts with Aquinas’ view, although Paul affirms that the angelic intelligences are specifically, and not numerically, different. In fact, according to St. Thomas, angels are specifically different because they are incorporeal, and without matter no individuation is possible. On the contrary, Paul of Venice thinks angels are individuated by means of thisnesses, but not multiplied by them, because of the absence of matter, so that there is only one angel per species. Since specific natures of incorporeal beings do not include any reference to matter, only a unique principle of individuation (ratio suppositalis) can flow from such species. As a consequence, no angel is one in number in the strict sense of the term (as being one in number necessarily implies the actual presence of a multiplicity of things of the same species), even though broadly speaking every angel is one in number, as two (or more) angels are, after all, "many things" -- but never many angels of the same kind (SN, part VI, chap. 5, fol. 95vb).

In his last work, the commentary on the Ars Vetus, Paul summarizes his position as follows:

  1. The individual is the final result of a process of individuation whose starting point is a specific form.
  2. The individuation is what differentiates the individual from its species.
  3. The individuation is nothing but the thisness itself.
  4. The thisness and the specific form are only formally distinct from the individual they make up (In Porph., chap. De specie, fol. 60ra).
  5. The principle of individuation, when causing the passage from the level of universals to that of singulars, does not play the role of form (or act) in relation to the specific nature, but the role of matter (or potency), as it is what the specific form structures (In Cat., chap. De substantia, fol. 60ra).

In this way Paul of Venice tried to solve the aporetic aspects of Duns Scotus’ theory of individuation. Scotus said nothing about the problem of the relation between the thisness and the particular matter and form that constitute the individual. The Franciscan master was silent also about a possible identification of the thisness with one of the two essential forms of the individual substance, the forma partis (for instance, the individual soul) and the forma totius (the human nature). Paul identifies the principle of individuation with the informing act through which the specific nature molds its matter. This identification had been already suggested by the opposition between immanent and remote principles of individuation described in the Summa philosphiae naturalis. In fact, all the constituents of the individual compound (matter, form, and quantity) had been contrasted with the thisness, which for that reason could not be identified with any of them. Moreover, it is obvious that:

  1. It is the union of the singular form with its matter that establishes the "birth" of the individual.
  2. It is its separation from the matter that establishes the "death" of the individual.
  3. The union of the singular form with its matter is the necessary and sufficient condition for the passage of the specific essence from its abstract (or intensional) mode of being to its concrete (or extensional) mode of being.

4. Psychology

Paul of Venice rejects the Augustinian conception of the relation of soul to body and follows the Aristotelian view of the soul as form of the body. But, against Aristotle and following Aquinas, Paul claims that, although it is the form of the body, the human soul is a self-subsistent form, and therefore incorruptible. However, unlike St. Thomas, he claims that the human soul is twofold, since the complete human soul derives from the close union of two distinct principles, the cogitative and the intellective ones. The former is the cause of the animality and the latter of the rationality of man; neither of them can exist in man without the other, and the cogitative soul is in potency in relation to the intellective soul (SN, part V, chap. 5, fol. 69ra; In De anima, book II, t. c. 23, fol. 48ra).

Like St. Thomas and Giles of Rome, Paul maintains that there is a real distinction between the soul and its faculties. But, in opposition to them, he holds that there is only a formal distinction (ratione et definitione) between the faculties themselves (SN, part VI, chap. 4, fol. 68ra-b). Whereas the faculties of the cogitative soul depend on bodily organs for their operations, the faculties of the intellective soul, i.e. the active intellect, the passive intellect, and the will, are independent of bodily organs, even though in the state of union with the body they need sensation for exercising their powers and no act of sensation can be produced without the concurrence of the body (SN, part V, chap. 10, fols. 71va-72ra). Besides the vegetative faculty (which regulates nutrition, growth, and reproduction) and the power of locomotion, the faculties of the cogitative soul are the following: the five exterior senses, the general sense (sensus communis), the fantasy (phantasia), the power of assessment (vis aestimativa), and memory. Against Avicenna, Paul explicitly denies that there is a fifth internal sense, the imagination, since he thinks its presumed operations are the same as those of the fantasy (SN, part V, chap. 30, fol. 84ra). The general sense distinguishes and collates the data of the special exterior senses. The fantasy conserves sensible species apprehended by senses and freely combines them together to produce figments. The power of assessment recognizes those properties of things which cannot be perceived through the senses, like, for example, that something is useful for a certain purpose, or friendly, or unfriendly. The memory is the ‘warehouse’ where all the sensible species are stored, so that the cogitative soul can perform its tasks even without the presence of any sensible object (SN, part V, chap. 30, fol. 84ra-va).

According to Nardi 1958, Ruello 1980, and Kuksewicz 1983, Paul was an Averroist in Psychology, as he would have supported the thesis of the unicity and separate character of the passive intellect for the whole human species. But this is false. On the contrary, Paul’s point of view is close to that of St. Thomas for the question of the passive intellect, and to the position of Avicenna for the question of the active intellect (Conti 1992, especially pp. 338-47). If his affirmations in the Summa philosophiae naturalis are ambiguous and it is therefore possible to miss their deepest meaning, in his commentaries on the De anima and on the Metaphysics he clearly rejects all the main theses of the Averroism. First of all, he maintains personal immortality (a thesis denied by genuine Averroists) and, like the medieval followers of Avicenna, identifies active intellect with God’s activity of ‘illumination’ in the soul (In De anima, book III, t. c. 11, fol. 137rb; t. c. 19, fol. 143ra). Secondly, he claims, against Averroes, that the intellective soul is form and act of the body (In De anima, book II, t. c. 7, fol. 39rb-va; t. c. 8, fol. 134rb). Moreover, he asserts that:

  1. The intentional species present in the exterior senses, in the internal senses, and in the intellect are of three different kinds.
  2. The individual is a proper object of intellection for us.
  3. The same intelligible species (species intelligibilis) by means of which we grasp substantial essences is the medium in virtue of which we can understand the peculiar structure of the individual which instantiates that essence. (SN, part V, chap. 28, fol. 83ra; In De anima, book III, t. c. 11, fol. 136vb; 137rb-va).
These theses are just the opposite of Averroist convictions. Finally, he explicitly argues against the unicity of the passive intellect, utilizing some arguments drawn from the De unitate intellectus contra Averroistas (On the Unicity of Intellect against the Averroists) and the Summa theologiae (Summa of Theology) of St. Thomas. Among them, the most important are the following three:
  1. If the soul is the form of the body, as Aristotle states, it is impossible that the passive intellect is one in all men, since one and the same principle in number cannot be the form of a multiplicity of substances.
  2. If the passive intellect is one and the same for all men, then after death nothing remains of men but this unique intellect, and in this way the bestowal of rewards and punishments is done away with.
  3. One and the same intellect could hold contradictory opinions at once, in apparent violation of the law of contradiction (In De anima, book III, t. c. 27, fol. 149ra; In Metaph., book IV, tr. 1, chap. 3, fols. 136vb-137ra).
More generally, he thinks (i) the Averroistic theses are lacking in a solid philosophical basis, since they can be maintained from the physical point of view only, according to which everything is considered qua affected by or connected with motion, but (ii) they are totally false from the metaphysical point of view, which is the most comprehensive of all. From this viewpoint, according to which the passive intellect has to be considered a substantial form, it is evident that it has a beginning in time, but certainly not an end, and that, like any other material substantial form, it is multiplied according to the multiplication of bodies (In Metaph., book XII, tr. 1, chap. 3, fol. 427ra-b).


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Albert the Great [= Albertus magnus] | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Buridan, John [Jean] | divine illumination | Duns Scotus, John | Giles of Rome | Marsilius of Inghen | Ockham [Occam], William | Wyclif, John

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First published: August 22, 2001
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