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Leibniz’s Philosophy of Mind

Leibniz’s place in the history of the philosophy of mind is perhaps best secured by his distinctive opposition to materialism and dualism. But he is also, in some ways paradoxically, a prominent representative of the thesis that there is no mind-body interaction strictly speaking, but only a non-causal relationship of harmony, parallelism, or correspondence (pre-established harmony). It is in relation to this that he has interesting things to say about an allied topic made urgent by Descartes and his opponents, that of mind-body union.

But Leibniz has much to say about the philosophy of mind that goes well beyond these traditionally important topics. Perhaps surprisingly, his system sometimes contains ideas of relevance to contemporary discussions in the cognitive sciences. More generally, he discusses in depth the nature of mind, the nature of thought and of psychological motivation. We will take up these topics in what follows.

Matter and Thought

For present purposes, we may think of materialism as the view that everything that exists is material, or physical, with this view closely allied to another, namely, that mental states and processes are either identical to, or realized by, physical states and processes. Leibniz remained opposed to materialism throughout his career, particularly as it figured in the writings of Epicurus and Hobbes. The realms of the mental and the physical, for Leibniz, form two distinct realms--but not in a way conducive to dualism, or the view that there exists both thinking substance, and extended substance. By opposing both materialism and dualism, Leibniz carved himself an interesting place in the history of views concerning the relationship between thought and matter.

Most of Leibniz’s arguments against materialism are directly aimed at the thesis that perception and consciousness can be given mechanical (i.e. physical) explanations. His position is that perception and consciousness cannot possibly be explained mechanically, and, hence, could not be physical processes. His most famous argument against the possibility of materialism is found in section 17 of the Monadology (1714):

One is obliged to admit that perception and what depends upon it is inexplicable on mechanical principles, that is, by figures and motions. In imagining that there is a machine whose construction would enable it to think, to sense, and to have perception, one could conceive it enlarged while retaining the same proportions, so that one could enter into it, just like into a windmill. Supposing this, one should, when visiting within it, find only parts pushing one another, and never anything by which to explain a perception. Thus it is in the simple substance, and not in the composite or in the machine, that one must look for perception.
Leibniz’s argument seems to be this: the visitor of the machine, upon entering it, would observe nothing but the properties of the parts, and the relations they bear to one another. But no explanation of perception, or consciousness, can possibly be deduced from this conglomerate. No matter how complex the inner workings of this machine, nothing about them reveals that what is being observed are the inner workings of a conscious being. Hence, materialism must be false, for there is no possible way that the purely mechanical principles of materialism can account for the phenomena of consciousness.

In other writings, Leibniz suggests exactly what characteristic it is of perception and consciousness that the mechanical principles of materialism cannot account for. The following passages, the first from the New System of Nature (1695), the second from the Reply to Bayle (1702), are revealing in this regard:

Furthermore, by means of the soul or form, there is a true unity which corresponds to what is called the I in us; such a thing could not occur in artificial machines, nor in the simple mass of matter, however organized it may be.

But in addition to the general principles which establish the monads of which compound things are merely the results, internal experience refutes the Epicurean [i.e. materialist] doctrine. This experience is the consciousness which is in us of this I which apperceives things which occur in the body. This perception cannot be explained by figures and movements.

Leibniz’s point is that whatever is the subject of perception and consciousness must be truly one, a single "I" properly regarded as one conscious being. An aggregate of matter is not truly one and so cannot be regarded as a single I, capable of being the subject of a unified mental life. This interpretation fits nicely with Lebniz’s oft-repeated definition of perception as "the representation in the simple of the compound, or of that which is outside" (Principles of Nature and Grace, sec.2 (1714)). More explicitly, in a letter to Antoine Arnauld of 9 October 1687, Leibniz wrote that "in natural perception and sensation, it is enough for what is divisible and material and dispersed into many entities to be expressed or represented in a single indivisible entity or in a substance which is endowed with genuine unity." If perception (and hence, consciousness) essentially involves a representation of a variety of content in a simple, indivisible "I," then we may construct Leibniz’s argument against materialism as follows: Materialism holds that matter can explain (is identical with, can give rise to) perception. A perception is a state whereby a variety of content is represented in a true unity. Thus, whatever is not a true unity cannot give rise to perception. Whatever is divisible is not a true unity. Matter is infinitely divisible. Hence, matter cannot form a true unity. Hence, matter cannot explain (be identical with, give rise to) perception. If matter cannot explain (be identical to, give rise to) perception, then materialism is false. Hence, materialism is false.

Leibniz rejected materialism on the grounds that it could not, in principle, ever capture the "true unity" of perceptual consciousness, that characteristic of the self which can simultaneously unify a manifoldness of perceptual content. If this is Leibniz’s argument, it is of some historical interest that it bears striking resemblances to contemporary objections to certain materialist theories of mind. Many contemporary philosophers have objected to some versions of materialism on the basis of thought experiments like Leibniz’s: experiments designed to show that qualia and consciousness are bound to elude certain materialist conceptions of the mind (cf. Searle 1980; Nagel 1974; McGinn 1989; Jackson 1982).

Leibniz’s rejection of materialist conceptions of the mind was coupled with a strong opposition to dualistic views concerning the relationship between mind and body, particularly the substance dualism that figured in the philosophy of Descartes and his followers. According to this dualism, the world fundamentally consists of two disparate substances: extended material substance (body) and unextended thinking substance (mind). This bifurcation, of course, carries no burden of holding that the operations of the mental are realized by the operations of the physical. But despite his claim that consciousness and perception cannot be realized by, nor reduced to, the mechanical operations of matter, Leibniz found the alternative of postulating two distinct kinds of substance equally implausible.

Leibniz’s opposition to Cartesian dualism stems not from a rejection of unextended substance, but from his denial of the existence of genuine extended material substance. To begin with, Leibniz held the Scholastic thesis that "being" and "one" are equivalent. He writes to Arnauld: "To be brief, I hold as axiomatic the identical proposition which varies only in emphasis: that what is not truly one being is not truly one being either" (30 April 1687). For Leibniz, in order for something to count as a real being--a substance--it must be "truly one," or an entity endowed with genuine unity. And, as we saw above, in order for something to be a genuine unity, it must be a simple, indivisible entity. "Substantial unity," he writes, "requires a complete, indivisible and naturally indestructible entity" (to Arnauld, 28 November 1686). But matter is extended, and thus, Leibniz believes, infinitely divisible. Hence, there is no such thing, for Leibniz, as material substance.

There is a positive thesis which goes hand-in-hand with Leibniz’s negative thesis against material substance, and which helps to explain further his rejection of material substance. It is summarized in the following passage from a letter to Arnauld of 30 April 1687:

I believe that where there are only beings through aggregation, there will not even be real beings. For every being through aggregation presupposes beings endowed with a true unity, because it obtains its reality from nowhere but that of its constituents, so that it will have no reality at all if each constituent being is still an entity through aggregation; or else, one must yet seek another basis to its reality, which in this way, if one must constantly go on searching, can never be found. . . . If there are aggregates of substances, there must also be genuine substances from which all the aggregates result. One must therefore necessarily arrive either at mathematical points from which certain authors make up extension, or at Epicurus’s and M. Cordemoy’s atoms (which you, like me, dismiss), or else one must acknowledge that no reality can be found in bodies, or finally one must recognize certain substances in them that possess a true unity.
According to Leibniz, bodies (qua material) are aggregates, and an aggregate, of course, is not a substance on account of its lack of unity. The claim in the above passage is that whatever being, or reality, an aggregate has derives from the being and reality of its constituents. Thus, Leibniz thinks that if a body is to have any reality at all, if it is to be more than a mere "phenomenon, lacking all reality as would a coherent dream," then it must ultimately be composed of things which are real beings. Atoms, he claims, are unfit for this role, because they are themselves extended beings, and for Leibniz, divisibility is of the essence of extension. That is, those who believe in indivisible atoms make matter "divisible in one place, indivisible in another" (On Nature Itself (1698)), but "we cannot explain why bodies of a definite smallness [i.e. atoms] should not be further divisible" (Primary Truths (1686)). Every extended mass, for Leibniz, is composed of extended parts, and so even if we could conceive of an atom as composed of parts which cannot be physically divided, "an invincible attachment of one part to another would not at all destroy the diversity of these parts" (New System of Nature, (1695)), or it would not at all overcome the fact that it is an aggregate composed of parts, and not truly one being. Likewise, mathematical points, "even an infinity of points gathered into one, will not make extension," (to Des Bosses, 30 April 1709) and so cannot be understood as the constituents of extended bodies. Hence, Leibniz opts for the last of the above quoted alternatives: the constituents of bodies are "certain substances ... that possess a true unity." These substances are partless, unextended, and indivisible, and therefore real beings in Leibniz’s sense. Indeed, in several writings, Leibniz invites us to conceive of these substances on the model of our notion of souls. These simple substances are the only things which suffice for grounding the reality of bodies. To be sure, substances, Leibniz tells us, do not constitute a body as parts of the body, but as the "first elements," or "primitive unities," of the body. As he sometimes puts it, bodies "result from" these constitutive unities. That is, bodies just are aggregates of substances which appear to us as extended corporeal phenomena, though they are "well-founded" phenomena; they have their foundation in real beings.

In short, Leibniz stands in a special position with respect to the history of views concerning thought and its relationship to matter. He rejects the materialist position that thought and consciousness can be captured by purely mechanical principles. But he also rejects the dualist position that the universe must therefore be bifurcated into two different kinds of substance, thinking substance, and material substance. Rather, it is his view that the world consists solely of one type of substance, though there are infinitely many substances of that type. These substances are partless, unextended entities, some of which are endowed with thought and consciousness, and others of which found the phenomenality of the corporeal world. The sum of these views secures Leibniz a distinctive position in the history of the philosophy of mind.

Denial of Mind-Body Interaction, Assertion of Pre-established Harmony

A central philosophical issue of the seventeenth century concerned the apparent causal relations which hold between the mind and the body. In most seventeenth-century settings this issue was discussed within the context of substance dualism, the view that mind and body are different kinds of substance. For Leibniz, this is a particularly interesting issue in that he remained fundamentally opposed to dualism. But although Leibniz held that there is only one type of substance in the world, and thus that mind and body are ultimately composed of the same kind of substance (a version of monism), he also held that mind and body are metaphysically distinct. There are a variety of interpretations of what this metaphysical distinctness consists in for Leibniz, but on any plausible interpretation it is safe to assume (as Leibniz seems to have done) that for any person P, P’s mind is a distinct substance (a soul) from P’s body. With this assumption in hand, we may formulate the central issue in the form of a question: how is it that certain mental states and events are coordinated with certain bodily states and events, and vice-versa? There were various attempts to answer this question in Leibniz’s time period. For Descartes, the answer was mind-body interactionism: the mind can causally influence the body, and (most commentators have held) vice-versa. For Malebranche, the answer was that neither created minds nor bodies can enter into causal relations because God is the only causally efficient being in the universe. God causes certain bodily states and events on the occasion of certain mental states and events, and vice-versa. Leibniz found Descartes’ answer unintelligible (cf. Theodicy, sec. 60), and Malebranche’s excessive because miraculous (cf. Letter to Arnauld, 14 July 1686).

Leibniz’s account of mind-body causation was in terms of his famous doctrine of the preestablished harmony. According to the latter, (1) no state of a created substance has as a real cause some state of another created substance (i.e. a denial of inter-substantial causality); (2) every non-initial, non-miraculous, state of a created substance has as a real cause some previous state of that very substance (i.e. an affirmation of intra-substantial causality); and (3) each created substance is programmed at creation such that all its natural states and actions are carried out in conformity with all the natural states and actions of every other created substance.

Formulating (1) through (3) in the language of minds and bodies, Leibniz held that no mental state has as a real cause some state of another created mind or body, and no bodily state has as a real cause some state of another created mind or body. Further, every non-initial, non-miraculous, mental state of a substance has as a real cause some previous state of that mind, and every non-initial, non-miraculous, bodily state has as a real cause some previous state of that body. Finally, created minds and bodies are programmed at creation such that all their natural states and actions are carried out in mutual coordination.

According to Leibniz, what appear to be real causal relations between mind and body are, in metaphysical reality, the mutual conformity or coordination of mind and body--in accordance with (3)--with no interaction or divine intervention involved. For example, suppose that Smith is pricked with a pin (call this bodily state Sb) and pain ensues (call this mental state Sm), a case of apparent body to mind causation. Leibniz would say that in such a case some state of Smith’s mind (soul) prior to Sm was the real cause of Sm, and Sb was not a causal factor in the obtaining of Sm. Suppose now that Smith has a desire to raise his arm (call this mental state Sm), and the raising of his arm ensues (call this bodily state Sb), a case of apparent mind to body causation. Leibniz would say that in such a case some state of Smith’s body prior to Sb was the real cause of Sb and Sm was not a causal factor in the obtaining of Sb. So although substances do not causally interact, their states accommodate one another as if there were causal interaction among substances.

It should be noted, however, that Leibniz did think that there was a sense in which one could say that mental events influence bodily events, and vice-versa. He wrote to Antoine Arnauld that although "one particular substance has no physical influence on another . . . nevertheless, one is quite right to say that my will is the cause of this movement of my arm . . .; for the one expresses distinctly what the other expresses more confusedly, and one must ascribe the action to the substance whose expression is more distinct" (28 November 1686 (draft)). In this passage, Leibniz sets forth what he takes the metaphysical reality of apparent inter-substantial causation to amount to. We begin with the thesis that every created substance perceives the entire universe, though only a portion of it is perceived distinctly, most of it being perceived unconsciously, and, hence, confusedly. Now consider two created substances, x and y (x not identical to y), where some state of x is said to be the cause of some state of y. Leibniz’s analysis is this: when the causal state of affairs occurred, the relevant perceptions of substance x became more distinct, while the relevant perceptions of substance y became more confused. Insofar as the relevant perceptions of x become increasingly distinct, it is "causally" active; insofar as the relevant perceptions of substance y become increasingly confused, it is passive. In general, causation is to be understood as an increase in distinctness on the part of the causally active substance, and an increase in confusedness on the part of the passively effected substance. Again, each substance is programmed at creation to be active/passive at the relevant moment, with no occurrence of real substantial interaction.

It is difficult to say exactly why Leibniz denied inter-substantial causation. Some of the things he tells us, in both private and public writings, seem unsatisfactory for one reason or another. For example, in Primary Truths (1686?), we are given this:

Strictly speaking, one can say that no created substance exerts a metaphysical action or influx on any other thing. For, not to mention the fact that one cannot explain how something can pass from one thing into the substance of another, we have already shown that from the notion of each and every thing follows all of its future states. What we call causes are only concurrent requisites, in metaphysical rigor.
Here Leibniz gives a reason tied to his complete concept theory of substance, according to which "the nature of an individual substance or of a complete being is to have a notion so complete that it is sufficient to contain and to allow us to deduce from it all the predicates of the subject to which this notion is attributed" (Discourse on Metaphysics, sec. 8). But there are, it seems, at least two problems with this explanation. First, Leibniz moves rather quickly from a conceptual explanation of substance in terms of the complete concept theory, to the conclusion that this consideration is sufficient to explain the activity of concrete substances. Second, even if conceptual considerations about substances were sufficient to explain their apparent causal activity, it does not seem to follow that substances do not interact--unless one is assuming that causal overdetermination is not a genuine possibility. Leibniz seems to be assuming just that, but without argument.

Sometimes Leibniz gives a more familiar line of reasoning. At Monadology 7, we read this:

There is no way of explaining how a monad can be altered or changed internally by some other creature, since one cannot transpose anything in it, nor can one conceive of any internal motion that can be excited, directed, augmented, or diminished within it, as can be done in composites, where there can be change among the parts. The monads have no windows through which something can enter or leave. Accidents cannot be detached, nor can they go about outside of substances, as the sensible species of the Scholastics once did. Thus, neither substance nor accident can enter a monad from without.
He seems to think that causal interaction between two beings requires the transmission or transposition of the parts of those beings. But substances are simple unextended entities which contain no parts. Thus, there is no way to explain how one substance could influence another. Unfortunately, however, this line of reasoning would seem to also rule out one case of inter-substantial causation which Leibniz allows, viz., God’s causal action on finite simple substances.

Language and Mind

Some scholars have suggested that Leibniz should be regarded as one of the first thinkers to envision something like the idea of artificial intelligence (cf. Churchland 1984; Pratt 1987). Whether or not he should be regarded as such, it is clear that Leibniz, like contemporary cognitive scientists, saw an intimate connection between the form and content of language, and the operations of the mind. Indeed, according to his own testimony in the New Essays, he "really believe[s] that languages are the best mirror of the human mind, and that a precise analysis of the signification of words would tell us more than anything else about the operations of the understanding" (bk.III, ch.7, sec.6 (RB, 333)). This view of Leibniz’s led him to formulate a plan for a "universal language," an artificial language composed of symbols, which would stand for concepts or ideas, and logical rules for their valid manipulation. He believed that such a language would perfectly mirror the processes of intelligible human reasoning. It is this plan that has led some to believe that Leibniz came close to anticipating artificial intelligence. At any rate, Leibniz’s writings about this project (which, it should be noted, he never got the chance to actualize) reveal significant insights into his understanding of the nature of human reasoning. This understanding, it turns out, is not that different from contemporary conceptions of the mind, as many of his discussions bear considerable relevance to discussions in the cognitive sciences.

According to Leibniz, natural language, despite its powerful resources for communication, often makes reasoning obscure since it is an imperfect mirror of intelligible thoughts. As a result, it is often difficult to reason with the apparatus of natural language, "since it is full of innumerable equivocations" (On the Universal Science: Characteristic (undated); G VII, 205 (S, 18)). Perhaps this is because of his view that the terms of natural language stand for complex, or derivative, concepts--concepts which are composed of, and reducible to, simpler concepts. With this "combinatorial" view of concepts in hand, Leibniz notices "that all human ideas can be resolved into a few as their primitives" (On the Universal Science: Characteristic; G VII, 205 (S, 18)). We could then assign symbols, or "characters," to these primitive concepts from which we could form characters for derivative concepts by means of combinations of the symbols. As a result, Leibniz tells us, "it would be possible to find correct definitions and values and, hence, also the properties which are demonstrably implied in the definitions" (On the Universal Science: Characteristic; G VII, 205 (S, 19)). The totality of these symbols would form a "universal characteristic," an ideal language in which all human concepts would be perfectly represented, and their constitutive nature perfectly transparent. Now it is true that Leibniz eventually came to doubt "whether any concept of this [primitive] kind appears distinctly to men, namely, in such a way that they know they have it" (An Introduction to a Secret Encyclopedia (1679?); C, 513 (MP, 7)). But it is also clear that he did not see this skepticism concerning our ability to reach the primitive concepts as much of a barrier to the project of a universal language. He writes in The Art of Discovery (1685) that "there are certain primitive terms which can be posited, if not absolutely, at least relatively to us" (C, 176 (W, 51)). The suggestion seems to be that even if we cannot provide a catalog of absolutely primitive concepts, we can nevertheless construct a characteristic based on concepts which cannot be further resolved by humans.

In addition to the resolution of concepts, and their symbolic assignments, Leibniz envisages the formulation of logical rules for the universal characteristic. He claims that "it is plain that men make use in reasoning of several axioms which are not yet quite certain" (The Method of Certitude and the Art of Discovery (undated); G VII, 183 (W, 49)). Yet with the explicit formulation of these rules for the logical manipulation of the symbols--rules which humans use in reasoning--we would be in possession of a universal language which would mirror the relations between the concepts used in human reasoning. Indeed, the universal characteristic was intended by Leibniz as an instrument for the effective calculation of truths. Like formal logic systems, it would be a language capable of representing valid reasoning patterns by means of the use of symbols. Unlike formal logic systems, however, the universal language would also express the content of human reasoning in addition to its formal structure. In Leibniz’s mind, "this language will be the greatest instrument of reason," for "when there are disputes among persons, we can simply say: Let us calculate, without further ado, and see who is right" (The Art of Discovery (1685); C, 176 (W, 51)).

Judging from Leibniz’s plans for a universal language, it is clear that Leibniz had a specific view about the nature of human cognitive processes, particularly about the nature of human reasoning. According to this view, cognition is essentially symbolic: it takes place in a system of representations which possesses language-like structure. Indeed, it was Leibniz’s view that "all human reasoning uses certain signs or characters," (On the Universal Science: Characteristic; G VII, 204 (S, 17)) and "if there were no characters, we could neither think of anything distinctly nor reason about it" (Dialogue (1677); G VII, 191 (A&G, 271)). Add to this conception Leibniz’s view that human cognitive processes follow determinable axioms of logic, and the picture that emerges is one according to which the mind operates, at least when it comes to intelligible reasoning, by following implicit algorithmic procedures. Regardless of whether or not Leibniz should be seen as the grandfather of artificial intelligence, he did conceive of human cognition in essentially computational terms. In fact, as early as 1666, remarking favorably on Hobbes’ writings, Leibniz wrote: "Thomas Hobbes, everywhere a profound examiner of principles, rightly stated that everything done by our mind is a computation " (On the Art of Combinations (1666); G IV, 64 (P, 3)).


Works of Leibniz

A Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe. Edited by the German Academy of Science. Darmstadt and Berlin: Berlin Academy, 1923-. Cited by series, volume, and page.
A&G Philosophical Essays. Edited and translated by Roger Ariew and Daniel Garber. Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989.
C Opuscules et Fragments Inédits de Leibniz. Edited by Louis Couturat. Paris: Felix Alcan, 1903.
G Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz. Edited by C.I. Gerhardt. Berlin: Weidman, 1875-1890. Cited by volume and page.
Grua Textes Inédits. Edited by Gaston Grua. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1948.
H Theodicy. Edited by Austin Farrer and translated by E.M. Huggard. New Haven: Yale UP, 1952.
L Philosophical Papers and Letters. Edited by Leroy Loemker, 2nd ed. Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969.
LA The Leibniz-Arnauld Correspondence. Translated and edited by H.T. Mason. Manchester: Manchester UP, 1967.
MP Philosophical Writings. Translated and edited by Mary Morris and G.H.R. Parkinson. London: Dent, 1973.
P Leibniz: Logical Papers. Translated and edited by G.H.R. Parkinson. Oxford: Oxford UP, 1966.
RB New Essays on Human Understanding. Translated and edited by Peter Remnant and Jonathon Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge UP, 1982.
S Monadology and Other Philosophical Essays. Translated and edited by Paul Schrecker and Anne Martin Schrecker. New York: Bobbs-Merrill Co., 1965.
W Leibniz: Selections. Edited by Philip P. Wiener. New York: Charles Scribner’s Sons, 1951.

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

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Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm

Copyright © 1997, 1998 by
Mark Kulstad and Laurence Carlin

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First published: September 22, 1997
Content last modified: January 25, 1998