|This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.|
This entry will focus on principles of distributive justice designed to cover the distribution of material goods and services to individuals. Principles of this kind have been the dominant source of Anglo-American debate on distributive justice over the last three decades.
Even with this ostensibly simple principle some of the difficult specification problems of distributive principles can be seen. The two main problems are the construction of appropriate indices for measurement (the index problem), and the specification of time frames. Because there are numerous proposed solutions to these problems the principle of strict equality is not a single principle but a name for a group of closely related principles. This range of possible specifications occurs with all the common principles of distributive justice.
The index problem arises primarily because the goods to be distributed need to be measured if they are going to be distributed according to some pattern (such as equality). The strict equality principle stated above says that there should be the same level of material goods and services. The problem is how to specify and measure levels. One way of solving the index problem in the strict equality case is to specify that everyone should have the same bundle of material goods and services rather than the same level (so everyone would have 4 oranges, 6 apples, 1 bike, etc.). The main problem with this solution is that there will be many other allocations of material goods and services which will make some people better off without making anybody else worse off. For instance, a person preferring apples to oranges will be better off if she swaps some of the oranges from her bundle for some of the apples belonging to a person preferring oranges to apples. Indeed, it is likely that everybody will have something they would wish to trade in order to make themselves better off. As a consequence, requiring identical bundles will make virtually everybody materially worse off than they would be under an alternative allocation. So specifying that everybody must have the same bundle of goods does not seem to be a satisfactory way of solving the index problem. Some index for measuring the value of goods and services is required.
Money is an index for the value of material goods and services. It is an imperfect index and its pitfalls are well-documented in most economics textbooks. Moreover, once the goods to be allocated are extended beyond material ones to include opportunities, etc. it needs to be combined with other indices. (For instance, John Rawls index of primary goods - see Rawls 1971.) Nevertheless, using money as index for the value of material goods and services is the most practical response so far suggested to the index problem and is widely used in the specification and implementation of distributive principles.
The second main specification problem involves time frames. Many distributive principles identify and require that a particular pattern of distribution be achieved. But they also need to specify when the pattern is required. One version of the principle of strict equality requires that all people should have the same wealth at some initial point, after which people are free to use their wealth in whatever way they choose. Principles specifying initial distributions after which the pattern need not be preserved are commonly called starting-gate principles.
Because starting-gate forms of the strict equality principle may lead in time to very inegalitarian wealth distributions they are not common. The most common form of strict equality principle specifies that income (measured in terms of money) should be equal in each time-frame, though even this may lead to significant disparities in wealth if variations in savings are permitted. Hence, strict equality principles are commonly conjoined with some society-wide specification of just saving behavior.
There are a number of direct moral criticisms made of strict equality principles: that they unduly restrict freedom, that they do not give best effect to equal respect for persons, that they conflict with what people deserve, etc. (see Desert-Based Principles) But the most common criticism is a welfare-based one: that everyone can be materially better off if incomes are not strictly equal. (see Carens) It is this fact which partly inspired the Difference Principle.
The most widely discussed theory of distributive justice in the past three decades has been that proposed by John Rawls in his seminal work, A Theory of Justice. (Rawls 1971) Rawls proposes the following two principles of justice:
(1) Each person is to have an equal right to the most extensive total system of equal basic liberties compatible with a similar system of liberty for all.Rawls proposes these principles, along with the requirement that (1) must be satisfied prior to (2), and (2b) must be satisfied prior to (2a). Principle (1) and Principle (2b) may also be thought of as principles of distributive justice: (1) to govern the distribution of liberties, and (2b) the distribution of opportunities. Looking at the principles of justice in this way makes all principles of justice, principles of distributive justice (even principles of retributive justice will be included on the basis that they distribute negative goods). Keeping in line with the primary focus of this entry though, let us concentrate on (2a), known as the Difference Principle.
(2) Social and economic inequalities are to be arranged so that they are both:(a) to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged, consistent with the just savings principle, and(Rawls 1971, p.302)
(b) attached to offices and positions open to all under conditions of fair equality of opportunity.
The main moral motivation for the Difference Principle is similar to that for strict equality: equal respect for persons. Indeed the Difference Principle materially collapses to a form of strict equality under empirical conditions where differences in income have no effect on the work incentive of people. The overwhelming opinion though is that in the foreseeable future the possibility of earning greater income will bring forth greater productive effort. This will increase the total wealth of the economy and, under the Difference Principle, the wealth of the least advantaged. Opinion divides on the size of the inequalities which would, as a matter of empirical fact, be allowed by the Difference Principle, and on how much better off the least advantaged would be under the Difference Principle than under a strict equality principle. Rawls principle however gives fairly clear guidance on what type of arguments will count as justifications for inequality. Rawls is not opposed to the principle of strict equality per se, his concern is about the absolute position of the least advantaged group rather than their relative position. If a system of strict equality maximizes the absolute position of the least advantaged in society, then the Difference Principle advocates strict equality. If it is possible to raise the position of the least advantaged further by inequality of income and wealth, then the Difference Principle prescribes inequality up to that point where the absolute position of the least advantaged can no longer be raised.
Because there has been such extensive discussion of the Difference Principle in the last 30 years, there have been numerous criticisms of it from the perspective of all five other theories of distributive justice outlined here. Briefly, the main criticisms are as follows.
Advocates of strict equality argue that inequalities permitted by the Difference Principle are unacceptable even if they do benefit the least advantaged. The problem for these advocates is to explain in a satisfactory way why the relative position of the least advantaged is more important than their absolute position, and hence why society should be prevented from materially benefiting the least advantaged when this is possible. The most common explanation appeals to solidarity (Crocker): that being materially equal is an important expression of the equality of persons. Another common explanation appeals to the power some may have over others, if they are better off materially. Rawls response to this latter criticism appeals to the priority of his first principle: The inequalities consistent with the Difference Principle are only permitted so long as they do not result in unequal liberty. So, for instance, power differentials resulting from unequal income are not permitted if they violate the first principle of equal liberty, even if they increase the material position of the least advantaged group.
The Utilitarian objection to the Difference Principle is that it does not maximize utility. In A Theory of Justice, Rawls uses Utilitarianism as the main theory for comparison with his own, and hence he responds at length to this Utilitarian objection and argues for his own theory in preference to Utilitarianism (some of these arguments are outlined in the section on Welfare-Based Principles).
Libertarians object that the Difference Principle involves unacceptable infringements on liberty. For instance, the Difference Principle may require redistributive taxation to the poor, and Libertarians commonly object that such taxation involves the immoral taking of just holdings. (see Libertarian Principles)
The Difference Principle is also criticized as a primary distributive principle on the grounds that it mostly ignores claims that people deserve certain economic benefits in light of their actions. Advocates of Desert-Based Principles argue that some may deserve a higher level of material goods because of their hard work or contributions even if their unequal rewards do not also function to improve the position of the least advantaged. They also argue that the Difference Principle ignores the explanations of how people come to be in the more or less advantaged groups, when such explanations are relevant to the fairness of these positions.
Like Desert theorists, advocates of Resource-Based Principles criticize the Difference Principle on the basis that it is not ambition-sensitive enough, i.e. it is not sensitive to the consequences of peoples choices. They also argue that it is not adequately endowment-sensitive: it does not compensate people for natural inequalities (like handicaps or ill-health) over which people have no control.
The most prominent Resource-based theory, developed by Ronald Dworkin, (Dworkin 1981a, 1981b) argues that people should begin with equal resources, but may end up with unequal economic benefits as a result of their own choices. What constitutes a just material distribution is to be determined by the result of a thought experiment designed to model fair distribution. Suppose that everyone is given the same purchasing power and they use that purchasing power to bid, in a fair auction, for resources that will best suit their life plans. They are then permitted to use those resources as they see fit. Although people may end up with different economic benefits, none of them is given less consideration than another in the sense that if they wanted somebody elses resource bundle they could have bid for it instead. Of course, there is a problem with natural inequalities - they are not distributed according to peoples choices, nor are they justified by reference to some other morally relevant fact about people. To deal with this problem, Dworkin proposes a hypothetical compensation scheme in which he supposes that before the hypothetical auction people do not know their own natural endowments. However, they are able to buy insurance against being disadvantaged in the natural distribution of talents and they know that their payments will provide an insurance pool to compensate those people who are unlucky in the natural lottery.
Because the Resource-based theory has a similar motivation to the Difference Principle the moral criticisms of it tend to be variations on those leveled against the Difference Principle. However, unlike the Difference Principle, it is not at all clear what would constitute an implementation of Resource-based theories and their variants in a real economy. It seems impossible to measure differences in peoples natural talents - unfortunately, peoples talents do not neatly divide into the natural and developed categories. A system of special assistance to the physically and mentally handicapped and to the ill would be a partial implementation of the compensation system, but most natural inequalities would be left untouched by such assistance while the theory requires that such inequalities be compensated for. It is simply not clear how to implement equality of resources in a complex economy and hence despite its theoretical advantages, it is difficult to see it as a practical improvement on the Difference Principle.
Distribution according to some welfare function is most commonly advocated by economists, who normally state the explicit functional form. Philosophers tend to avoid this. Philosophers also tend to restrict themselves to a small subset of the available welfare functions. Although there are a number of advocates of alternative welfare functions (like equality of well-being), most philosophical activity has concentrated on a variant known as Utilitarianism. This theory can be used to illustrate most of the main characteristics of Welfare-based principles.
Historically, Utilitarians have used the term utility rather than welfare and utility has been defined variously as pleasure, happiness, or preference-satisfaction. So, for instance, the principle for distributing economic benefits for Preference Utilitarians is to distribute them so as to maximize preference-satisfaction. The welfare function for such a principle has a very simple theoretical form: it involves choosing that distribution maximizing the arithmetic sum of all satisfied preferences (unsatisfied preferences being negative), weighted for the intensity of those preferences.
The basic theory of Utilitarianism is one of the simplest to state and understand. Much of the work on the theory therefore has been directed towards defending it against moral criticisms, particularly from the point of view of commonsense morality. The criticisms and responses have been widely discussed in the literature on Utilitarianism as a general moral theory. Only two of the criticisms will be mentioned here.
The first is that Utilitarianism fails to take the distinctness of persons seriously. Maximization of preference-satisfaction is often taken as prudent in the case of individuals - people may take on greater burdens, suffering or sacrifice at certain periods of their lives so that their lives are overall better. The complaint against Utilitarianism is that it takes this principle, commonly described as prudent for individuals, and uses it on an entity, society, unlike individuals in important ways. While it may be acceptable for a person to choose to suffer at some period in her life (be it a day, or a number of years) so that her overall life is better, it is often argued against Utilitarianism that it is immoral to make some people suffer so that there is a net gain for other people. In the individual case, there is a single entity experiencing both the sacrifice and the gain. Also, the individuals, who suffer or make the sacrifices, choose to do so in order to gain some benefit they deem worth their sacrifice. In the case of society as a whole, there is no single experiential entity - some people suffer or are sacrificed so that others may gain. Furthermore, under Utilitarianism, there is no requirement for people to consent to the suffering or sacrifice.
A related criticism of Utilitarianism involves the way it treats individual preferences or interests referring to the holdings of others. For instance, some people may have a preference that some minority racial group should have less material benefits. Under Utilitarian theories, in their classical form, this preference or interest counts like any other in determining the best distribution. Hence, if racial preferences are widespread and are not outweighed by the minorities contrary preferences, Utilitarianism will recommend an inegalitarian distribution based on race.
Utilitarians have responded to these criticisms in a number of
ways. They argue that the empirical conditions are such that utility
maximizing will rarely require some to sacrifice or suffer for the
benefit of others, or to satisfy the racial prejudice of others. But
if their theory on rare occasions does require people sacrifice or
suffer in these ways, Utilitarians have defended this unintuitive
consequence on the grounds that our judgements about what is wrong
provide us with rules of thumb which are useful at the level of
commonsense morality but ultimately mistaken at the level of critical
theory. (see the entries on
Utilitarian distribution principles, like the other principles described here, have problems with specification and implementation. Most formulations of Utilitarianism require interpersonal comparisons of utility. This means, for instance, that we must be able to compare the utility one person gains from eating an apple with that another gains from eating an apple. Furthermore, Utilitarianism requires that differences in utility be measured and summed for widely disparate goods (so, for instance, the amount of utility a particular person gains from playing football is measured and compared with the amount of utility another gains from eating a gourmet meal). Critics have argued that such interpersonal utility comparisons are impossible, even in theory, due to one or both of the following: (1) It is not possible to combine all the diverse goods into a single index of utility which can measured for an individual; (2) Even if you could do the necessary weighing and combining of the goods to construct such an index for an individual, there is no conceptually adequate way of calibrating such a measure between individuals. (see Elster 1991)
Utilitarians face a much greater problem than this theoretical one in determining what material distribution is prescribed by their theory. Those who share similar Utilitarian theoretical principles frequently recommend very different material distributions to implement the principle. This problem occurs for other theories, but appears worse for Utilitarian and Welfare-based distribution principles. Recommendations for distributions or economic structures to implement other distributive principles commonly vary among advocates with similar theoretical principles, but the advocates tend to cluster around particular recommendations. This is not the case for Utilitarianism, with adherents uniformly dispersed in their recommendations across the full range of possible distributions and economic structures. For instance, there appear to be just as many Preference Utilitarians who believe their principle prescribes strict egalitarianism as there are Preference Utilitarians who believe it prescribes laissez faire capitalism.
There is an explanation for why Utilitarians are faced with greater difficulties in implementation. Other distributive principles can rule out, relatively quickly, some practical policies on the grounds that they clearly violate the guiding principle, but Utilitarians must examine, in great detail, all the policies on offer. For each policy, they must determine the distribution of goods and services yielded by the policy and at least three other factors: the identity of each person in the distribution (if individuals utility functions differ); the utility of each person from the goods and services distributed to them; the utility of each person from the policy itself. The size of the information requirements make this task impossible. Hence, broad assumptions must be made and each different set of assumptions will yield a different answer, and so the answers range across the full set of policies on offer. Moreover, there is no obvious way to arbitrate between the different sets of assumptions. For instance, suppose three Utilitarians agree on the same Utilitarian distributive principle. Utilitarian 1 however, asserts that the populations utility function conforms to function A (e.g. peoples marginal utility is linear in the goods and services they consume) and is maximized by Policy 1; and half to function B (e.g. peoples marginal utility is diminishing); while Utilitarian 2 asserts that half the populations utility function conforms to function A and half to function B (e.g. peoples marginal utility is diminishing) and is maximized by Policy 2; Utilitarian 3 asserts Utilitarian 2 is correct about the utility functions of the population but claims that Policy 3 will maximize utility. What seems impossible for advocates of Utilitarian-distribution principles to answer is how we would arbitrate these claims. If Utilitarian principles are to play a role in debates about distributive justice then this is the most important question to answer.
The different desert-based principles of distribution differ primarily according to what they identify as the basis for deserving. Most contemporary proposals for desert-bases fit into one of three broad categories:
Aristotle argued that virtue should be a basis for distributing
rewards, but most contemporary principles owe a larger debt to
Contemporary desert-principles all share the value of raising the standard of living - collectively, the social product. Under each principle, only activity directed at raising the social product will serve as a basis for deserving income. The concept of desert itself does not yield this value of raising the social product; it is a value societies hold independently. Hence, desert principles identifying desert-bases tied to socially productive activity (productivity, compensation, and effort all being examples of such bases) do not do so because the concept of desert requires this. They do so because societies value higher standards of living, and therefore choose the raising of living standards as the primary value relevant to desert-based distribution. This means that the full development of desert-based principles requires specification (and defense) of those activities which will or will not count as socially productive, and hence as deserving of remuneration. (Lamont 1994)
While some have sought to justify current capitalist distributions via
desert-based distributive principles,
The specification and implementation problems for desert-based distribution principles revolve mainly around the desert-bases: it is difficult to identify what is to count as a contribution, an effort or a cost, and it is even more difficult to measure these in a complex modern economy.
The main moral objection to desert-based principles is that they make economic benefits depend on factors over which people have little control. John Rawls has made one of the most widely discussed arguments to this effect (Rawls 1971), and while the strong form of this argument has been clearly refuted (Zaitchik, Sher), it remains a problem for desert-based principles. The problem is most pronounced in the case of productivity-based principles - a persons productivity seems clearly to be influenced by many factors over which the person has little or no control.
It is interesting to note that under most welfare-based principles, it is also the case that peoples level of economic benefits depend on factors beyond their control. But welfarists view this as a virtue of their theory, since they think the only morally relevant characteristic of any distribution is the welfare resulting from it. Whether the distribution ties economic benefits to matters beyond our control is morally irrelevant from the welfarist point of view. (As it happens, welfarists often hold the empirical claim that people have little control over their contributions to society anyway.) However, for peoples benefits to depend on factors beyond their control is a position much more awkward for desert theorists who emphasize to the free and deliberate choices people make to engage in more or less productive activity.
Nozick proposes a 3-part "Entitlement Theory".
If the world were wholly just, the following inductive definition would exhaustively cover the subject of justice in holdings:a. A person who acquires a holding in accordance with the principle of justice in acquisition is entitled to that holding.The complete principle of distributive justice would say simply that a distribution is just if everyone is entitled to the holdings they possess under the distribution. (Nozick, p.151)
b. A person who acquires a holding in accordance with the principle of justice in transfer, from someone else entitled to the holding, is entitled to the holding.
c. No one is entitled to a holding except by (repeated) applications of (a) and (b).
The statement of the Entitlement Theory includes reference to the principles of justice in acquisition and transfer. (For details of these principles see Nozick, pp.149-182.) The principle of justice in transfer is the least controversial and is designed to specify fair contracts while ruling out stealing, fraud, etc. The principle of justice in acquisition is more complicated and more controversial. The principle is meant to govern the gaining of exclusive property rights over the material world.
For the justification of these rights, Nozick takes his inspiration from John Lockes idea that everyone owns themselves and, by mixing ones labors with the world, self-ownership can generate ownership of some part of the material world. However, of Lockes mixing metaphor, Nozick legitimately asks: ...why isnt mixing what I own with what I dont own a way of losing what I own rather than a way of gaining what I dont? If I own a can of tomato juice and spill it in the sea so its molecules... mingle evenly throughout the sea, do I thereby come to own the sea, or have I foolishly dissipated my tomato juice? (Nozick 1974, p.174) Nozick concludes that what is significant about mixing our labor with the material world is that in doing so, we tend to increase the value of it, so that self-ownership can lead to ownership of the external world in such cases(Nozick 1974, pp. 149-182).
The obvious objection to this claim is that it is not clear why the first people to acquire some part of the material world should be able to exclude others from it (and, for instance, be the land owners while the later ones become the wage laborers). In response to this objection, Nozick puts a qualification on just acquisition, called the Lockean Proviso, whereby an exclusive acquisition of the external world is just, if, after the acquisition, there is enough and as good left in common for others. One of the main challenges for Libertarians has been to formulate a morally plausible interpretation of this proviso. According to Nozicks interpretation, an acquisition is just if and only if the position of others after the acquisition is no worse than their position was when the acquisition was unowned or held in common. For Nozicks critics, his proviso is unacceptably weak. This is because it fails to consider the position others may have achieved under alternative distributions and thereby instantiates the morally dubious criterion of whoever is first gets the exclusive spoils. For example, one can satisfy Nozicks proviso by acquiring a beach and charging $1 admission to those who previously were able to use the beach for free, so long as one compensates them with a benefit they deem equally valuable, such as a clean up or life-guarding service on the beach. However, the beach-goers would have been even better off had the more efficient organizer among them acquired the beach, charging only 50 cents for the same service, but this alternative is never considered under Nozicks proviso (Cohen, 1995).
Will Kymlicka has given a summary of the steps in Nozicks self-ownership argument:
The challenge for Libertarians then is to find a plausible reading of (3) which will yield (4). Moreover, at one point, Nozick claims the proviso must apply to both acquisitions and transfers, compounding the problem.
Of course, many existing holdings are the result of acquisitions or transfers which at some point did not satisfy principles (a) and (b) above. Hence, Nozick must supplement those principles with a principle of rectification for past injustice. Although he does not specify this principle he does describe its purpose:
This principle uses historical information about previous situations and injustices done in them... and information about the actual course of events that flowed from these injustices, until the present, and it yields a description (or descriptions) of holdings in the society. The principle of rectification presumably will make use of its best estimate of subjunctive information about what would have occurred... if the injustice had not taken place. If the actual description of holdings turns out not to be one of the descriptions yielded by the principle, then one of the descriptions yielded must be realized. (Nozick 1974, pp. 152-153)Nozick does not make a systematic attempt to provide a principle of rectification and neither has anyone else, but the absence of such a principle is much worse for a historical theory than for a patterned theory. Past injustices systematically undermine the justice of every subsequent distribution in historical theories. Nozick is clear that his historical theory is of no use in evaluating the justice of actual societies until such a theory of rectification is given:
In the absence of [a full treatment of the principle of rectification] applied to a particular society, one cannot use the analysis and theory presented here to condemn any particular scheme of transfer payments, unless it is clear that no considerations of rectification of injustice could apply to justify it. (Nozick 1974, p.231)Unfortunately for the theory, no such treatment will ever be forthcoming because the task is, for all practical purposes, impossible. The numbers of injustices across the history of each economy are enormous and the necessary details of the vast majority of injustices are simply unavailable. Even if the details of all the injustices were available it is doubtful that the counterfactual causal chains could be reliably determined. As a consequence, Nozicks entitlement theory will never provide any guidance as to what the current distribution of material holdings should be nor what distributions or redistributions are legitimate or illegitimate. (Indeed Nozick suggests, for instance, the Difference Principle may be the best implementation of the principle of rectification.) Although Nozick is fairly candid about this consequence, most of his supporters and critics have almost completely ignored it and have carried on a vigorous debate as though his theory is an attempt to tell us something about the justice of current economic distributions.
Libertarians inspired by Nozick usually advocate a system in which there are exclusive property rights, with the role of the government restricted to the protection of these property rights. The property rights commonly rule out taxation for purposes other than raising the funds necessary to protect property rights. The strongest critique of any attempt to institute such a system of legally protected property rights comes, as we have seen, from Nozicks theory itself - there seems no obvious reason to give strong legal protection to property rights which have arisen through violations of the just principles of acquisition and transfer. But putting this critique to one side for a moment, what other arguments are made in favor of exclusionary property rights?
As already noted, Nozick argues that because people own themselves and hence their talents, they own whatever they can produce with these talents. Moreover, it is possible in a free market to sell the products of exercising ones talents. Any taxation of the income from such selling, according to Nozick, institute[s] (partial) ownership by others of people and their actions and labor. (Nozick, p.172) People, according to this argument, have these exclusive rights of ownership. Taxation then, simply involves violating these rights and allowing some people to own (partially) other people. Moreover, it is argued, any system not legally recognizing these rights violates Kants maxim to treat people always as ends in themselves and never merely as a means. The two main difficulties with this argument have been: (1) to show that self-ownership is only compatible with having such exclusive property rights; and (2) that a system of exclusive property rights is the best system for treating people with respect, as ends in themselves.
Nozick candidly accepts that he does not himself give a systematic moral justification of the exclusionary property rights he advocates: This book does not present a precise theory of the moral basis of individual rights. (Nozick, p.xiv) But others have tried to provide more systematic justifications of similar rights (Hayek, Steiner, Lomasky) or to develop, more fully, justifications to which Nozick alludes.
In addition to the arguments from self-ownership, and the requirement
to treat people as ends in themselves, the most common other route for
trying to justify exclusive property rights has been to argue that
they are required for the maximization of freedom and/or
Table of Contents
First published: September 22, 1996
Content last modified: September 17, 1997