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Many-Valued Logic

Many-valued logics are non-classical logics. They are similar to classical logic because they accept the principle of truth-functionality, namely, that the truth of a compound sentence is determined by the truth values of its component sentences (and so remains unaffected when one of its component sentences is replaced by another sentence with the same truth value). But they differ from classical logic by the fundamental fact that they do not restrict the number of truth values to only two: they allow for a larger set W of truth degrees.

Just as the notion of ‘possible worlds’ in the semantics of modal logic can be reinterpreted (e.g., as ‘moments of time’ in the semantics of tense logic or as ‘states’ in the semantics of dynamic logic), there does not exist a standard interpretation of the truth degrees. How they are to be understood depends on the actual field of application. It is general usage, however, to assume that there are two particular truth degrees, usually denoted by "0" and "1", respectively, which act like the traditional truth values "falsum" and "verum".

The formalized languages for systems of many-valued logic (MVL) follow the two standard patterns for propositional and predicate logic, respectively:

As usual in logic, these languages are the basis for semantically as well as syntactically founded systems of logic.


There are two kinds of semantics for systems of many-valued logic. We discuss these in turn.

Standard Logical Matrices

The most suitable way of defining a system S of many-valued logic is to fix the characteristic logical matrix for its language, i.e. to fix: and additionally, A well-formed formula A of a propositional language counts as valid under some valuation (which maps the set of propositional variables into the set of truth degrees) iff it has a designated truth degree under . And A is logically valid or a tautology iff it is valid under all valuations.

In the case of a first-order language, such a well-formed formula A counts as valid under an interpretation of the language iff it has a designated truth degree under this interpretation and all assignments of objects from the universe of discourse of this interpretation to the object variables. A counts as logically valid iff it is valid under all interpretations.

Like in classical logic, such an interpretation has to provide

A model of some set of well-formed formulas is a valuation or an interpretation such that all A are valid under . That entails A means that each model of is also a model of A.

Algebraic Semantics

There is a second type of semantics for systems S of many-valued logic which is based on a whole characteristic class K of (similar) algebraic structures. Each such algebraic structure has to provide all the data which have to be provided by a characteristic logical matrix for the language of S.

The notion of validity of a formula A with respect to an algebraic structure from K is defined as if this structure would form a logical matrix. And logical validity here means validity for all structures from the class K.

The type of algebraic structures which may form such a characteristic class K for some system S of MVL is usually determined by the (syntactical or semantical) Lindenbaum algebra of S, and often plays also a crucial role within an algebraic completeness proof. The algebraic structures in K have a similar role for S as the Boolean algebras do for classical logic.

For particular systems of MVL one has e.g. the following characteristic classes of algebraic structures:

From a philosophical point of view, it would be preferable to have a semantic foundation for a system of MVL which uses a characteristic logical matrix. However, from a formal point of view, both approaches are equally important, and the algebraic semantics turns out to be the more general approach.

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Proof Theory

The main types of logical calculi are all available for systems of MVL: However, some of the above are available only for finitely valued systems.

Hilbert type calculi. These calculi are formed in the same way as the corresponding calculi for classical logic: some set of axioms is used together with a set of inference rules. The notion of derivation is the usual one.

Gentzen type sequent calculi. In addition to the usual types of sequent calculi, researchers have also recently started to discuss ‘hypersequent’ calculi for systems of MVL. Hypersequents are finite sequences of ordinary sequents.

For finitely valued systems, particularly m-valued ones, there are also sequent calculi which work with generalized sequents. In the m-valued case, these are sequences of length m of sets of formulas>.

Tableau calculi. The tree structure of the tableaux remains the same in these calculi as in the tableau calculi for classical logic. The labels of the nodes become more general objects, namely, signed formulas. A signed formula is a pair, consisting of a sign and a well-formed formula. A sign is either a truth degree, or a set of truth degrees.

Tableau calculi with signed formulas are usually restricted to finite-valued systems of MVL, so that they can be dealt with in an effective way.

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Systems of Many-Valued Logic

The main systems of MVL often come as families which comprise uniformly defined finite-valued as well as infinite-valued systems. Here is a list:

Lukasiewicz logics

The systems Lm and L are defined by the logical matrix which has either some finite set
Wm = {k/m1  |  0 k m1}
of rationals within the real unit interval, or the whole unit interval
W = [0,1] = {x R  |  0 x 1}
as the truth degree set. The degree 1 is the only designated truth degree.

The main connectives of these systems are a strong and a weak conjunction, & and , respectively, given by the truth degree functions

u & v = max {0, u + v1},

u v = min {u, v},

a negation connective determined by
u = 1u,
and an implication connective with truth degree function
u v = min {1, 1u + v}.

Often, two disjunction connectives are also used. These are defined in terms of & and , respectively, via the usual de Morgan laws using . For the first-order Lukasiewicz systems one adds two quantifiers , in such a way that the truth degree of xH(x) is the infimum of all the relevant truth degrees of H(x), and that the truth degree of xH(x) is the supremum of all the relevant truth degrees of H(x).

Gödel logics

The systems Gm and G are defined by the logical matrix which has either some finite set
Wm = {k/m1  |  0 k m1}
of rationals within the real unit interval, or the whole unit interval
W = [0,1] = {x R  |  0 x 1}
as the truth degree set. The degree 1 is the only designated truth degree.

The main connectives of these systems are a conjunction and a disjunction determined by the truth degree functions

u v = min {u, v},

u v = max {u, v},

an implication connective with truth degree function
and a negation connective with truth degree function

For the first-order Gödel systems one adds two quantifiers , in such a way that the truth degree of xH(x) is the infimum of all the relevant truth degrees of H(x), and that the truth degree of xH(x) is the supremum of all the relevant truth degrees of H(x).

t-Norm related systems

For infinite valued systems with truth degree set
W = [0,1] = {x R  |  0 x 1}
the influence of fuzzy set theory quite recently initiated the study of a whole class of such systems of MVL.

These systems are basically determined by a (possibly non-idempotent) strong conjunction connective &T which has as corresponding truth degree function a t-norm T, i.e. a binary operation T in the unit interval which is associative, commutative, non-decreasing, and has the degree 1 as a neutral element:

For all those t-norms which have the sup-preservation property
T(u, supi vi) = supi T(u,vi),
there is a standard way to introduce a related implication connective T with the truth degree function
u T v = sup {z  |  T(u,z) v}.
This is connected with the t-norm T by the crucial adjointness condition
T(u,v) w u (v T w),
which determines T uniquely for each T with sup-preservation property.

The language is further enriched with a negation connective, T, determined by the truth degree function

T u = u T 0.
This forces the language to have also a truth degree constant 0 to denote the truth degree 0 because then T becomes a definable connective.

Usually one adds as two further connectives a (weak) conjunction and a disjunction with truth degree functions.

u v = min {u, v},

u v = max {u, v}.

Particular cases of such t-norm related systems are the infinite valued Lukasiewicz and Gödel systems L, G, and also the product logic which has the usual arithmetic product as its basic t-norm.

The class of all t-norms, even of those which have the sup-preservation property, is very large. Actually one is able to axiomatize t-norm based systems for some particular classes of t-norms. And Hajek (1998) has given an axiomatization of the logic which has as its algebraic semantics the class of all t-norm based structures whose t-norm is a continuous function.

The axiomatization of further t-norm based systems, as well as the question for t-norm based quantifiers, are recent research problems.

3-valued systems

3-valued systems seem to be particularly simple cases which offer intuitive interpretations of the truth degrees; these systems include only one additional degree besides the classical truth values.

The mathematician and logician Kleene used a third truth degree for "undefined" in the context of partial recursive functions. His connectives were the negation, the weak conjunction, and the weak disjunction of the 3-valued Lukasiewicz system together with a conjunction + and an implication + determined by truth degree functions with the following function tables:

+ 0 ½ 1
0 0 ½ 0
½ ½ ½ ½
1 0 ½ 1

+ 0 ½ 1
0 1 1 1
½ ½ ½ ½
1 0 ½ 1
Here ½ is the third truth degree "undefined". In this Kleene system, the degree 1 is the only designated truth degree.

Blau (1978) used a different system as an inherent logic of natural language. In Blau’s system, both degrees 1 and ½ are designated. Other interpretations of the third truth degree ½, for example as "senseless", "undetermined", or "paradoxical", motivated the study of other 3-valued systems.

Dunn/Belnap’s 4-valued system

This particularly interesting system of MVL was the result of research on relevance logic, but it also has significance for computer science applications. Its truth degree set may be taken as
W* = {Ø, {}, {}, {, }},
and the truth degrees interpreted as indicating (e.g. with respect to a database query for some particular state of affairs) that there is This set of truth degrees has two natural (lattice) orderings: Given the inf and the sup under the truth ordering, there are truth degree functions for a conjunction and a disjunction connective. A negation is, in a natural way, determined by a truth degree function which exchanges the degrees { } and {}, and which leaves the degrees { , } and Ø fixed.

Actually, there is no standard candidate for a implication connective, and the choice of the designated truth degrees depends on the intended applications:

The choice of suitable entailment relations is still an open research topic.

Product systems

The general problem of finding an intuitive understanding of the truth degrees occasionally has a nice solution: one can consider them as comprising different aspects of the evaluation of sentences. In such a case of, say, k different aspects the truth degrees may be chosen as k-tuples of values which evaluate the single aspects. (And these, e.g., may be standard truth values.)

The truth degree functions over such k-tuples additionally can be defined "componentwise" from truth degree (or: truth value) functions for the values of the single components. In this manner, k logical systems may be combined into one many-valued product system.

In this way, the truth degrees of Dunn/Belnap’s 4-valued system can be considered as evaluating two aspects of a state of affairs (SOA) related to a database:

  1. whether there is positive information about the truth of this SOA or not, and
  2. whether there is positive information about the falsity of this SOA or not.
Both aspects can use standard truth values for this evaluation.

In this case, the conjunction, disjunction, and negation of Dunn/Belnap’s 4-valued system are componentwise definable by conjunction, disjunction, or negation, respectively, of classical logic, i.e. this 4-valued system is a product of two copies of classical two-valued logic.

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Applications of Many-Valued Logic

Many-valued logic was motivated in part by philosophical goals which were never achieved, and in part by formal considerations concerning functional completeness. In the earlier years of development, this caused some doubts about the usefulness of MVL. In the meantime, however, interesting applications were found in diverse fields. Some of these shall now be mentioned.

Applications to Linguistics. A challenging problem is the treatment of presuppositions in linguistics, i.e. of assumptions that are only implicit in a given sentence. So, for example, the sentence "The present king of Canada was born in Vienna" has the existential presupposition that there is a present king of Canada.

It is not a simple task to understand the propositional treatment of such sentences, e.g. to give criteria for forming their negation, or understanding the truth conditions of implications.

One type of solution for these problems refers to the use of many truth degrees, e.g. to product systems with ordered pairs as truth degrees: meaning that their components evaluate in parallel whether the presupposition is met, and whether the sentence is true or false. But 3-valued approaches have also been discussed.

Applications to Logic. A first type of application of systems of MVL to logic itself is to use them to gain a better understanding of other systems of logic. In this way the Gödel systems arose out of an approach to test whether intuitionistic logic may be understood as a finitely valued logic. The introduction of systems of MVL by Lukasiewicz (1920) was initially guided by the (finally unsuccessful) idea of understanding the notion of possibility, i.e. modal logic, in a 3-valued way.

A second type of application to logic is the merging of different types of logical systems, e.g. the formulation of systems with graded modalities. Melvin Fitting (1991/92) considers systems that define such modalities by merging modal and many-valued logic, with intended applications to problems of Artificial Intelligence.

A third type of application to logic is the modeling of partial predicates and truth value gaps. However, this is possible only in so far as these truth value gaps behave "truth functionally", i.e. in so far as the behavior of the truth value gaps in compound sentences can be described by suitable truth functions. (This is not always the case, e.g. it is not the case in formulations which use supervaluations.)

Applications to Philosophical Problems . How to understand the meaning of "truth" is an old philosophical problem. A logical approach toward this problem consists in enriching a formalized language L with a truth predicate T, to be applied to sentences of L -- or, even better, to be applied to sentences of the extension LT of L with the predicate T.

Based upon this idea, a reasonable theory of such languages which contain truth predicates was developed in the mid-1930s by A. Tarski. One of the results was that such a language LT, which contains its own truth predicate T and has a certain richness in expressive power, is necessarily inconsistent.

Another approach toward such languages LT which contain their own truth predicate T was offered by S. Kripke (1975) and is essentially based upon the idea of considering T as a partial predicate, i.e. as a predicate which has "truth value gaps". In a case Kripke (1975) considers, these truth value gaps behave "truth functionally" and so can be treated like a third truth degree. Their propagation in compound sentences then becomes describable by suitable truth degree functions of three-valued systems. In Kripke’s (1975) approach this reference was to three-valued systems which S. C. Kleene (1938) had considered in the (mathematical) context of partial functions and predicates in recursion theory.

A second application of MVL inside philosophy is to the old paradoxes like the Sorites (heap) or the falakros (bald man). (See the entry Sorites paradox.) In the case of the Sorites, the paradox is as follows:

(i) One grain of sand is not a heap of sand. And (ii) adding one grain of sand to something which is not a heap does not turn it into a heap. Hence (iii) a single grain of sand can never turn into a heap of sand, no matter how many grains of sand are added to it.
Thus the true premise (i) gives a false conclusion (iii) via a sequence of inferences using (ii). A rather natural solution inside an extension of MVL with a graded notion of inference, often called fuzzy logic, is to take the notion of heap as a vague one, i.e. as a notion which may hold true of given objects only to some (truth) degree. Additionally it is suitable to consider premise (ii) as only partially true, however to a degree which is quite near to the maximal degree 1. Then each single inference step is of the form: However, this inference has to involve truth degrees for the premises (a) and (ii), and has to provide a truth degree for the conclusion (b). The crucial idea for the modeling of this type of reasoning inside MVL is to make sure that the truth degree for (b) is smaller than the truth degree for (a) in case the truth degree for (ii) is smaller than the maximal one. In effect, then, the sentence n grains of sand do not make a heap tends toward being false for an increasing number n of grains.

Applications to Hardware Design. Classical propositional logic is used as a technical tool for the analysis and synthesis of some types of electrical circuits built up from "switches" with two stable states, i.e. voltage levels. A rather straightforward generalization allows the use of an m-valued logic to discuss circuits built from similar "switches" with m stable states. This whole field of application of many-valued logic is called many-valued (or even: fuzzy) switching. A good introduction is Epstein (1993).

Applications to Artificial Intelligence. AI is actually the most promising field of applications, which offers a series of different areas in which systems of MVL have been used.

A first area of application concerns vague notions and commonsense reasoning, e.g. in expert systems. Both topics are modeled via fuzzy sets and fuzzy logic, and these refer to suitable systems of MVL. Also, in databases and in knowledge-based systems one likes to store vague information.

A second area of application is strongly tied with this first one: the automatization of data and knowledge mining. Here clustering methods come into consideration; these refer via unsharp clusters to fuzzy sets and MVL. In this context one is also interested in automated theorem proving techniques for systems of MVL, as well as in methods of logic programming for systems of MVL.

Applications to Mathematics. There are three main topics inside mathematics which are related to many-valued logic. The first one is the mathematical theory of fuzzy sets, and the mathematical analysis of "fuzzy", or approximate reasoning. In both cases one refers to systems of MVL. The second topic has been approaches toward consistency proofs for set theory using a suitable system of MVL. And there is an -- often only implicit -- reference to the basic ideas of MVL in independence proofs (e.g. for systems of axioms) which often refer to logical matrices with more than two truth degrees. However, here MVL is more a purely technical tool because in these independence proofs one is not interested in an intuitive understanding of the truth degrees at all.

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History of Many-Valued Logic

Many-valued logic as a separate subject was created by the Polish logician and philosopher Lukasiewicz (1920), and developed first in Poland. His first intention was to use a third, additional truth value for "possible", and to model in this way the modalities "it is necessary that" and "it is possible that". This intended application to modal logic did not materialize. The outcome of these investigations are, however, the Lukasiewicz systems, and a series of theoretical results concerning these systems.

Essentially parallel to the Lukasiewicz approach, the American mathematician Post (1921) introduced the basic idea of additional truth degrees, and applied it to problems of the representability of functions.

Later on, Gödel (1932) tried to understand intuitionistic logic in terms of many truth degrees. The outcome was the family of Gödel systems, and a result, namely, that intuitionistic logic does not have a characteristic logical matrix with only finitely many truth degrees. A few years later, Jaskowski (1936) constructed an infinite valued characteristic matrix for intuitionistic logic. It seems, however, that the truth degrees of this matrix do not have a nice and simple intuitive interpretation.

A philosophical application of 3-valued logic to the discussion of paradoxes was proposed by the Russian logician Bochvar (1938), and a mathematical one to partial function and relations by the American logician Kleene (1938). Much later Kleene’s connectives also became philosophically interesting as a technical tool to determine fixed points in the revision theory of truth initiated by Kripke (1975).

The 1950s saw (i) an analytical characterization of the class of truth degree functions definable in the infinite valued propositional Lukasiewicz system by McNaughton (1951), (ii) a completeness proof for the same system by Chang (1958, 1959) introducing the notion of MV-algebra and a more traditional one by Rose/Rosser (1958), as well as (iii) a completeness proof for the infinite valued propositional Gödel system by Dummett (1959). The 1950s also saw an approach of Skolem (1957) toward proving the consistency of set theory in the realm of infinite valued logic.

In the 1960s, Scarpellini (1962) made clear that the first-order infinite valued Lukasiewicz system is not (recursively) axiomatizable. Hay (1963) as well as Belluce/Chang (1963) proved that the addition of one infinitary inference rule leads to an axiomatization of L. And Horn (1969) presented a completeness proof for first-order infinite valued Gödel logic. Besides these developments inside pure many-valued logic, Zadeh (1965) started an (application oriented) approach toward the formalization of vague notions by generalized set theoretic means, which soon was related by Goguen (1968/69) to philosophical applications, and which later on inspired also a lot of theoretical considerations inside MVL.

The 1970s mark a period of restricted activity in pure many-valued logic. There was, however, a lot of work in the closely related area of (computer science) applications of vague notions formalized as fuzzy sets, initiated e.g. by Zadeh (1975, 1979). And there was an important extension of MVL by a graded notion of inference and entailment in Pavelka (1979).

In the 1980s, fuzzy sets and their applications remained a hot topic that called for theoretical foundations by methods of many-valued logic. In addition, there were the first complexity results e.g. concerning the set of logically valid formulas in first-order infinite valued Lukasiewicz logic, by Ragaz (1983). Mundici (1986) started a deeper study of MV-algebras.

These trends have continued since the 1980s. Research has included applications of MVL to fuzzy set theory and their applications, detailed investigations of algebraic structures related to systems of MVL, the study of graded notions of entailment, and investigations into complexity issues for different problems in systems of MVL. This research was complemented by interesting work on proof theory, on automated theorem proving, by different applications in artificial intelligence matters, and by a detailed study of infinite valued systems based on t-norms.

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Related Entries

logic: classical | logic: fuzzy | logic: paraconsistent | logic: relevance | Prior, Arthur | Sorites paradox

Copyright © 2000 by
Siegfried Gottwald

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First published: April 25, 2000
Content last modified: April 25, 2000