This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Moral Responsibility

When a person performs or fails to perform a morally significant action, we sometimes think that he or she is deserving of a particular kind of response. Praise and blame are perhaps the most common forms this reaction takes. For example, one who encounters a car accident may be worthy of praise for having saved a child from inside the burning car, or alternatively, one may be worthy of blame for not having at least used one’s cell phone to call for help. To regard such agents as worthy of one of these reactions is to ascribe moral responsibility to them on the basis of what they have done or left undone. (These are examples of other-directed ascriptions of responsibility. The reaction might also be self-directed, e.g., one can recognize oneself to be blameworthy). Thus, to be morally responsible for something, say an action, is to be worthy of a particular kind of reaction -- praise, blame, or something akin to these -- for having performed it.[1]

Though, further elaboration and qualification of the above characterization of moral responsibility is called for and will be provided below, this is enough to distinguish concern about this form of responsibility from some others commonly referred to through use of the terms ‘responsibility’ or ‘responsible.’ To illustrate, we might say that higher than normal rainfall in the spring is responsible for an increase in the amount of vegetation or that it is the judge’s responsibility to give instructions to the jury before they begin deliberating. In the first case, we mean to identify a causal connection between the earlier amount of rain and the later increased vegetation. In the second, we mean to say that when one assumes the role of judge, certain duties, or obligations, follow. Although these concepts are connected with the concept of moral responsibility, they are not the same, for in neither case are we directly concerned about whether it would be appropriate to react to some candidate (here, the rainfall or a particular judge) with something like praise or blame.[2]

Philosophical reflection on moral responsibility has a long history. One reason for this persistent interest is the way the topic seems connected with a widely shared conception of ourselves as members of an importantly distinct class of individuals -- call them ‘persons.’[3] Persons are thought to be qualitatively different from those of other known living species, despite their numerous similarities. Many have held that one distinct feature of persons is their status as morally responsible agents, a status resting, perhaps, on a special kind of control only they can exercise. Many who view persons in this way have wondered whether their special status is threatened if certain other claims about our universe are true. For example, can a person be morally responsible for her behavior if that behavior can be explained solely by reference to physical states of the universe and the laws governing changes in those physical states, or solely by reference to the existence of a sovereign God who guides the world along a divinely ordained path? Concerns like these have often motivated individuals to theorize about moral responsibility.

A comprehensive theory of moral responsibility would elucidate the following: 1) the concept, or idea, of moral responsibility itself; 2) the criteria for being a moral agent, i.e., one who qualifies generally as an agent open to responsibility ascriptions (e.g., only beings possessing the general capacity to evaluate reasons for acting can be moral agents); 3) the conditions under which the concept of moral responsibility is properly applied, i.e., those conditions under which a moral agent is responsible for a particular something (e.g., a moral agent can be responsible for an action she has performed only if she performed it freely, where acting freely entails the ability to have done otherwise at the time of action); and finally 4) possible objects of responsibility ascriptions (e.g., actions, omissions, consequences, character traits, etc.). Although each of these will be touched upon in the discussion below (see, e.g., the brief sketch of Aristotle’s account in the next section), the primary focus of this entry is on the first component -- the concept of moral responsibility. The focus of the next section is the origin and history of Western reflection on moral responsibility. This is followed by a discussion of recent work on the concept of moral responsibility. For further discussion of issues associated with and theorizing about moral responsibility, see the related entries below.

Some Historical Background

What follows in this section is a brief sketch of the origins and trajectory of reflection on moral responsibility in the Western philosophical tradition. Against this background, a distinction will be drawn between two conceptions of moral responsibility that have exerted considerable influence on subsequent thinkers.

An understanding of the concept of moral responsibility and its application is present implicitly in some of the earliest surviving Greek texts, i.e., the Homeric epics (circa 8th century BCE but no doubt informed by a much earlier oral tradition).[4] In these texts, both human and superhuman agents are often regarded as fair targets of praise and blame on the basis of how they have behaved, and at other times, an agent’s behavior is excused because of the presence of some factor that has undermined his/her control (Irwin, 1999, p. 225). Reflection on these factors gave rise to fatalism -- the view that one’s future or some aspect of it is predetermined, e.g., by the gods, or the stars, or simply some facts about truth and time -- in such a way as to make one’s particular deliberations, choices and actions irrelevant to whether that particular future is realized (recall, e.g., the plight of Oedipus). If some particular outcome is fated, then it seems that the agent concerned could not be morally responsible for that outcome. Likewise, if fatalism were true with respect to all human futures, then it would seem that no human agent could be morally responsible for anything. Though fatalism has sometimes exerted significant historical influence, most philosophers have rejected it on the grounds that there is no good reason to think that our futures are fated in the sense that they will unfold no matter what particular deliberations we engage in, choices we make, or actions we perform.

Aristotle (384-323 BCE) seems to have been the first to construct explicitly a theory of moral responsibility.[5] In the course of discussing human virtues and their corresponding vices, Aristotle pauses in Nicomachean Ethics III.1-5 to explore their underpinnings. He begins with a brief statement of the concept of moral responsibility -- that it is sometimes appropriate to respond to an agent with praise or blame on the basis of her actions and/or dispositional traits of character (1109b30-35). A bit later, he clarifies that only a certain kind of agent qualifies as a moral agent and is thus properly subject to ascriptions of responsibility, namely, one who possess a capacity for decision. For Aristotle, a decision is a particular kind of desire resulting from deliberation, one that expresses the agent’s conception of what is good (1111b5-1113b3). The remainder of Aristotle’s discussion is devoted to spelling out the conditions under which it is appropriate to hold a moral agent blameworthy or praiseworthy for some particular action or trait. His general proposal  is that one is an apt candidate for praise or blame if and only if the action and/or disposition is voluntary. According to Aristotle, a voluntary action or trait has two distinctive features. First, there is a control condition: the action or trait must have its origin in the agent. That is, it must be up to the agent whether to perform that action or possess the trait -- it cannot be compelled externally. Second, Aristotle proposes an epistemic condition: the agent must be aware of what it is she is doing or bringing about (1110a-1111b4).[6]

There is an instructive ambiguity in Aristotle’s account of responsibility, an ambiguity that has led to competing interpretations of his view. Aristotle aims to identify the conditions under which it is appropriate to praise or blame an agent, but it is not entirely clear how to understand the pivotal notion of appropriateness in his conception of responsibility. There are at least two possibilities: a) praise or blame is appropriate in the sense that the agent deserves such a response, given his behavior and/or traits of character; or b) praise or blame is appropriate in the sense that such a reaction is likely to bring about a desired consequence, namely an improvement in the agent’s behavior and/or character. These two possibilities may be characterized in terms of two competing interpretations of the concept of moral responsibility: 1) the merit-based view, according to which praise or blame would be an appropriate reaction toward the candidate if and only if she merits -- in the sense of ‘deserves’ -- such a reaction; vs. 2) the consequentialist view, according to which praise or blame would be appropriate if and only if a reaction of this sort would likely lead to a desired change in the agent and/or her behavior.[7]

Scholars disagree about which of the above views Aristotle endorsed, but the importance of distinguishing between them grew as philosophers began to focus on a newly conceived threat to moral responsibility. While Aristotle argued against a version of fatalism (On Interpretation, ch. 9), he may not have recognized the difference between it and the related possible threat of causal determinism (contra Sorabji). Causal determinism is the view that everything that happens or exists is caused by sufficient antecedent conditions, making it impossible for anything to happen or be other than it does or is. One variety of causal determinism, scientific determinism, identifies the relevant antecedent conditions as a combination of prior states of the universe and the laws of nature. Another, theological determinism, identifies those conditions as being the nature and will of God. It seems likely that theological determinism evolved out of the shift, both in Greek religion and in Ancient Mesopotamian religions, from polytheism to belief in one sovereign God, or at least one god who reigned over all others. The doctrine of scientific determinism can be traced back as far as the Presocratic Atomists (5th cent. BCE), but the difference between it and the earlier fatalistic view seems not to be clearly recognized until the development of Stoic philosophy (3rd. cent. BCE). Though fatalism, like causal determinism, might seem to threaten moral responsibility by threatening an agent’s control, the two differ on the significance of human deliberation, choice, and action. If fatalism is true, then human deliberation, choice, and action are completely otiose, for what is fated will transpire no matter what one chooses to do. According to causal determinism, however, one’s deliberations, choices, and actions will often be necessary links in the causal chain that brings something about. In other words, even though our deliberations, choices, and actions are themselves determined like everything else, it is still the case, according to causal determinism, that the occurrence or existence of yet other things depends upon our deliberating, choosing and acting in a certain way (Irwin,1999, pp. 243-249; Meyer, 1998, pp. 225-227, and Pereboom).

Since the Stoics, the thesis of causal determinism and its ramifications, if true, have taken center stage in theorizing about moral responsibility. During the Medieval period, especially in the work of Augustine (354-430) and Aquinas (1225-1274), reflection on freedom and responsibility was often generated by questions concerning versions of theological determinism, including most prominently: a) Does God’s sovereignty entail that God is responsible for evil?; and b) Does God’s foreknowledge entail that we are not free and morally responsible since it would seem that we cannot do anything other than what God foreknows we will do? During the Modern period, there was renewed interest in scientific determinism -- a change attributable to the development of increasingly sophisticated mechanistic models of the universe culminating in the success of Newtonian physics. The possibility of giving a comprehensive explanation of every aspect of the universe -- including human action -- in terms of physical causes now seemed much more plausible. Many thought that persons could not be free and morally responsible if such an explanation of human action were possible. Others argued that freedom and responsibility would not be threatened should scientific determinism be true. In keeping with this focus on the ramifications of causal determinism for moral responsibility, thinkers may be classified as being one of two types: 1) an incompatibilist about causal determinism and moral responsibility -- one who maintains that if causal determinism is true, then there is nothing for which one can be morally responsible; or 2) a compatibilist -- one who holds that a person can be morally responsible for some things, even if both who she is and what she does is causally determined.[8] In Ancient Greece, these positions were exemplified in the thought of Epicurus (341-270 BCE) and the Stoics, respectively.

Above, an ambiguity in Aristotle’s conception of moral responsibility was highlighted -- that it was not clear whether he endorsed a merit-based vs. a consequentialist conception of moral responsibility. The history of reflection on moral responsibility demonstrates that how one interprets the concept of moral responsibility strongly influences one’s overall account of moral responsibility. For example, those who accept the merit-based conception of moral responsibility have tended to be incompatibilists. That is, most have thought that if an agent were to genuinely merit praise or blame for something, then he would need to exercise a special form of control over that thing (e.g., the ability at the time of action to both perform or not perform the action) that is incompatible with one’s being causally determined. In addition to Epicurus, we can cite early Augustine, Thomas Reid (1710-1796), and Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) as historical examples here. Those accepting the consequentialist conception of moral responsibility, on the other hand, have traditionally contended that determinism poses no threat to moral responsibility since praising and blaming could still be an effective means of influencing another’s behavior, even in a deterministic world. Thomas Hobbes (1588-1679), David Hume (1711-1776), and John Stuart Mill (1806-1873) are, along with the Stoics, representatives of this view. This general trend of linking the consequentialist conception of moral responsibility with compatibilism about causal determinism and moral responsibility and the merit-based conception with incompatibilism continued to persist through the first half of the twentieth century.

Recent Work on the Concept of Responsibility

The issue of how best to understand the concept of moral responsibility is important, for it can strongly influence one’s view of what, if any, philosophical problems might be associated with the notion, and further, if there are problems, what might count as a solution. As discussed above, philosophical reflection on moral responsibility has historically relied upon one of two broad interpretations of the concept: 1) the merit-based view, according to which praise or blame would be an appropriate reaction toward the candidate if and only if she merits -- in the sense of ‘deserves’ -- such a reaction; or 2) the consequentialist view, according to which praise or blame would be appropriate if and only if a reaction of this sort would likely lead to a desired change in the agent and/or her behavior. Though the consequentialist view has continued to garner support (see e.g., Schlick, 1966, Brandt 1992, Frankena 1963, ch. 4, Dennett 1984, ch. 7, and Kupperman 1991, ch. 3), work in the last 50 years on the concept of moral responsibility has increasingly focused on: a) offering alternatives to the two traditional interpretations of moral responsibility; and b) alternative versions of the merit-based view.

Increased attention to the practice of holding persons morally responsible has generated much of the recent work on the concept of moral responsibility. All theorists have recognized features of this practice -- inner attitudes and emotions, their outward expression in censure or praise, and the imposition of corresponding sanctions or rewards. However, most understood the inner attitudes and emotions involved to rest on a more fundamental theoretical judgment about the agent’s being responsible. In other words, it was typically assumed that blame and praising depended upon a judgment, or belief (pre-reflective in most cases), that the agent in question had satisfied the objective conditions on being responsible. These judgments were presumed to be independent of the inner attitudinal/emotive states involved in holding responsible, in the sense that reaching such judgments and evaluating them required no essential reference to the attitudes and emotions of the one making the judgment. For the holder of the consequentialist view, this is a judgment that the agent exercised a form of control that could be influenced through outward expressions of praise and blame in order to curb or promote certain behaviors. For those holding the merit view, it is a judgment that the agent has exercised the requisite form of metaphysical control, e.g., that she could have done otherwise at the time of action (Watson 1987, p. 258).

If holding responsible is best understood as resting on an independent judgment about being responsible, then it is legitimate to inquire whether such underlying judgments and their associated outward expressions can be justified, as a whole, in the face of our understanding of the world, e.g., in the face of evidence that our world is possibly deterministic.[9] According to incompatibilists, a judgment that someone is morally responsible could never be true if the world were deterministic; thus praising and blaming in the merit-based sense would be beside the point. Compatibilists, on the other hand, contend that the truth of determinism would not undermine the relevant underlying judgments concerning the efficacy of praising and blaming practices, thereby leaving the rationale of such practices intact.

In his landmark essay, ‘Freedom and Resentment,’ P. F. Strawson (1962) sets out to adjudicate the dispute between those compatibilists who hold a consequentialist view of responsibility and those incompatibilists who hold the merit-based view.[10] Both are wrong, Strawson believes, because they distort the concept of moral responsibility by sharing the prevailing view sketched above -- the view of those who understand the practice of holding persons responsible to rest upon a theoretical judgment of their being responsible. According to Strawson, the attitudes expressed in holding persons morally responsible are varieties of a wide range of attitudes deriving from our participation in personal relationships, e.g., resentment, indignation, hurt feelings, anger, gratitude, reciprocal love, and forgiveness. The function of these attitudes is to express ". . . how much we actually mind, how much it matters to us, whether the actions of other people -- and particularly some other people -- reflect attitudes towards us of good will, affection, or esteem on the one hand or contempt, indifference, or malevolence on the other." (p. 5, author’s emphasis) These attitudes are thus participant reactive attitudes, because they are: a) natural attitudinal reactions to the perception of another’s good will, ill will, or indifference (pp. 4-6), and b) expressed from the stance of one who is immersed in interpersonal relationships and who regards the candidate held responsible as a participant in such relationships as well (p. 10).[11]

The reactive attitudes can be suspended or modified in at least two kinds of circumstances, corresponding to the two features just mentioned. In the first, one might conclude that, contrary to first appearances, the candidate did not violate the demand for a reasonable degree of good will. For example, a person’s behavior may be excused when one determines that it was an accident, or one may determine that the behavior was justified, say, in the case of an emergency when some greater good is being pursued. In the second kind of circumstance, one may abandon the participant perspective in relation to the candidate. In these cases, one adopts the objective standpoint, one from which one ceases to regard the individual as capable of participating in genuine personal relations (either for some limited time or permanently). Instead, one regards the individual as psychologically/morally abnormal or undeveloped and thereby a candidate, not for the full range of reactive attitudes, but primarily for those objective attitudes associated with treatment or simply instrumental control. Such individuals lie, in some sense or to some varying extent, outside the boundaries of the moral community. For example, we may regard a very young child as initially exempt from the reactive attitudes (but increasingly less so in cases of normal development) or adopt the objective standpoint in relation to an individual we determine to be suffering from severe mental illness (P. F. Strawson, pp. 6-10, Bennett, p. 40, Watson 1987, p. 259-260, R. Jay Wallace, chs. 5-6).

The central criticism Strawson directs at both consequentialist and traditional merit views is that both have over-intellectualized the issue of moral responsibility, and it is this criticism that has rendered his view so influential in subsequent work.[12] The charge of over intellectualization stems from the traditional tendency to presume that the rationality of holding a person responsible depends upon a judgment that the person in question has satisfied some set of objective requirements on being responsible (conditions on efficacy or metaphysical freedom) and that these requirements themselves are justifiable. Strawson, by contrast, maintains that the reactive attitudes are a natural expression of an essential feature of our form of life, in particular, the interpersonal nature of our way of life. The practice, then, of holding responsible -- embedded as it is in our way of life -- "neither calls for nor permits, an external ‘rational’ justification (p. 23)." Though judgments about the appropriateness of particular responses may arise (i.e., answers to questions like: Was the candidate’s behavior really an expression of ill will?; or Is the candidate involved a genuine participant in the moral sphere of human relations?), these judgments are based on principles internal to the practice. That is, their justification refers back to an account of the reactive attitudes and their role in personal relationships, not to some independent theoretical account of the conditions on being responsible.

Given the above, Strawson contends that it is pointless to ask whether the practice of holding responsible can be rationally justified if determinism is true. This is either because it is not psychologically possible to divest ourselves of these reactions and so continually inhabit the objective standpoint, or even if that were possible, because it is not clear that rationality could ever demand that we give up the reactive attitudes, given the loss in quality of life should we do so. In sum, Strawson attempts to turn the traditional debate on its head, for now judgments about being responsible are understood in relation to the role reactive attitudes play in the practice of holding responsible, rather than the other way around. Whereas judgments are true or false and thereby can generate the need for justification, the desire for good will and those attitudes generated by it possess no truth value themselves, thereby eliminating any need for an external justification (Magill, p. 21, Double, 1996b, p. 848).

Strawson’s concept of moral responsibility yields a compatibilist account of being responsible but one that departs significantly from earlier such accounts in two respects. First, Strawson’s is a compatibilist view by default only. That is, on Strawson’s view, the problem of determinism and freedom/responsibility is not so much resolved by showing that the objective conditions on being responsible are consistent with one’s being determined but rather dissolved by showing that the practice of holding people responsible relies on no such conditions and therefore needs no external justification in the face of determinism. Second, Strawson’s is a merit-based form of compatibilism. That is, unlike most former consequentialist forms of compatibilism, it helps to explain why we feel that some agents deserve our censure or merit our praise. They do so because they have violated, met, or exceeded our demand for a reasonable degree of good will. A number of compatibilists have followed Strawson in this regard, incorporating the reactive attitudes into their theories of moral responsibility in order to provide an account that reflects a merit-based conception of moral responsibility.

Most agree that Strawson’s discussion of the reactive attitudes is a valuable contribution to our understanding of the practice of holding responsible, but many have taken issue with Strawson’s contentions about the insular nature of that practice, namely a) that since propriety judgments about the reactive attitudes are strictly internal to the practice (i.e., being responsible is defined in relation to the practice of holding responsible), their justification cannot be considered from a standpoint outside that practice; and b) that since the reactive attitudes are natural responses deriving from our psychological constitution, they cannot be dislodged by theoretical considerations. Responding to the first of these, some have argued that it does seem possible to critique existing practices of holding responsible from standpoints outside them. For example, one might judge that either one’s own existing community practice or some other community’s practice of holding responsible ought to be modified (Fischer and Ravizza, 1993, p. 18). If such evaluations are legitimate, then, contrary to what Strawson suggests, the justification of an existing practice can be questioned from a standpoint external to it. In other words, being responsible cannot be explicated strictly in terms of an existing practice of holding responsible. This, then, would suggest a possible role to be played by theoretical conditions on being responsible, whether they are compatibilist or incompatibilist in nature.

Replying to the second of the above contentions, some have argued that incompatibilist intuitions are embedded in the reactive attitudes themselves so that these attitudes cannot persist unless some justification can be given of them, or more weakly, that they cannot but be disturbed if something like determinism is true. Here, cases are often cited where negative reactive attitudes seem to be dispelled or mitigated upon learning that an agent’s past includes severe deprivation and/or abuse. There is a strong pull to think that our reactive attitudes are altered in such cases because we perceive such a background to be deterministic. If this is the proper interpretation of the phenomenon, then it is evidence that theoretical considerations, like the truth of determinism, could in fact dislodge the reactive attitudes (Nagel, p. 125; Kane, 84-89; Galen Strawson, 1986, p. 88, Honderich, 1988, vol. 2: ch. 1; and replies by Watson, 1987, 1996, p. 240; and McKenna, 1998).

Finally, some have taken this last point -- that incompatibilist intuitions may be embedded in or necessarily linked to the reactive attitudes -- further, challenging Strawson’s and others’ assumption that the reactive attitudes form a unitary class with respect to issues of freedom and responsibility. Instead, this group argues that the reactive attitudes are linked to bifurcated and contradictory ideas about freedom and moral responsibility, suggesting some level of incoherence in the concepts themselves (Nagel, G. Strawson, 1986,105-117, 307-317; Honderich, 1988, vol. 2: ch. 1; Double, 1991; Double 1996a, chs. 6-7). Some, for example Ted Honderich, have argued that our idea of a free and responsible agent as an originator of action is incompatibilistic, while our idea of free and responsible action as voluntary is compatibilistic.[13] Reflection on causal determinism thus generates conflicting attitudes. Honderich believes that a compromise, of sorts, can be reached between these opposing ideas and associated attitudes given the truth of determinism -- that in spite of this one can train oneself to adopt a coherent and meaningful conception of both freedom and responsibility (Honderich, 1988, vol. 2: ch. 1, Honderich 1996). Others, including Richard Double, contend that the incongruity of our ideas and attitudes concerning freedom and moral responsibility are radically irreconcilable, which entails that our conceptions of freedom and responsibility are incoherent. On this view, there is no correct view about or attitudinal response to determinism, if the latter is descriptive of the nature of our world (Double, 1991, Double 1996a-b).

The future direction of reflection on moral responsibility is uncertain. On the one hand, there has been a resurgence of interest in metaphysical treatments of freedom and moral responsibility in recent years, a sign that many philosophers in this area have not been persuaded by Strawson’s central critique of such treatments. On the other hand, the interpretation and further development of Strawson’s work have increased in both their significance and influence. What is clear is that the long-standing interest in understanding the concept of moral responsibility shows no sign of abating.


Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with further suggestions.]

Related Entries

Aristotle: ethics | compatibilism | determinism, causal | fatalism | free will | incompatibilism: (nondeterministic) theories of free will | luck: moral | responsibility: collective

Copyright © 2001 by
Andrew S. Eshleman

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Table of Contents buttonTable of Contents

First published: January 5, 2001
Content last modified: January 5, 2001