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Francis of Marchia

Francis of Marchia was perhaps the most exciting theologian active at the University of Paris in the quarter century between the Franciscan Peter Auriol (fl. 1318) and the Augustinian Hermit Gregory of Rimini (fl. 1343). Although he had innovative and even influential ideas in philosophical theology, natural philosophy, and political philosophy, until recently he has been little studied.

Life and Work

Francis of Marchia (a.k.a. de Appignano, de Pignano, de Esculo, de Ascoli, Franciscus Rubeus, and the Doctor Succinctus) was born ca. 1290 in the village of Appignano del Tronto in the province of Ascoli Piceno, east of Rome and near the Adriatic. He became a Franciscan and rose in the order’s educational hierarchy until he lectured on the Sentences at the Franciscans’ Paris studium in 1319–20. From his Paris years (1319–23 or 24) we have a popular commentary on the four books of the Sentences, extant in at least ten manuscripts for each book, and in at least two distinct redactions for the first two books. From the same period stems Marchia’s short commentary on the first two books of the Metaphysics. By 1324, when he was lector at the Franciscans’ studium in Avignon, Marchia had become Master of Theology. Perhaps his Quodlibet derives from theological debates held in Avignon. Marchia’s literal commentary on the Physics and his more independent long commentary or questions on the first seven books of the Metaphysics probably belong to his Paris or Avignon period. In 1328, Marchia fell out with Pope John XXII for supporting the Franciscan Minister General Michael of Cesena on the issue of apostolic poverty, left Avignon, and eventually took refuge with the Holy Roman Emperor Louis of Bavaria along with William of Ockham, Marsilius of Padua, and others. During this period Marchia wrote his Improbatio against John XXII. Marchia was eventually captured, and he confessed and retracted his errors before the Inquisition in 1341, or perhaps 1336 (a possibility suggested in Wittneben-Lambertini 1999). He was reconciled with the Church, and died some time after 1344.

Until 1991 almost none of Marchia’s writings were published and only Anneliese Maier devoted serious and sustained attention to his thought. Since then, however, Nazareno Mariani has published three volumes of Marchia’s works (Marchia 1993, 1998, and 1997b): the Improbatio, the Physics commentary, and the Quodlibet, the last of which includes roughly a quarter of the main version — the Scriptum — of book I of the Sentences commentary, and two questions from book II, in appendices. In a 1991 monograph on Marchia’s cosmological thought (Schneider 1991, 29), Notker Schneider announced the edition of the Metaphysics commentary, building on the work of Albert Zimmermann (Marchia 1965, Zimmermann 1966). Schneider, Russell Friedman, and Christopher Schabel have added to Mariani’s efforts in editing sections of the Sentences commentary (Marchia 1991b, 1997a, 1999a, 1999b, 2000, 2001). Currently, Mariani is editing the Reportatio for book I, while Friedman and Schabel are occupied with the Scriptum on the same book. The Centro Studi Francesco d’Appignano was established in Marchia’s hometown in May of 2001 during the First International Conference on Francis of Marchia. The second such conference is planned for 2003. Finally, the journal Picenum Seraphicum, edited by Roberto Lambertini, promises to be a forum for Marchia studies.

Philosophical Theology

Marchia’s main and most popular writing, larger than all his other works combined, is the Sentences commentary. Although this genre of scholastic writing contains much material that we would call pure science, especially in Marchia’s case (see Natural Philosophy below), it is primarily a vehicle for philosophical theology. Here it must be stressed at the outset that Francis of Marchia was not a faithful Scotist, contrary to a common opinion based on misconceptions from early in the twentieth century. Most recent research has proven that Marchia generally rejected or severely modified John Duns Scotus’s doctrines, rather than followed them, even in the specific contexts like Trinitarian theology where he was claimed to have been a loyal Scotist (Marchia 1999a). For example, Marchia was uncomfortable with Scotus’s stress on and use of a strong distinction between the divine intellect and will, and this led Marchia to oppose Scotus on issues such as the procession of the Holy Spirit and the mechanism of divine foreknowledge. Indeed, it seems that Marchia was perhaps less of a Scotist than any of the other continental Franciscans active between Peter Auriol and the Black Death. Nevertheless, Scotus forms much of the backdrop for Marchia’s theology. The other thinker against whose theories Marchia often developed his own doctrine was Auriol, whose Sentences commentary Marchia appears to have known in a Reportatio version.

A critical edition of one redaction of Marchia’s Sentences commentary would probably take up about five large volumes. It is roughly equal in size to that of his contemporary and confrère Landulph Caracciolo. Whereas Caracciolo’s commentary is frequently a disjointed, point-by-point refutation of Peter Auriol and defense of Scotus on many issues, however, Marchia was more selective in choosing his topics, more independent in giving his determination, and generally more eloquent. For example, Marchia asks only one brief question on the Immaculate Conception, a favorite Franciscan topic (book III, q. 8, and because of a missing quire this question is not present in the most studied manuscript, Vat. Chigi. lat. B VII 113), showing himself to support the immaculatist position, but he asks a great number of questions in books I, II, and IV on the relationship between the will and intellect.

Thus, although Auriol’s controversial opinions on epistemology and divine foreknowledge drew fire from Caracciolo and most other Paris theologians up to Gregory of Rimini’s day, even from Oxford Franciscans, Marchia devoted much energy to foreknowledge but almost ignored the great debate over intuitive and abstractive cognition. Aside from an isolated mention of "intuitive cognition" in Scriptum I, d. 3, q. 4, and of "intuitive vision" in the very last question in book IV, Marchia merely discusses the problem in passing on two brief occasions: first, in book II, q. 25 (Marchia 1997b, p. 322), while treating angelic knowledge, and second, in book III, q. 13, in the context of the beatific vision of the Word (not yet edited). In the latter case, the more substantial passage, he gives a somewhat Scotistic definition: "Intuitive and abstractive cognition are not distinguished according to having a species or not, but only according to the disposition of the object, because if the object is present, the species represents it intuitively; if absent, it represents it abstractively." Therefore, "the same species that is intuitive in the presence of the object is abstractive in the absence of the object." Marchia adds in agreement with Auriol that God "can cause the act of seeing without the object," and that a species of a created object "indifferently represents" a present or absent object. Although this might provoke some epistemological questions, Marchia turns to the vision of the Essence and leaves human cognition in via aside.

In contrast, Marchia singled out divine foreknowledge for special treatment, devoting three entire distinctions (Scriptum I, dd. 35, 36, and 38) to the issue and concentrating most of his discussion on the reconcilation of foreknowledge with human free will (Marchia 1999b, 2000; Schabel 2000). Here Marchia was opposed in some way to just about everyone else who had written on the issue, but mainly Auriol, who had claimed that any determination prior to the coming about of a contingent event destroyed contingency, including the truth or falsity of future-contingent propositions. Marchia’s defense of the application of the Principle of Bivalence to propositions about the contingent future was the model for Gregory of Rimini. But having shown that such propositions are either determinately true or false, Marchia went on to articulate a type of prior determination that saved foreknowledge while preserving contingency. In fact, according to Marchia, there must be some determination in the causes of future contingent events prior to their actual occurrence, otherwise nothing would occur:

And I ask about that determination in the cause, was it in the cause before the placing of the effect [into reality] or not? If it was, then I have my point. If not, I ask, how is the effect determined in its cause before it is put into being, necessarily or contingently? If necessarily, then it comes about necessarily, according to this opinion. If contingently and a contingent is not determined to one side in its cause, then that determination is not determined except through some prior contingent determination. And I would ask of this just as before, will it go on infinitely, or is it necessary to stop at some contingent determination in the cause before the effect? (d. 35: Marchia 1999, p. 75)
Marchia, however, was aware that Auriol had claimed that any such prior determination was fatal for contingency, so Marchia draws a distinction between different indeterminations and determinations, perhaps expanding on isolated remarks made by Scotus. There is (1) an indetermination ‘about the possible’ (de possibili), with respect to being able to act and being able not to act. With this indetermination, we are not determined de possibili before an event, so we are free and act contingently and not necessarily. There is also (2) a posterior indetermination ‘about inhering’ (de inesse), with respect to what will be the case in reality. This indetermination toward what will inhere in reality, however, would be an obstacle to foreknowledge and, for us, to acting. Thus it must be replaced by (3) a determination in the contingent cause toward acting, both for the future to be known and for us to act. The (4) determination de possibili, toward being able to act or being able not to act, is absent from free causes until the event occurs, at which time our freedom and power with respect to that event are removed.

An obvious objection is that, for Marchia, the effect is determinate in the cause before the action of the cause, and thus that determination is ‘presupposed’ in the subsequent action of the cause. Since it is ‘presupposed’, that determination is not in the cause’s power, and thus is not contingent. Marchia replies with another distinction:

‘Action’ can be taken in three ways: either it can be taken actually, namely when an agent is actually acting; or it can be taken virtually, when an agent can act although he is not acting; or it can be taken in a middle way, not purely actually nor purely virtually, but in a middle way as ‘dispositionally’ or ‘aptitudinally’, namely when an agent is not acting but is determined toward acting, although in actuality he is not acting — and he not only can act, but is determined to be acting later. Similarly there is a threefold ‘determination’ of the agent: one actual, by which an agent actually determinately puts one part of a contradiction into effect; a second is a potential determination by which an agent posits or can determine any part of a contradiction dividedly; the other is, as it were, a ‘dispositional’ or ‘aptitudinal’ determination, by which an agent is determined with respect to the future to putting one part of a contradiction [into effect]. Each determination presupposes the action corresponding to it, because an actual determination follows the action in actuality; the dispositional determination follows the action dispositionally, although it precedes the actual action; the potential determination follows the potential action, although it precedes that actual and dispositional action. (d. 35: Marchia 1999, pp. 89–90)
Thus when an agent is determined de inesse to doing something in the future, that determination is like a disposition, and neither actual, because the event has not yet occurred, nor potential, because the possibility to do otherwise is not removed. Such a determination is not ‘actually’ in the agent’s power, Marchia grants, but it is in his power ‘dispositionally’, for although the agent cannot act before he acts, he can be disposed to act so that he will in fact act.

The foregoing example is representative of Marchia’s thought in many ways. He frequently draws clever and original distinctions, and the de possibili/ de inesse division is employed in other contexts such as predestination (book I, d. 40: Marchia 2001). He makes similar innovative distinctions when discussing the different types of human and divine willing (Reportatio I, dd. 45-48: see attached edition). Although one could argue about the cogency of Marchia’s arguments, in the case of the de possibili/ de inesse distinction Marchia found a favorable response among the following, who adopted the device: his Franciscan successors at Paris in the next decade Aufredo Gonteri Brito, William Rubio, and William of Brienne; the Augustinian Hermits Michael of Massa and Gregory of Rimini; and, in the later fifteenth century, Fernando of Cordoba and Francesco della Rovere, who was to become Pope Sixtus IV. Thus in philosophical theology one could and often did look to Marchia for an alternative to Scotus and an innovative response to Auriol.

Natural Philosophy

Since the time of Pierre Duhem in the early twentieth century, Francis of Marchia has been known as a scientist, and looking through the titles of his questions, one finds an abundance of scientific topics related to such things as the infinite and the psychology of willing (Friedman-Schabel, 2001). In general, Marchia displays a great interest in the causal process. One thing that helps explain his popularity among historians of medieval science, and perhaps his own interest in scientific matters, is his clear and sharp distinction between natural causation that works necessarily and the contingent causation of human, angelic, and divine free will. In an influential passage containing echoes of Siger of Brabant, a passage to which Anneliese Maier first drew attention (Scriptum I, d. 36: Maier 1949; Marchia 2000), Marchia explains that there are two types of contingency in the world: first, there is contingency per se, simpliciter, positiva, and intrinseca. This is the contingency by which something is still able to occur or not occur even when all the required accidental, natural causes have been posited. There is only one source of such contingency: free will. Second, there is contingency per accidens, secundum quid, privativa, and extrinseca. This is the contingency of natural causation. A natural effect takes place as the result of many accidental causes. Some of these causes may be impeded by other natural, accidental causes, and so with respect to a small, limited number of causes a natural effect may be considered ‘contingent’. This does not mean that the natural effect is really and truly contingent without qualification in the first way, however, because if we take all of the natural effect’s causes into account, the effect will necessarily follow, or not follow, as the case may be. That is, assuming God’s contingent creation in the first place, and His ‘general influence’ that keeps the chain of causation in existence, natural causation works necessarily, and so with all of an effect’s causes taken together, what happens in nature is necessary. Of crucial important for science is Marchia’s further assertion that these ‘contingent’ effects can even be known by a created intellect. This is because the number of natural causes is not infinite. Thus a finite, created intellect can know the natural future with certainty. The only problem, says Marchia, is that we humans have a short life and an intellect that is bound with the body.

One of the most important innovations of the mature Galileo was the assertion that the celestial and terrestial realms are made of the same fundamental matter and therefore follow the same basic natural laws. Francis of Marchia put forth a similar hypothesis in his commentary on book II, qq. 29-32 (Marchia 1991b). Contrary to contemporary Aristotelian theory, Marchia argues that the heavens are not made up of a fifth, incorruptible, nobler element, which radically differentiates the supralunar realm from the sublunar one. On the contrary, the basic matter is the same everywhere, and just as Marchia considers the natural world to follow predictable patterns, he also thinks that those patterns are universally applicable. These two tenets have important implications for the practice of natural philosophy (Schneider 1991).

With this attitude it is no wonder Marchia’s physical theories drew the attention of medieval and modern scholars alike. The first important study on Marchia’s thought was Anneliese Maier’s partial edition and analysis of book IV, q. 1, of Marchia’s Sentences commentary (Marchia 1940). There Marchia puts forth his famous forerunner to John Buridan’s impetus theory of projectile motion. Aristotle had not provided a satisfactory explanation for why, when we throw a ball, for example, the ball keeps going even after we have released it. Marchia’s explanation, which had its own partial predecessors, was that we leave behind a force in the ball — a virtus derelicta — that keeps the ball in motion. The fact that this force was temporary rather than permanent meant that it was not akin to the inertia theory of classical mechanics, but, as Marchia stated explicitly, it was a simple theory and did explain the phenomena in temporary projectile motion. Marchia also applied the theory to celestial motion, but he does not appear to have reconciled the semi-permanent nature of the motion of the heavens with the more ephemeral virtus derelicta. Maier saw reactions to Marchia’s treatment in the works of Francis of Meyronnes, his follower Himbert of Garda, Nicholas Bonet, John Canonicus, William of Ockham, and Buridan, although it is hard to say whether he had much positive influence in this context.

Perhaps medieval scholars did not arrive at inertia because of their reluctance to consider motion in a vacuum. In observable projectile motion, at least in the fourteenth century, the projectile always ended up back on the ground. One of Aristotle’s arguments for the impossibility of a vacuum was the lack of resistance of the medium. If velocity was a function of the proportion of force to the resistance of the medium, then with no resistance there would be motion in an instant, something usually considered an impossibility. In book II, q. 16, a. 5 of his Sentences commentary, however, Marchia has to wonder why an angel, which is not a "corpus quantum," or bodily mass, cannot move instantaneously, i.e. from one place to another without any temporal duration. Part of the answer is simply that it is a contradiction to be two places at once, but Marchia adds that there must be some sort of internal resistance in angels that makes instantaneous motion impossible. The notion of internal resistance unrelated to natural place (even though no corpus quantum is involved) and the concept of impetus (Buridan’s making the virtus derelicta permanent) appear to be primitive versions of the ingredients of a theory of inertial mass. Since Marchia’s writings predate those of his more famous successors, the Oxford Calculators and Buridan and Nicole Oresme at Paris, and some of his ideas at least resemble Galileo’s in some way, Marchia’s possible impact on later scientists is a good topic for future research.

Political and Social Thought

We are only just beginning to appreciate Marchia’s thought in philosophical theology and natural philosophy. A fuller understanding requires, first of all, the critical edition of the Sentences commentary. We are in a better position to investigate where Marchia stands in political theory because of Mariani’s publication of the Improbatio (Marchia 1993), probably written in the beginning of 1330. As in the case of Ockham, circumstances drove Marchia into opposition to Pope John XXII, and as a result Marchia’s later writings focus on more worldly affairs. The group of scholars supporting the ex-minister general of the Franciscans Michael of Cesena gathered at Louis of Bavaria’s court in Munich and collaborated on their anti-John XXII tracts. It has been shown that Marchia’s Improbatio influenced Ockham’s Opus nonaginta dierum (Miethke 1969; Lambertini 2000) and most probably the Cesena group’s Appellatio magna monacensis (Lambertini, forthcoming). Thus, as in philosophical theology and natural philosophy, Marchia had an historical impact.

The Franciscans maintained that they lived the most perfect life that was humanly possible, following the model of Christ and the apostles who, they claimed, possessed nothing either as individuals or in common. John XXII not only denied that Christ and the apostles had no possessions, but he also declared the Franciscan position to be heretical. The resulting quarrel came to touch on such issues as usury, ownership of property, disposal of property, natural and divine law and rights, papal infallibility, and ultimately the basis of sovereignty.

On the question on dominion, or possession, of property, Marchia accepted the pope’s assertion that, even in the state of nature before the fall, Adam had dominion over the things he used, but Marchia denied that this type of dominion had much at all in common with post-lapsarian dominion: they are alterius generis, differing like violent and natural, like corruptible and incorruptible (Lambertini 2000, VII). Before the fall, Adam had "dominion of natural liberty and perfection," according to the "primaeval natural law"; afterwards, although Marchia admitted that there was a "remnant of natural law," basically it had to be replaced by positive law and the dominion of "servile necessity" and the "power of compulsion." This is because, if left to his own devices, post-lapsarian man would grab all he could get.

Marchia describes the situation in the state of nature thus:

In the state of nature all things had been common to all people, not only with respect to the dominion of things but also with respect to use, whether de iure or de facto — with respect to use de iure because the right of using whatever was suitable to them had been common to all and proper to none. (Marchia 1993, pp. 154-5)
Moreover, even before the creation of Eve, Adam had no dominion over things that was "proper" to him. Therefore Pope John erred in claiming that the eventual "division of things" into private possessions stemmed from divine law, since it came from human or positive law, necessitated by human iniquity. The first division, by human law, occurred already with Cain and Abel before the Flood. Of course God restored common dominion to Noah and his sons with the Deluge, but humans and human law soon reinstated the division of goods. This was not by divine will, for "when they began to build the tower [of Babel] it was by human counsel, not by divine — indeed God was not pleased." By extension, the laws of emperors and princes derive from human law, not divine, with the exception of Hebrew law in the time before Christ, a special status lost at the crucifixion.

The upshot is that private property is not divinely instituted, for Marchia: it is a human introduction. In the state of nature, by divine law, humans had a common "dominion" over goods, but this dominion is not at all the dominion of human law, of private property. Moreover, it is this common dominion that Christ and the apostles followed. It is therefore humanly possible to do so, indeed the best possible way to live, and the Franciscans approached it more closely than anyone else.

On the question of ecclesiastical power, of course, Marchia was also in disagreement with Pope John XXII (Lambertini 2000, IX). In order to defend Christ’s poverty and that of the Franciscans by extension, Marchia interpreted Christ’s remark to Pilate that "my kingdom is not of this world" as meaning not only that the origins of his kingdom and the source of his power are not of this world, but also that his kingdom and his power are not with respect to the things of this world. Indeed, for Marchia, Caesar had legitimate sovereignty over this world. Marchia thus denied that Christ, as a man, possessed any temporal power, and hence he rejected John XXII’s claim that Christ was rex and dominus in a temporal sense. The implication is that the pope could not inherit temporal power over the entire earth, although Marchia admitted that the temporal sword could pertain to the pope indirectly and mediately.

Given that the few studies that have been done demonstrate that Marchia had an impact on his successors in many areas of philosophical thought, and given that it is only in the past decade that any substantial part of his works has been available in print, we can in the near future expect a flood of investigations of the ideas of this interesting and important scholastic thinker.

Critical Editions of Texts

The following texts are critical editions, using all known manuscript witnesses, which will be published in the future with apparatus criticus and fontium. Distinctions 35-48 of book I of the Sentences concern the unified themes of divine knowledge, power, and will. Marchia’s Scriptum for book I ends prematurely at distinction 40, and distinction 39 on divine ideas is much trunctated. Since distinctions 35-40 of the Scriptum have been or are being published (Marchia 1999b, 2000, 2001), the following texts from the Reportatio for book I, distinctions 39, 42-44, and 45-48, will complement the Scriptum material on these subjects.



Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

Auriol [Aureol, Aureoli], Peter | Buridan, John [Jean] | Duns Scotus, John | Gregory of Rimini

Copyright © 2001 by
Christopher Schabel
University of Cyprus

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First published: March 23, 2001
Content last modified: March 23, 2001