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Gregory's most important writing by far is his commentary on the first two books of the Sentences. Book I survives in some twenty complete manuscripts, while there are about a dozen for book II. The work was printed several times from 1482 to 1532, reprinted in 1955, and finally received a modern critical edition in six volumes in 1979-84 (Rimini 1979-84; Bermon 2001). Parts have been or are being translated into French, German, and English (Rimini, forthcoming). In addition to scriptural commentaries and his letters as prior general, smaller works have also been attributed to Gregory, including a work on usury, De usura, printed in Reggio Emilia in 1508 and in Rimini in 1622, and a treatise on the four cardinal virtues, De quatuor virtutibus cardinalibus. His tract on the intension and remission of forms, De intensione et remissione formarum corporalium, carries the incipit "Circa secundum partem huius distinctionis" and is, therefore, just an excerpt of the Sentences commentary, book I, distinction 17, part 2.
Although Gregory of Rimini has received considerable attention from historians of medieval thought, understanding his position in the history of philosophy has been made difficult by several problems that have plagued the historiography of fourteenth-century scholasticism. He flourished at a time that has been judged by historians as on the whole decadent, fideistic, and radically skeptical, in contrast to the period in which, for example, Thomas Aquinas worked (d. 1274); this historical viewpoint already made difficult an objective evaluation of Rimini. Historians also labeled Gregory a "nominalist," a term so broad and vague when applied to fourteenth-century thinkers that, when it was used without qualification, it tended to mislead and to obscure the differences among them, as for example between Ockham and Gregory. Finally, unlike Aquinas, Henry of Ghent, and John Duns Scotus, Gregory was active in an as yet severely understudied period, so that placing Gregory in his context is difficult and statements about Gregory's originality are precarious. The history of Gregory's own University of Paris in the quarter century before his Sentences lectures, in contrast to that of Oxford in the same years, is particularly unclear. Only careful diachronic studies of specific philosophical problems can provide a precise picture of Gregory's role in the history of philosophy, and few such studies have been accomplished thus far. There are some, however, and epistemology, foreknowledge, and predestination are examples of topics about which we know quite a bit (see below).
Generally, what has been learned so far is that Gregory was really the first to introduce to the University of Paris the exciting ideas developed at English schools between William of Ockham (ca. 1319) and Thomas Bradwardine (ca. 1344). Beginning with Gregory the names of Adam Wodeham, Richard Fitzralph, Walter Chatton, William Heytesbury, Thomas Buckingham, Richard Kilvington, Robert Halifax and others became common knowledge among Parisian scholars. Gregory was also deeply influenced by recent thinkers at his own university, both negatively and positively. The impact of Peter Auriol has long been recognized to be great, but recent studies have made clear that other figures, such as Francis of Marchia, Thomas of Strasbourg, Gerard Odonis, and Michael of Massa, had an influence on Gregory. The question of Gregory's relationship to his Parisian predecessors needs to be investigated more fully.
More clear is Gregory's importance in the late Middle Ages and Reformation. Many scholastics after 1350 copied large passages from his works. Prominent figures who plagiarized or borrowed from Gregory include the Cistercian James of Eltville, Pierre d'Ailly, and Henry of Langenstein, but other important thinkers such as Hugolino of Orvieto OESA, Marsilius of Inghen, and Peter of Candia OFM (Pope Alexander V) knew Gregory's works well. Few philosophers in the later fourteenth century can have been unaffected by his ideas. Gregory's impact both inside and outside the Augustinian Order continued into the fifteenth century. In the celebrated quarrel over future contingents at the University of Louvain (1465-1474), for example, several of the participants cited Gregory's position or even adopted it without attribution. Of course, the fact that only books I and II of Gregory's commentary circulated means that Gregory's direct impact is to be found in topics discussed in those books rather than in issues covered in books III and IV, such as the Immaculate Conception and the Eucharist, which had their own philosophical sub-issues.
Perhaps the most central element of Gregory of Rimini's thought and influence is his adherence to Augustine and the nature of that adherence. For one thing, Gregory simply read Augustine more carefully and extensively than most previous thinkers, and so, for example, Gregory was able to attack Peter Auriol for his faulty citations and quotations of Augustine. Gregory's interest in the works of Augustine has been seen as central to the development of a "historico-critical" method in philosophical theology, especially in the Augustinian Order, partly foreshadowing modern scholarly methods. In connection with this historico-critical method, Gregory was part of a general attempt to establish reliable texts of Augustine and to separate authentic works from the pseudo-Augustinian corpus. Quotations from Augustine, moreover, were cited with great accuracy and detail in Gregory's writings, and so his Sentences commentary, when not plagiarized for his own ideas, was often used as a source for Augustinian quotations (Trapp 1956).
Not surprisingly, Gregory's ideas are often Augustinian. Gregory's brand of doctrinal Augustinianism, influenced rather by the Franciscan and Oxonian tradition than the more Dominican (and Parisian) variety of Giles of Rome, soon dominated the Augustinian Hermits' philosophy and theology. Thus by the early 16th century Aegidistae and Gregoriistae schools of thought existed, and a recognized via Gregorii was present in many universities such as Wittenberg, the university of Gregory's fellow Augustinian Hermit Martin Luther (McGrath 1987). The fact that each book of his Sentences commentary was printed six times between 1482 and 1532 further helps explain why some of Gregory's ideas often resemble those of Luther and Jean Calvin. Gregory's thought may even have had a life after the reformation in Francisco Suarez.
A list of Gregory's philosophical positions would perhaps not be difficult to make, and neither would it be hard to describe his relation to Ockham on various topics (e.g. Smith 1999). In natural philosophy, for example, in agreement with Ockham, Gregory was a nominalist and employed "Ockham's" razor in denying that sudden change, motion, and time, for example, are independent entities (Brown 1998b). Gregory also claims that the world could have been eternal, and that an actual infinite is possible (Maier 1949). But in these cases one would like to know better the stances of Gregory's immediate predecessors, especially Parisians like Francis of Marchia, in order to determine the possible sources and degree of originality of Gregory's ideas. Otherwise, a list of Gregory's ideas is just that, a mere list. Consequently the focus here shall be on issues on which the theories of Gregory and his predecessors have been investigated in some depth.
In many ways Gregory was a philosopher's theologian, because he began with propositions from Scripture as premises for his arguments and proceeded deductively. In his deductive theology, Gregory devoted much time and space to defining his terms and exploring exhaustively the implications of possible solutions, a practice that makes his Sentences commentary a joy to read and a philosophical classic. In distinctions 38-41 of book I, Gregory tackled the general problem of divine foreknowledge and future contingents and the specific dilemma of predestination and free will. Gregory's positions on these questions have already been the subject of study for many decades, and recently historians have attempted to put Gregory into his immediate Parisian and Oxonian context. Moreover, Gregory's nickname, "the Torturer of Infants," stems in part from his stance on predestination. A discussion of Gregory's thought on these issues, therefore, provides a convenient introduction both to his noetic and to his position in history.
Gregory's treatment of divine foreknowledge and future contingents is aimed primarily at Peter Auriol and secondarily at Oxford theologians (Vignaux 1934, ch. 4; Hoenen 1993, 196-214; Schabel 2000, 264-274; Rimini, forthcoming). In order to preserve the contingency of events stemming from human free will, Auriol claimed that propositions about future contingents are neither true nor false, but rather neutral, and so God does not know that the Antichrist will exist, since "the Antichrist will exist" is neither true nor false. Although like Ockham and Rimini later, Auriol maintained that exactly how God knows the future is incomprehensible to us, he did give a sophisticated explanation and defense of God's knowledge of our future. Gregory, however, chose to focus on the above-mentioned elements in Auriol's position. Gregory recognized that Auriol's theory of future-contingent propositions relies on Aristotle's stance in chapter 9 of On Interpretation. Interestingly, although Gregory denied the truth of the position itself, he nevertheless held that it was in fact Aristotle's. Indeed he rejected any attempt to interpret Aristotle differently, in the way that many medieval and modern philosophers have tried to do:
[This] is apparently a friendly excuse, but in truth it is more of an accusation, because the fact that absurdities ensue [from this position] does not convince us that [Aristotle] did not think that, but convinces us that he ought not to have thought that... Moreover, some modern theologians [i.e. Auriol], great teachers, said that the conclusion [denying determinate truth to future-contingent propositions] not only was the Philosopher's intention, but also that it is very true and even demonstrated... (Rimini 1979, 243).
So for Gregory, Auriol was correct that Aristotle denied the Principle of Bivalence when applied to propositions about future contingents.
Auriol set up two basic rules for such propositions: (1) if a proposition about the future, say, "Socrates will run," is true, it is true immutably and inevitably, since no instant can be found when it would be false. (2) The significate of such a proposition will inevitably and necessarily be put into being. The foundation for Auriol's claim is his modal theory: immutability and necessity are the same thing. If something is immutable, it cannot be different from what it is, and so it necessarily is the way it is.
Gregory answered with a rigorous and lengthy defense of Bivalence and an alternative modal theory. His defense of Bivalence includes a detailed set of rules for propositions. It is significant that this section of Gregory's text, some seven pages, stems from Francis of Marchia's refutation of Auriol's position, a refutation adopted and extended by Gregory's own Augustinian predecessor at Paris, Michael of Massa. In short, Gregory argued that the Principle of Bivalence applies universally, and Aristotle was wrong to make an exception in the case of future-contingent propositions. Although this was his basic disagreement with Auriol, Gregory was so careful a philosopher that before he refuted Auriol on this point he corrected his Franciscan predecessor on details and in so doing made Auriol's own theory more precise.
Auriol placed greater emphasis on divine simplicity and necessity than on divine freedom and contingency when he was wrestling with one of the fundamental problems of Christian philosophical theology: given an absolutely simple and necessary God, what is the source of contingency? Auriol's own explanation lies in God's relationship with events in time, but this explanation was not of interest to Rimini, who was convinced by Scriptural prophecy that God does in fact know the future, and convinced by logic that the Principle of Bivalence holds universally. So the problem becomes, if God knows that Socrates will run, and the proposition "Socrates will run" is true, will not Socrates run necessarily?
Rimini's answer is a version of the opinio communis, a position with roots in Scotus and the Parisian tradition but which Ockham and later Oxford scholars refined with their focus on propositions. (It is possible that Ockham was influenced by Auriol in his concentration on future-contingent propositions, as some have held, but there is nothing specific to indicate that Ockham knew Auriol's treatment, and after Scotus it was natural for theologians to focus their attention on the truth of future-contingent propositions anyway.) The opinio communis relies on God's freedom to save contingency in the world: everything other than God is ultimately contingent, because God wills and acts freely and contingently in creating, and so it is logically possible for the things in the world not to have been or to have been otherwise. At the same time, the common position affirms God's immutability and determinate knowledge of such things. The upshot is that true propositions about future contingents have always been true and are immutably true, even determinately true, but that they are only contingently true and not necessarily so. So Gregory denies Auriol's equation of necessity and immutability.
Gregory's position relies on interesting uses of common logical devices and distinctions developed at Paris and Oxford over the preceding century, such as the distinction between the composite and divided senses of propositions, and that between conditional and absolute necessity. The purpose of these distinctions was to offer a way of explaining the contingency of events, but in doing so they assumed the ultimate contingency of everything except God. However, far from being an affirmation of the "radical contingency" of the world, as some historians have claimed, it was in fact the only way for most theologians to save at least some contingency from the threat of absolute logical and divine determinism. In fact, Gregory and others admitted that, assuming God's knowledge of the future, the future was necessary ex suppositione, although not absolutely, because it is logically possible for immutable God to know otherwise. Peter Auriol, and later Peter de Rivo, Pietro Pomponazzi, and Martin Luther, would consider these efforts feeble and deluded. The three Peters resorted to alternative theories that others considered equally feeble and deluded, whereas Luther simply accepted the conclusion that all attempts to save meaningful contingency governed by human free will were doomed to failure.
What is interesting about Gregory's treatment, again, is not his originality, but the clarity and precision with which he presented the common position. He even pointed out problems in the discussions of those with whom he broadly agreed, such as Ockham. True, almost all of what Rimini said could be found in Marchia, Massa, Ockham, Landulph Caracciolo, Adam Wodeham, and others, but not in such an organized fashion.
One final element of Gregory's stance on modal matters that deserves our attention is the contingency or necessity of the past. The opinio communis maintained that the past is somehow necessary in a strong sense, even though it is not absolutely necessary. It seems that Gregory did not go so far as to say that the past is necessary (beyond the normal necessity ex suppositione), but he does make some sort of modal distinction between the past and the future. Thus we can say that Gregory did not think God can change the past, although there has been some disagreement on this issue (Courtenay 1972-73; Schabel 2000, 271-2). Suffice it to say that the time has come for a long and careful treatment of the modal status of the past in medieval thought, to determine whether any thinker ever really thought the past could be changed. The probable answer is negative.
Predestination was the traditional subject of distinctions 40-41 of commentaries on book I of the Sentences. This was a more purely "theological" subset of the more "philosophical" topic of foreknowledge and future contingents treated in dd. 38-39. As in the case of foreknowledge, Gregory proceeded slowly and carefully, defining his terms and outlining the possible positions. Gregory's Augustinian bent shows through more clearly in predestination than in foreknowledge. Gregory quoted Augustine's words no less than 43 times, and cited him still more often. Frequent scriptural quotations, carefully chosen, provide the ultimate basis for his theory. From Romans 9.13, where Paul comments on Malachi 1.2, "Jacob I have loved, but Esau I have hated," Gregory took his position that from eternity, God actively elects to damn some and to save others, a theory called Double Predestination or Double Particular Election (Vignaux 1934, ch. 4; Schüler 1934; Halverson 1998, 143-157; Schabel 2001; Rimini, forthcoming).
The main issue is what the causal connection is between humans' willing and acting and their salvation or damnation, and predestination or reprobation: do humans participate in or contribute to their own salvation and damnation, or is God's will the sole cause? Traditionally the answer had been that humans are the cause of their deserved damnation, but that salvation depended solely on God's will. Although there were various interpretations of this traditional stance, Peter Auriol seems to have been the first important university scholar to provide a real alternative. Auriol had already sought to distance God from the everyday details of the world's existence, in order to preserve divine necessity and the contingency of things. Auriol now applied his general theory to the specific issue of soteriology, and claimed that God sets up general rules by which certain sets of people will be damned and other sets saved, without actively choosing to save or damn specific individuals. This maintained divine immutability but had the added bonus of providing symmetry for reprobation and predestination: the determining factor is the presence or absence of an obstacle to grace (obex gratiae). For Auriol, while someone's obstacle to grace is indeed a positive cause of reprobation, the absence of such an obstacle, however, is merely a negative or privative cause of predestination. Thus Auriol thought he could avoid charges of Pelagianism by simply denying a positive cause of predestination in the elect. Ockham appears to have adopted the main elements of Auriol's stance, while Walter Chatton at Oxford and Gerard Odonis and Thomas of Strasbourg at Paris went further and posited a positive cause of predestination in the elect, which would appear to approach the condemned Pelagian doctrine.
Gregory reacted by charging that both the theory of the privative cause and the notion of the positive cause of predestination in those who are predestined are Pelagian. Instead Gregory returned to the traditional view as it concerned predestination: it stems only from God's merciful will. However, Auriol's criticism of the asymmetry of the traditional position led Gregory to claim that not only do the predestined play no causal role in their salvation, but neither do the reprobate contribute to their damnation. In short, there is no reason either for one person's salvation or for another person's damnation except the inscrutable will of God: we do not know why some are saved and others damned. This, after all, Gregory believed, was the theory of Paul and of Augustine.
One has to admire Gregory's consistency here, mirroring that of his opponent, Peter Auriol. In the case of divine foreknowledge, Auriol provided an alternative to the traditional position because he claimed that the common defense of contingency failed. Auriol's theory allowed him to preserve the causal role of humans in reprobation, at the expense perhaps of involving humans in predestination and therefore coming close to Pelagianism. There were problems with Auriol's stance, but it was consistent. Gregory, on the other hand, agreed with the common position on divine foreknowledge, but when it really counted, in soteriology, Gregory took this common position to what he (and Auriol) thought was its logical conclusion. Since God's free creation and action is really the only source of contingency in the world, then God's free will is the only real cause of salvation and damnation. Salvation and damnation are contingent like anything else, but not contingent upon human free will, but merely on God's will. No doubt for Gregory, everyone else who held the opinio communis should also have held to Double Predestination or Double Particular Election. Luther and Calvin agreed with Gregory, but they saw no reason for the logical devices of the opinio communis, which for them as for Auriol could not save the contingency of human willing.
Epistemology is another subject in which Gregory's thought has received much attention (e.g. Elie 1937; Dal Pra 1956; Gál 1977; Eckermann 1978; V. Wendland's chapter in Oberman 1981, 242-300; Tachau 1988, 358-71). As in natural philosophy, Gregory maintains a non-realist position that universals are formed by the soul and only after the mind has previous apprehensions of singular things. Thus sensory experience plays a major role in intellectual cognition. For simple cognition Gregory adopts the common terminology of the dichotomy between intuitive and abstractive cognition, although the difference between the two is based on the objects rather than the modes of cognition. For Gregory, intuitive cognition terminates immediately at the extramental object, but abstractive terminates at the object's species in the soul. Inspired by some of Ockham's successors, Gregory argues against the Venerable Inceptor's claim that via intuitive cognition one could determine whether a thing does not exist.
In agreement with Auriol against most contemporaries, however, Gregory also holds that one can have an intuitive cognition of an object that does not exist, as for example when we see a "broken" pencil in a glass of water, when there is only an unbroken pencil in reality. But Auriol is wrong in claiming that this is an instance of an intuitive cognition of something absent, because for Gregory the cognition is really caused by the species of some present object, although perhaps not the object that the mind thinks it is. Therefore Gregory does not adopt Auriol's definition of intuitive cognition as the cognition when the soul merely thinks that the object is present. In any case the dichotomy is different for Gregory because he maintains that abstractive cognition is also somewhat intuitive, since the species of the object is known immediately and therefore intuitively.
In the course of Gregory's long discussion of the problem of foreknowledge and future contingents, he makes frequent reference to the notion of the complexe significabile. When it comes to complex cognition, or scientific knowledge, Gregory's inspiration was Adam Wodeham, who built on some of Walter Chatton's ideas in developing the complexe significabile. Ockham held that the object of scientific knowledge is the conclusion of a syllogism, and Gregory rejects this. Chatton's alternative was that scientific knowledge has as its object things outside the mind. Gregory also denies this, because
if this were the case, many sciences would be about contingent things that could be different than they are, whereas for strict science the object must be eternal and necessary. Every being, however, besides God is contingent and not necessary. If things outside the mind were the objects of the sciences, then many sciences, physical and geometrical, and many others, would be about things other than God, and therefore about contingent things (Rimini 1979, 6; Brown 1998a, 171).
One can see here how Gregory's stress on the overarching contingency of creation connects with his epistemology.
Gregory chooses as the object of scientific knowledge the alternative offered by Adam Wodeham. Chatton's notion of "thing" in scientific knowledge was the state of affairs signified by both the negative and the affirmative proposition. For example, "Socrates is sitting" and "Socrates is not sitting" signify for Chatton the same thing, not Socrates, not sitting, and not the propositions, but somehow the whole Socrates's-being-seated. Although Chatton had his reasons for his theory, Wodeham modified it in a useful way, differentiating between positive and negative states of affairs. Thus for Wodeham, each proposition has its own total significate that is only complexly signifiable (complexe significabile), so that Socrates's-being-seated and Socrates's-not-being-seated are two different things, the objects of scientific knowledge.
Gregory adopted Wodeham's theory and tailored it where necessary to his own thought. The complexe significabile, once thought to be Gregory's invention, is neither the proposition itself (although it determines the truth or falsity of the proposition) nor individual things in the world, but rather the arrangement of things in the world. He differed from Wodeham, for example, in the way he thought about "assenting to" and "dissenting from" such complexe significabilia, an issue which had occupied Chatton at length. Gregory then applied the notion to a host of other philosophical problems, such as future contingents, and through him the complexe significabile became the common intellectual property of continental thinkers, and parallel notions are found in many important later intellectuals.
Now that Gregory's works are available in a reliable modern edition, it is to be hoped that further studies of his Parisian and Oxford predecessors on various single issues will enable us to see his innovations more clearly. Recent studies have shown that he was not always as original as was once thought, but that does not diminish in any way his important position in the history of philosophy. Moreover, Gregory sometimes did come up with new solutions to problems, and even where he did not, his treatments, because of their clarity and comprehensiveness, often became the primary source for later thinkers of the ideas he adopted from his predecessors and developed.
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First published: September 24, 2001
Content last modified: September 24, 2001