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This article is concerned with social and political equality. In its prescriptive usage, ‘equality’ is a loaded and ‘highly contested’ concept. On account of its normally positive connotation, it has a rhetorical power rendering it suitable as a political slogan (Westen 1990). At least since the French Revolution, equality has served as one of the leading ideals of the body politic; in this respect, it is at present probably the most controversial of the great social ideals. There is controversy concerning the precise notion of equality, the relation of justice and equality (the principles of equality), the material requirements and measure of the ideal of equality (equality of what?), the extension of equality (equality among whom?), and its status within a comprehensive (liberal) theory of justice (the value of equality). Each of these five issues will be discussed by turn in the present article.

1. Defining the Concept

‘Equality’ is a contested concept: "People who praise it or disparage it disagree about what they are praising or disparaging" (Dworkin 2000, p. 2). Our first task is therefore to provide a clear definition of equality in the face of widespread misconceptions about its meaning as a political idea.

The terms "equality" (Gr. isotes, Lat. aequitas, aequalitas, Fr. égalité, Ger. Gleichheit), "equal," and "equally" signify a qualitative relationship. ‘Equality’ (or ‘equal’) signifies correspondence between a group of different objects, persons, processes or circumstances that have the same qualities in at least one respect, but not all respects, i.e., regarding one specific feature, with differences in other features. ‘Equality’ needs to thus be distinguished from ‘identity’ -- this concept signifying that one and the same object corresponds to itself in all its features: an object that can be referred to through various individual terms, proper names, or descriptions. For the same reason, it needs to be distinguished from ‘similarity’ -- the concept of merely approximate correspondence (Dann 1975, p. 997; Menne 1962, p. 44 ff.; Westen 1990, pp. 39, 120). Thus, to say e.g. that men are equal is not to say that they are identical. Equality rather implies similarity but not ‘sameness.’

In distinction to numerical identity, a judgment of equality presumes a difference between the things being compared. According to this definition, the notion of ‘complete’ or ‘absolute’ equality is self-contradictory. Two non-identical objects are never completely equal; they are different at least in their spatiotemporal location. If things do not differ they should not be called ‘equal,’ but rather, more precisely, ‘identical,’ as e.g., the morning and evening star. Here usage might vary. Some authors do consider absolute qualitative equality admissible as a borderline concept (Tugendhat & Wolf 1983, p. 170).

‘Equality’ can be used in the very same sense both to describe and prescribe, as with "thin": "you are thin" and "you are too thin." The approach taken to defining the standard of comparison for both descriptive and prescriptive assertions of the concept of equality is very important (Oppenheim 1970). In the case of descriptive use of equality, the common standard is itself descriptive, e.g. two people weigh the same. A prescriptive use of equality is present when a prescriptive standard is applied, i.e., a norm or rule, e.g. people ought to be equal before the law. The standards grounding prescriptive assertions of equality contain at least two components. On the one hand, there is a descriptive component, since the assertions need to contain descriptive criteria, in order to identify those people to which the rule or norm applies. The question of this identification -- who belongs to which category? -- may itself be normative, e.g. to whom do the U.S. laws apply? On the other hand, the comparative standards contain something normative -- a moral or legal rule, in the example, the U.S. laws -- specifying how those falling under the norm are to be treated. Such a rule constitutes the prescriptive component (Westen 1990, chap. 3). Sociological and economic analyses of (in-)equality mainly pose the questions of how inequalities can be determined and measured and what their causes and effects are. In contrast, social and political philosophy is in general concerned mainly with the following questions: what kind of equality, if any, should be offered, and to whom and when? Such is the case in this article as well.

‘Equality’ and ‘equal’ are incomplete predicates that necessarily generate one question: equal in what respect? (Rae 1980, p. 132 f.) Equality essentially consists of a tripartite relation between two (or several) objects or persons and one (or several) qualities. Two objects a and b are equal in a certain respect if, in that respect, they fall under the same general terminus. ‘Equality’ denotes the relation between the objects that are compared. Every comparison presumes a tertium comparationis, a concrete attribute defining the respect in which the equality applies -- equality thus referring to a common sharing of this comparison-determining attribute. This relevant comparative standard represents a ‘variable’ (or ‘index’) of the concept of equality that needs to be specified in each particular case (Westen 1990, p. 10); differing conceptions of equality here emerge from one or another descriptive or normative moral standard. There is another source of diversity as well: As Temkin (1986, 1993) argues, various different standards might be used to measure inequality, with the respect in which people are compared remaining constant. The difference between a general concept and different specific conceptions (Rawls 1971, p. 21 f.) of equality may explain why according to various authors producing ‘equality’ has no unified meaning -- or even is devoid of meaning. (Rae 1981, p. 127 f., 132 f.)

For this reason, it helps to think of the idea of equality or for that matter inequality, understood as an issue of social justice, not as a single principle, but as a complex group of principles forming the basic core of today’s egalitarianism. Depending on which procedural principle one adopts, contrary answers are forthcoming. Both equality and inequality are complex and multifaceted concepts (Temkin 1993, chap. 2). In any real historical context, it is clear that no single notion of equality can sweep the field. (Rae 1981, p. 132) Many egalitarians concede that much of our discussion of the concept is vague and theoretical. But they believe that there is also a common underlying strain of important moral concerns implicit in it (Williams 1973). Above all it serves to remind us of our common humanity, despite various differences (cf. 2.3. below). In this sense, egalitarians tend to think of egalitarianism as a single coherent normative doctrine -- but one in any case embracing a variety of principles. Following the introduction of different principles and theories of equality, I will return in the last section of this article to the question how best to define egalitarianism and the value of equality.

2. Principles of Equality and Justice

Equality in its prescriptive usage has, of course, a close connection with morality and justice in general and distributive justice in particular. From antiquity onward, equality has been considered a constitutive feature of justice. (On the history of the concept, cf. Albernethy 1959, Benn 1967, Brown 1988, Dann 1975, Thomson 1949.) Throughout history, people and emancipatory movements use the language of justice to pillory certain inequalities. But what exactly is the connection between equality and justice, i.e., what kind of role does equality play in a theory of justice? The role and correct account of equality, understood as an issue of social justice, is itself a difficult philosophical issue. To clarify this, philosophers have defended a variety of principles and conceptions of equality, many of which are mentioned in the following discussion. This section introduces four well known principles of equality, ranging from highly general and uncontroversial to more specific and controversial. The next section reviews various conceptions of the ‘currency’ of equality. Different interpretations of the role of equality in a theory of justice emerge according to which of the four following principles and which measure has been adopted.

Through its connection with justice, equality, like justice itself, has different justitianda, i.e., objects the term ‘just’ or ‘equal’ or their opposites can be applied to. These are mainly actions, persons, social institutions, and circumstances (e.g. distributions). These objects of justice stand in an internal connection and order that can here only be hinted at. The predicates "just" or "unjust" are only applicable when voluntary actions implying responsibility are in question. Justice is hence primarily related to individual actions. Individual persons are the primary bearer of responsibilities (ethical individualism). Persons have to take responsibility for their individual actions and for circumstances they could change through such actions or omissions. Although people have responsibility for both their actions and circumstances, there is a moral difference between the two justitianda, i.e., an injustice due to unjust treatment through an individual or collective action and an injustice due to a failure to correct unjust circumstances (cf. 3.1.v. below). The responsibility people have to treat individuals and groups they affect in a morally appropriate and, in particular, even-handed way has hence a certain priority over their moral duty to turn circumstances into just ones through some kind of equalization. Establishing justice of circumstances (ubiquitously and simultaneously) is beyond any given individual’s capacities. Hence one has to rely on collective actions. In order to meet this moral duty, a basic order guaranteeing just circumstances must be justly created. This is an essential argument of justice in favor of establishing social institutions and fundamental state structures for political communities; with the help of such institutions and structures, individuals can collectively fulfill their responsibility in the best possible manner. If circumstances can be rightly judged to be unjust, all persons have the responsibility and moral duty, both individually and collectively, to change the pertinent circumstances or distributive schemes into just ones. In the following sections, the objects of equality may vary from topic to topic. However, as indicated, there is a close relationship between the objects. The next three principles of equality hold generally and primarily for all actions and treatment of others and for resulting circumstances. From the fourth principle onward, i.e., starting with the presumption of equality, this article is mainly concerned with distributive justice and the evaluation of distribution.

2.1 Formal Equality

When two persons have equal status in at least one normatively relevant respect, they must be treated equally with regard to this respect.This is the generally accepted formal equality principle that Aristotle formulated in reference to Plato: "treat like cases as like" (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, V.3. 1131a10-b15; Politics, III.9.1280 a8-15, III. 12. 1282b18-23). Of course the crucial question is which respects are normatively relevant and which are not. Some authors see this formal principle of equality as a specific application of a rule of rationality: it is irrational, because inconsistent, to treat equal cases unequally without sufficient reasons (Berlin 1955-56). But most authors instead stress that what is here at stake is a moral principle of justice, basically corresponding with acknowledgment of the impartial and universalizable nature of moral judgments. Namely, the postulate of formal equality demands more than consistency with one’s subjective preferences. What is more important is possible justification vis-à-vis others of the equal or unequal treatment in question -- and this on the sole basis of a situation’s objective features.

2.2 Proportional Equality

According to Aristotle, there are two kinds of equality, numerical and proportional (Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, 1130b-1132b; cf. Plato, Laws, VI.757b-c). A form of treatment of others or as a result of it a distribution is equal numerically when it treats all persons as indistinguishable, thus treating them identically or granting them the same quantity of a good per capita. That is not always just. In contrast, a form of treatment of others or distribution is proportional or relatively equal when it treats all relevant persons in relation to their due. Just numerical equality is a special case of proportional equality. Numerical equality is only just under special circumstances, viz. when persons are equal in the relevant respects so that the relevant proportions are equal. Proportional equality further specifies formal equality; it is the more precise and detailed, hence actually the more comprehensive formulation of formal equality. It indicates what produces an adequate equality.

Proportional equality in the treatment and distribution of goods to persons involves at least the following concepts or variables: Two or more persons (P1, P2) and two or more allocations of goods to persons (G) and X and Y as the quantity in which individuals have the relevant normative quality E. This can be represented as an equation with fractions or as a ratio. If P1 has E in the amount of X and if P2 has E in the amount Y, then P1 is due G in the amount of Xprime and P2 is due G in the amount of Yprime, so that the ratio X/Y = Xprime/Yprime is valid. (N.B. For the formula to be usable, the potentially great variety of factors involved have to be both quantifiable in principle and commensurable, i.e., capable of synthesis into an aggregate value.)

When factors speak for unequal treatment or distribution, because the persons are unequal in relevant respects, the treatment or distribution proportional to these factors is just. Unequal claims to treatment or distribution must be considered proportionally: that is the prerequisite for persons being considered equally.

This principle can also be incorporated into hierarchical, inegalitarian theories. It indicates that equal output is demanded with equal input. Aristocrats, perfectionists, and meritocrats all believe that persons should be assessed according to their differing deserts, understood by them in the broad sense of fulfillment of some relevant criterion. And they believe that reward and punishment, benefits and burdens, should be proportional to such deserts. Since this definition leaves open who is due what, there can be great inequality when it comes to presumed fundamental (natural) rights, deserts, and worth -- and such inequality is apparent in both Plato and Aristotle.

Aristotle’s idea of justice as proportional equality contains a fundamental insight. The idea offers a framework for a rational argument between egalitarian and non-egalitarian ideas of justice, its focal point being the question of the basis for an adequate equality (Hinsch, forthcoming 2002). Both sides accept justice as proportional equality. Aristotle’s analysis makes clear that the argument involves the features deciding whether two persons are to be considered equal or unequal in a distributive context.

On the formal level of pure conceptual explication, justice and equality are linked through these principles of formal and proportional justice. Justice cannot be explained without these equality principles; the equality principles only receive their normative significance in their role as principles of justice.

Formal and proportional equality is simply a conceptual schema. It needs to be made precise -- i.e., its open variables need to be filled out. The formal postulate remains quite empty as long as it remains unclear when or through what features two or more persons or cases should be considered equal. All debates over the proper conception of justice, i.e., over who is due what, can be understood as controversies over the question of which cases are equal and which unequal (Aristotle, Politics, 1282b 22). For this reason equality theorists are correct in stressing that the claim that persons are owed equality becomes informative only when one is told -- what kind of equality they are owed (Nagel 1979; Rae 1981; Sen 1992, p. 13). Actually, every normative theory implies a certain notion of equality. In order to outline their position, egalitarians must thus take account of a specific (egalitarian) conception of equality. To do so, they need to identify substantive principles of equality, discussed below.

2.3 Moral Equality

Until the eighteenth century, it was assumed that human beings are unequal by nature -- i.e., that there was a natural human hierarchy. This postulate collapsed with the advent of the idea of natural right and its assumption of an equality of natural order among all human beings. Against Plato and Aristotle, the classical formula for justice according to which an action is just when it offers each individual his or her due took on a substantively egalitarian meaning in the course of time, viz. everyone deserved the same dignity and the same respect. This is now the widely held conception of substantive, universal, moral equality. It developed among the Stoics, who emphasized the natural equality of all rational beings, and in early New Testament Christianity, which elevated the equality of human beings before God to a principle: one to be sure not always adhered to later by the Christian church. This important idea was also taken up both in the Talmud and in Islam, where it was grounded in both Greek and Hebraic elements in both systems. In the modern period, starting in the seventeenth century, the dominant idea was of natural equality in the tradition of natural law and social contract theory. Hobbes (1651) postulated that in their natural condition, individuals possess equal rights, because over time they have the same capacity to do each other harm. Locke (1690) argued that all human beings have the same natural right to both (self-)ownership and freedom. Rousseau (1755) declared social inequality to be a virtually primeval decline of the human race from natural equality in a harmonious state of nature: a decline catalyzed by the human urge for perfection, property and possessions (Dahrendorf 1962). For Rousseau (1755, 1762), the resulting inequality and rule of violence can only be overcome by tying unfettered subjectivity to a common civil existence and popular sovereignty. In Kant’s moral philosophy (1785), the categorical imperative formulates the equality postulate of universal human worth. His transcendental and philosophical reflections on autonomy and self-legislation lead to a recognition of the same freedom for all rational beings as the sole principle of human rights (Kant 1797, p. 230). Such Enlightenment ideas stimulated the great modern social movements and revolutions, and were taken up in modern constitutions and declarations of human rights. During the French Revolution, equality -- along with freedom and fraternity -- became a basis of the Déclaration des droits de l´homme et du citoyen of 1789.

The principle of equal dignity and respect is now accepted as a minimum standard throughout mainstream Western culture. Some misunderstandings regarding moral equality need to be clarified. To say that men are equal is not to say they are identical. The postulate of equality implies that underneath apparent differences, certain recognizable entities or units exist that, by dint of being units, can be said to be ‘equal.’ (Thomson 1949, p. 4). Fundamental equality means that persons are alike in important relevant and specified respects alone, and not that they are all generally the same or can be treated in the same way (Nagel 1991). In a now commonly posed distinction, stemming from Dworkin (1977, p. 370), moral equality can be understood as prescribing treatment of persons as equals, i.e., with equal concern and respect, and not the often implausible principle of treating persons equally. This fundamental idea of equal respect for all persons and of the equal worth or equal dignity of all human beings (Vlastos 1962) is accepted as a minimal standard by all leading schools of modern Western political and moral culture. Any political theory abandoning this notion of equality will not be found plausible today. In a period in which metaphysical, religious and traditional views have lost their general plausibility (Habermas 1983, p. 53, 1992, pp. 39-44), it appears impossible to peacefully reach a general agreement on common political aims without accepting that persons must be treated as equals. As a result, moral equality constitutes the ‘egalitarian plateau’ for all contemporary political theories (Kymlicka 1990, p.5). To recognize that human beings are all equally individual does not mean having to treat them uniformly in any respects other than those in which they clearly have a moral claim to be treated alike. Disputes arise, of course, concerning what these claims amount to and how they should be resolved. That is the crux of the problem to which I now turn.

Since "treatment as an equal" is a shared moral standard in contemporary theory, present-day philosophical debates are concerned with the kind of equal treatment normatively required when we mutually consider ourselves persons with equal dignity. The principle of moral equality is too abstract and needs to be made concrete if we are to arrive at a clear moral standard. Nevertheless, no conception of just equality can be deduced from the notion of moral equality. Rather, we find competing philosophical conceptions of equal treatment serving as interpretations of moral equality. These need to be assessed according to their degree of fidelity to the deeper ideal of moral equality (Kymlicka 1990, p. 44). With this we finally switch the object of equality from treatment to the fair distribution of goods and ills or bads.

2.4 Presumption of Equality

Many conceptions of equality operate along procedural lines involving a presumption of equality. While more materially concrete, ethical approaches, as described in the next section below, are concerned with distributive criteria; the presumption of equality, in contrast, is a formal, procedural principle of construction located on a higher formal and argumentative level. What is here at stake is the question of the principle with which a material conception of justice should be constructed -- particularly once the above-described approaches turn out inadequate. The presumption of equality is a prima facie principle of equal distribution for all goods politically suited for the process of public distribution. In the domain of political justice, all members of a given community, taken together as a collective body, have to decide centrally on the fair distribution of social goods, as well as on the distribution’s fair realization. Any claim to a particular distribution, including any existing distributive scheme, has to be impartially justified, i.e., no ownership will be recognized without justification. Applied to this political domain, the presumption of equality requires that everyone, regardless of differences, should get an equal share in the distribution unless certain types of differences are relevant and justify, through universally acceptable reasons, unequal distribution. (With different terms and arguments, this principle is conceived as a presumption by Benn & Peters (1959, 111) and by Bedau (1967, 19); as a relevant reasons approach by Williams (1973); as a conception of symmetry by. Tugendhat (1993, 374; 1997, chap. 3); as default option by Hinsch (2001, chap. 5); for criticism of the presumption of equality, cf. Westen (1990, chap. 10).) This presumption results in a principle of prima facie equal distribution for all distributable goods. A strict principle of equal distribution is not required, but it is morally necessary to justify impartially any unequal distribution. The burden of proof lies on the side of those who favor any form of unequal distribution.

The presumption in favor of equality can be justified by the principle of equal respect together with the requirement of universal and reciprocal justification; that requirement is linked to the morality of equal respect granting each individual equal consideration in every justification and distribution. Every sort of public, political distribution is, in this view, to be justified to all relevantly concerned persons, such that they could in principle agree. Since it is immoral to force someone to do something of which he or she does not approve, only reasons acceptable to the other person can give one the moral right to treat the person in accordance with these reasons. The impartial justification of norms rests on the reciprocity and universality of the reasons. Universal norms and rights enforced through inner or external sanctions are morally justified only if, on the one hand, they can be reciprocally justified, i.e., if one person asks no more of the other than what he or she is willing to give (reciprocity), and if, on the other hand, they are justified with respect to the interests of all concerned parties, i.e., if everyone has good reasons for accepting them and no one has a good reason for rejecting them (universality) (Forst 1994, p. 68, Scanlon 1998). In the end, only the concerned parties can themselves formulate and advocate their (true) interests. Equal respect, which we reciprocally owe to one another, thus requires respect for the autonomous decisions of each non-interchangeable individual (Wingert 1993, p. 90-96). This procedural approach to moral legitimation sees the autonomy of the individual as the standard of justification for universal rules, norms, rights etc. Only those rules can be considered legitimate to which all concerned parties can freely agree on the basis of universal, discursively applicable, commonly shared reasons. Equal consideration is thus accorded to all persons and their interests. In a public distribution anyone who claims more owes all others an adequate universal and reciprocal justification. If this cannot be provided, i.e., if there is no reason for unequal distribution that can be universally and reciprocally recognized by all (since, lets assume, all are by and large equally productive and needy), then equal distribution is the only legitimate distribution. How could it be otherwise? Any unequal distribution would mean that someone receives less, and another more. Whoever receives less can justifiably demand a reason for he or she being disadvantaged. Yet there is ex hyphothesi no such justification. Hence, any unequal distribution is illegitimate in this case. If no convincing reasons for unequal distribution can be brought forward, there remains only the option of equal distribution. Equal distribution is therefore not merely one among many alternatives, but rather the inevitable starting point that must be assumed insofar as one takes the justificatory claims of all to be of equal weight.

The presumption of equality provides an elegant procedure for constructing a theory of distributive justice. The following questions would have to be answered in order to arrive at a substantial and full principle of justice.

What goods and burdens are to be justly distributed (or should be distributed)? There are various opinions as to which social goods comprise the object of distributive justice. Does distributive justice apply only to those goods commonly produced, i.e., through social and economic fair cooperation, or to other goods as well, e.g. natural resources, that are not the result of common cooperation? (At present, the former approach is most apparent in Rawls (1971) and many of his adherents and critics follow Rawls in this respect.)

In the domain of public political distribution, the goods and burdens to be distributed may be divided into various categories. Such a division is essential because reasons that speak for unequal treatment in one area do not justify unequal treatment in another. What are the spheres (of justice) into which these resources have to be grouped? In order to reconstruct our understanding of contemporary liberal, democratic welfare states, four categories seem essential: 1. civil liberties, 2. opportunities for political participation, 3. social positions and opportunities, 4. economic rewards. Despite views to the contrary, liberties and opportunities are seen in this view as objects of distribution. For all four categories, the presumption of equality is the guiding principle. The results of applying the presumption to each category can then be codified as rights.

After dividing social goods into categories, we must next ask what can justify unequal treatment or unequal distribution in each category. Today the following postulates of equality are generally considered morally required.

Strict equality is called for in the legal sphere of civil freedoms, since -- putting aside limitation on freedom as punishment -- there is no justification for any exceptions. As follows from the principle of formal equality, all citizens of a society must have equal general rights and duties. These rights and duties have to be grounded in general laws applying to everyone. This is the postulate of legal equality. In addition, the postulate of equal freedom is equally valid: every person should have the same freedom to structure his or her life, and this in the most far-reaching manner possible in a peaceful and appropriate social order.

In the political sphere, the possibilities for political participation should be equally distributed. All citizens have the same claim to participation in forming public opinion, and in the distribution, control, and exercise of political power. This is the postulate -- requiring equal opportunity -- of equal political power sharing. To ensure equal opportunity, social institutions have to be designed in such a way that persons who are disadvantaged, e.g. have a stutter or a low income, have an equal chance to make their views known and to participate fully in the democratic process.

In the social sphere, social positions, equally gifted and motivated citizens must have approximately the same chances at offices and positions, independent of their economic or social class and native endowments. This is the postulate of fair equality of social opportunity. An unequal outcome has to result from equality of chances at a position, i.e., qualifications alone counting, not social background or influences of milieu.

Since the nineteenth century, the political debate has increasingly centered on the question of economic and social inequality (this running alongside the question of -- gradually achieved -- equal rights to freedom and political participation) (Marshall 1950). The main controversy here is whether, and if so to what extent, the state should establish far-reaching equality of social conditions for all through political measures such as redistribution of income and property, tax reform, a more equal educational system, social insurance, and positive discrimination.

The equality required in the economic sphere is complex, taking account of several positions that -- each according to the presumption of equality -- justify a turn away from equality. A salient problem here is what constitutes justified exceptions to equal distribution of goods -- the main subfield in the debate over adequate conceptions of distributive equality and its currency. The following sorts of factors are usually considered eligible for justified unequal treatment: (a) need or differing natural disadvantages (e.g. disabilities); (b) existing rights or claims (e.g. private property); (c) differences in the performance of special services (e.g. desert, efforts, or sacrifices); (d) efficiency; and (e) compensation for direct and indirect or structural discrimination (e.g. affirmative action).

These factors play an essential, albeit varied, role in the following alternative egalitarian theories of distributive justice. The following theories offer different accounts of what should be equalized in the economic sphere. Most can be understood as applications of the presumption of equality (whether they explicitly acknowledge it or not); only a few (like strict equality, libertarianism, and sufficiency) are alternatives to the presumption.

3. Conceptions of Distributive Equality: Equality of What?

Every effort to interpret the concept of equality and to apply the principles of equality mentioned above demands a precise measure of the parameters of equality. We need to know the dimensions within which the striving for equality is morally relevant. What follows is a brief review of the seven most prominent conceptions of distributive equality, each offering a different answer to one question: in the field of distributive justice, what should be equalized, or what should be the parameter or "currency" of equality?

3.1 Simple Equality and Objections to Equality in General

Simple equality, meaning everyone being furnished with the same material level of goods and services, represents a strict position as far as distributive justice is concerned. It is generally rejected as untenable.

Hence with the possible exception of Barbeuf (1796), no prominent author or movement has demanded strict equality. Since egalitarianism has come to be widely associated with the demand for economic equality, and this in turn with communistic or socialistic ideas, it is important to stress that neither communism nor socialism -- despite their protest against poverty and exploitation and their demand for social security for all citizens -- calls for absolute economic equality. The orthodox Marxist view of economic equality was expounded in the Critique of the Gotha Program (1875). Marx here rejects the idea of legal equality, on three grounds. In the first place, he indicates, equality draws on a merely limited number of morally relevant vantages and neglects others, thus having unequal effects; right can never be higher than the economic structure and cultural development of the society it conditions. In the second place, theories of justice have concentrated excessively on distribution instead of the basic questions of production. In the third place, a future communist society needs no law and no justice, since social conflicts will have vanished.

As an idea, simple equality fails because of problems that are raised in regards to equality in general. It is useful to review these problems, as they require resolution in any plausible approach to equality.

(i) We need adequate indices for the measurement of the equality of the goods to be distributed. Through what concepts should equality and inequality be understood? It is thus clear that equality of material goods can lead to unequal satisfaction. Money constitutes a usual-index -- although an inadequate one; at the very least, equal opportunity has to be conceived in other terms.

(ii) The time span needs to be indicated for realizing the desired model of equal distribution (McKerlie 1989, Sikora 1989). Should we seek to equalize the goods in question over complete individual lifetimes, or should we seek to ensure that various life segments are as equally well off as possible?

(iii) Equality distorts incentives promoting achievement in the economic field, producing an inefficiency grounded in a waste of assets arising from the administrative costs of redistribution (Okun 1975). Equality and efficiency need to be placed in a balanced relation. Often, pareto-optimality is demanded in this respect -- for the most part by economists. A social condition is pareto-optimal or pareto-efficient when it is not possible to shift to another condition judged better by at least one person and worse by none (Sen 1970, chap. 2, 2*). A widely discussed alternative to the Pareto principle is the Kaldor-Hicks welfare criterion. This stipulates that a rise in social welfare is always present when the benefits accruing through the distribution of value in a society exceed the corresponding costs. A change thus becomes desirable when the winners in such a change could compensate the losers for their losses and still retain a substantial profit. In contrast to the Pareto-criterion, the Kaldor-Hicks criterion contains a compensation rule (Kaldor 1939). For purposes of economic analysis, such theoretical models of optimal efficiency make a great deal of sense. However, the analysis is always made relative to starting situation that can be unjust and unequal. A society can thus be (close to) pareto-optimality -- i.e., no one can increase his or her material goods or freedoms without diminishing those of someone else -- while also displaying enormous inequalities in the distribution of the same goods and freedoms. For this reason, egalitarians claim that it may be necessary to reduce pareto-optimality for the sake of justice if there is no more egalitarian distribution that is also pareto-optimal. In the eyes of their critics, equality of whatever kind should not lead to some people having to do with less even though this equalizing down does not benefit any of those who are in a worse position.

(iv) Moral objections: A strict and mechanical equal distribution between all individuals does not sufficiently take into account the differences among individuals and their situations. In essence, since individuals desire different things, why should everyone receive the same? Intuitively, for example, we can recognize that a sick person has other claims than a healthy person, and furnishing each with the same things would be mistaken. With simple equality, personal freedoms are unacceptably limited and distinctive individual qualities insufficiently regarded; in this manner they are in fact unequally regarded. Furthermore, persons not only have a moral right to their own needs being considered, but a right and a duty to take responsibility for their own decisions and their consequences.

Working against the identification of distributive justice with simple equality, a basic postulate of virtually all present-day egalitarians is as follows: human beings are themselves responsible for certain inequalities resulting from their free decisions; aside from minimum aid in emergencies, they deserve no recompense for such inequalities. On the other hand, they are due compensation for inequalities that are not the result of self-chosen options. For egalitarians, the world is morally better when equality of life conditions prevail. This is an amorphous ideal demanding further clarification. Why is such equality an ideal, and equality of what, precisely?

By the same token, most egalitarians presently do not advocate an equality of outcome, but different kinds of equality of opportunity, due to their emphasis on a pair of morally central points: firstly, that individuals have responsibility for their decisions; and secondly, that the only things to be considered objects of equality are things serving the real interests of individuals. The opportunities to be equalized between people can be opportunities for well-being (i.e. objective welfare), or for preference satisfaction (i.e., subjective welfare), or for resources. It is not equality of objective or subjective well-being or resources themselves that should be equalized, but an equal opportunity to gain the well-being or resources one aspires to. Such equality of opportunity (to well-being or resources) depends on the presence of a realm of options for each individual equal to the options enjoyed by all other persons, in the sense of the same prospects for fulfillment of preferences or the possession of resources. The opportunity must consist of possibilities one can really take advantage of. Equal opportunity prevails when human beings effectively enjoy equal realms of possibility.

(v) Simple equality is very often associated with equality of results (although these are two distinct concepts). However, to strive only for equality of results is problematic. To illustrate the point, let us briefly limit the discussion to a single action and the event or state of affairs resulting from it. Arguably, actions should not be judged solely by the moral quality of their results as important as this may be. One also has to take into consideration the way in which the events or circumstances to be evaluated have come about. Generally speaking, a moral judgement requires not only the assessment of the results of the action in question (the consequentialist aspect) but, first and foremost, the assessment of the intention of the actor (the deontological aspect). The source and its moral quality influence the moral judgement of the results (Pogge 1999, sect. V). For example, if you strike me, your blow will hurt me; the pain I feel may be considered bad in itself, but the moral status of your blow will also depend on whether you were (morally) allowed such a gesture (perhaps through parental status, although that is controversial) or even obliged to execute it (e.g. as a police officer preventing me from doing harm to others), or whether it was in fact prohibited but not prevented. What is true of individual actions (or their omission) has to be true mutatis mutandis of social institutions and circumstances like distributions resulting from collective social actions (or their omission). Hence social institutions are to be assessed not solely on the basis of information about how they affect individual quality of life. A society in which people starve on the streets is certainly marked by inequality; nevertheless, its moral quality, i.e., whether the society is just or unjust with regard to this problem, also depends on the suffering’s causes. Does the society allow starvation as an unintended but tolerable side effect of what its members see as a just distributive scheme? Indeed, does it even defend the suffering as a necessary means, e.g. as a sort of Social Darwinism? Or has the society taken measures against starvation which have turned out insufficient? In the latter case, whether the society has taken such steps for reasons of political morality or efficiency again makes a moral difference. Hence even for egalitarians, equality of results is too narrow and one-sided a focus.

(vi) Finally, there is a danger of (strict) equality leading to uniformity, rather than to a respect for pluralism and democracy (Cohen 1989; Arneson 1993). In the contemporary debate, this complaint has been mainly articulated in feminist and multiculturalist theory. A central tenet of feminist theory is that gender has been and remains a historical variable and internally differentiated relation of domination. The same holds for so called racial and ethnic differences. These differences are often still conceived of as marking different values. The different groups involved here rightly object to their discrimination, marginalization, and domination, and an appeal to equality of status thus seems a solution. However as feminists and multiculturalists have pointed out, equality, as usually understood and practiced, is constituted in part by a denial and ranking of differences; as a result it seems less useful as an antidote to relations of domination. "Equality" can often mean the assimilation to a pre-existing and problematic ‘male’ or ‘white’ or ‘middle class’ norm. In short, domination and a fortiori inequality often arises out of an inability to appreciate and nurture differences -- not out of a failure to see everyone as the same. To recognize these differences should however not lead to an essentialism grounded in sexual or cultural characteristics. In contemporary multiculturalism and feminism, there is a crucial debate between those who insist that sexual, racial, and ethnic differences should become irrelevant, on the one hand, and those believing that such differences, even though culturally relevant, should not furnish a basis for inequality: that rather one should find mechanisms for securing equality, despite valued differences. Neither of these strategies involves rejecting equality. Rather, the dispute is about how equality is to be attained (McKinnon 1989, Taylor 1992).

Proposing a connection between equality and pluralism, Michael Walzer’s theory (1983) aims at what he calls "complex equality". According to Walzer, relevant reasons can only speak in favor of distribution of specific types of goods in specific spheres -- not in several or all spheres. Against a theory of simple equality promoting equal distribution of dominant goods, hence underestimating the complexity of the criteria at work in each given sphere the dominance of particular goods needs to be ended. For instance, purchasing power in the political sphere through means derived from the economic sphere (i.e., money) needs to be prevented. Actually, Walzer’s theory of complex equality is not aimed at equality but at the separation of spheres of justice, the theory’s designation thus being misleading. Any theory of equality should however follow Walzer’s advice not to be monistic but recognize the complexity of life and the plurality of criteria for justice.

We thus arrive at the following desideratum: instead of simple equality, we need a concept of more complex equality: a concept managing to resolve the above problems through a distinction of various classes of goods, a separation of spheres, and a differentiation of relevant criteria.

3.2 Libertarianism

Libertarianism and economic liberalism represent minimalist positions in relation to distributive justice. Citing Locke, they both postulate an original right to freedom and property, thus arguing against redistribution and social rights and for the free market (Nozick 1974; Hayek 1960). They assert an opposition between equality and freedom: the individual (natural) right to freedom can be limited only for the sake of foreign and domestic peace. For this reason, libertarians consider maintaining public order the state’s only legitimate duty. They assert a natural right to self-ownership (the philosophical term for "ownership of oneself" -- i.e., one’s will, body, work, etc.) that entitles everybody to thus far unowned bits of the external world by means of mixing their labor with it. All individuals can thus claim property if "enough and as good" is left over for others (Locke’s proviso). Correspondingly, they defend market freedoms and oppose the use of redistributive taxation schemes for the sake of social justice as equality. A principal objection to libertarian theory is that its interpretation of the Lockean proviso -- nobody’s situation should be worsened through an initial acquisition of property -- leads to an excessively weak requirement and is thus unacceptable (Kymlicka 1990, pp.108-117). With a broader and more adequate interpretation of what it means for one a situation to be worse than another, however, justifying private appropriation and, a fortiori, all further ownership rights, becomes much more difficult. If the proviso recognizes the full range of interests and alternatives that self-owners have, then it will not generate unrestricted rights over unequal amounts of resources. Another objection is that precisely if one’s own free accomplishment is what is meant to count, as the libertarians argue, success should not depend strictly on luck, extraordinary natural gifts, inherited property, and status. In other words, equal opportunity also needs to at least be present as a counterbalance, ensuring that the fate of human beings is determined by their decisions and not by unavoidable social circumstances. Equal opportunity thus seems to be the frequently vague minimal formula at work in every egalitarian conception of distributive justice. Many egalitarians, however, wish for more -- namely, an equality of (at least basic) life conditions.

In any event, with a shift away from a strictly negative idea of freedom, economic liberalism can indeed itself point the way to more social and economic equality. For with such a shift, what is at stake is not only assuring an equal right to self-defense, but also furnishing everyone more or less the same chance to actually make use of the right to freedom (e.g. Van Parijs 1995, Steiner 1994). In other words, certain basic goods need to be furnished to assure the equitable or ‘fair value of the basic liberties’ (Rawls 1993, pp. 356-63).

3.3 Utilitarianism

It is possible to interpret utilitarianism as concretizing moral equality -- and this in a way meant to offer the same consideration to the interests of all human beings (Kymlicka 1990, pp. 31f., Hare 1981, p. 26, Sen 1992, pp. 13f.). From the utilitarian perspective, since everyone counts as one and no one as more than one (Bentham), the interests of all should be treated equally without consideration of contents of interest or an individual’s material situation. For utilitarianism this means that all enlightened personal interests have to be fairly aggregated. The morally proper action is the one that maximizes utility (Hare 1984). But this utilitarian conception of equal treatment has been criticized as inadequate by many opponents of utilitarianism. At least in utilitarianism’s classical form -- so the critique reads -- the hoped for moral equality is flawed: this because all desires are taken up by the utilitarian calculation -- including "selfish" and "external" preferences (Dworkin 1977, p. 234), all having equal weight, even when they diminish the ‘rights’ and intentions of others. And this, of course, conflicts with our everyday understanding of equal treatment. What is here at play is an argument involving "offensive" and "expensive" taste: a person cannot expect others to sustain his or her desires at the expense of their own (Kymlicka 1990, p. 40 f.). Rather, according to generally shared conviction, equal treatment consistently requires a basis of equal rights and resources that cannot be taken away from one person, whatever the desire of others. In line with Rawls (1971, pp. 31, 564, cf. 450), many hold that justice entails according no value to interests insofar as they conflict with justice. According to this view, unjustified preferences will not distort mutual claims people have on each other. Equal treatment has to consist of everyone being able to claim a fair portion, and not in all interests having the same weight in disposal over my portion. Utilitarians cannot admit any restrictions on interests based on morals or justice. As long as utilitarian theory lacks a concept of justice and fair allotment, it must fail in its goal of treating all as equals. As Rawls (1971, pp. 27) also famously argues, utilitarianism that involves neglecting the separateness of persons does not contain a proper interpretation of moral equality as equal respect for each individual.

3.4 Equality of Welfare

The concept of welfare equality is motivated by an intuition that when it comes to political ethics, what is at stake is the individual’s well-being. The central criterion for justice must consequently be equalizing the level of welfare. But taking welfare as what is to be equalized leads into major difficulties, which resemble those of utilitarianism. If one contentiously identifies subjective welfare with preference satisfaction, it seems implausible to count all individual preferences as equal, some -- such as the desire to do others wrong -- being inadmissible on grounds of justice (the offensive taste argument). Any welfare-centered concept of equality grants people with refined and expensive taste more resources -- something distinctly at odds with our moral intuitions (the expensive taste argument) (Dworkin 1981a). However, satisfaction in the fulfillment of desires cannot serve as a standard, since we wish for more than a simple feeling of happiness. A more viable standard for welfare comparisons would seem to be success in the fulfillment of preferences. A fair evaluation of such success cannot be purely subjective, rather requiring a standard of what should or could have been achieved. And this itself involves an assumption regarding just distribution; it is thus no independent criterion for justice. An additional serious problem with any welfare-centered concept of equality is that it cannot take account of either desert (Feinberg 1970) or personal responsibility for one’s own well-being, to the extent this is possible and reasonable.

3.5 Equality of Resources

Represented above all by both Rawls and Dworkin, resource equality avoids such problems (Rawls 1971; Dworkin 1981b). It holds individuals responsible for their decisions and actions, not, however, for circumstances beyond their control -- race, sex, and skin-color, but also intelligence and social position -- which thus are excluded as distributive criteria. Equal opportunity is insufficient because it does not compensate for unequal innate gifts. What applies for social circumstances should also apply for such gifts, both these factors being purely arbitrary from a moral point of view and requiring adjustment.

According to Rawls, human beings should have the same initial expectations of "basic goods," i.e., all-purpose goods; this in no way precludes ending up with different quantities of such goods or resources, as a result of personal economic decisions and actions. When prime importance is accorded an assurance of equal basic freedoms and rights, inequalities are just when they fulfill two provisos: on the one hand, they have to be linked to offices and positions open to everyone under conditions of fair equality of opportunity; on the other hand, they have to reflect the famous ‘difference principle’ in offering the greatest possible advantage to the least advantaged members of society (Rawls 1993, p. 5 f.; 1971, § 13). Otherwise, the economic order requires revision. Due to the argument of the moral arbitrariness of talents, the commonly accepted criteria for merit (like productivity, working hours, effort) are clearly relativized. The difference principle only allows the talented to earn more to the extent this raises the lowest incomes. According to Rawls, with regard to the basic structure of society, the difference principle should be opted for under a self-chosen "veil of ignorance" regarding personal and historical circumstances and similar factors: the principle offers a general assurance of not totally succumbing to the hazards of a free market situation; and everyone does better than with inevitably inefficient total equal distribution, whose level of well-being is below that of those worst off under the difference principle.

Since Rawls’ Theory of Justice is the classical focal point of present-day political philosophy, it is worth noting the different ways his theory claims to be egalitarian: First, Rawls upholds a natural basis for equal human worth: a minimal capacity for having a conception of the good and a sense of justice. Second, through the device of the "veil of ignorance," people are conceived as equals in the "original position." Third, the idea of sharing this "original position" presupposes the parties having political equality, as equal participants in the process of choosing the principles by which they would be governed. Fourth, Rawls proposes fair equality of opportunity. Fifth, Rawls maintains that all desert must be institutionally defined, depending on the goals of the society. No one deserves his or her talents or circumstances -- all products of the natural lottery. Finally, the difference principle tends toward equalizing holdings.

Dworkin’s equality of resources (1981b) stakes a claim to being even more ‘ambition-sensitive’ and endowment-insensitive’ than Rawls’ theory. Unequal distribution of resources is considered fair only when it results from the decisions and intentional actions of those concerned. Dworkin proposes a hypothetical auction in which everyone can accumulate bundles of resources through equal means of payment, so that in the end no one is jealous of another’s bundle (the envy test). The auction-procedure also offers a way to precisely measure equality of resources: the measure of resources devoted to a person’s life is defined by the importance of the resources to others (Dworkin 1981b, p. 290). In the free market, how the distribution then develops depends on an individual’s ambitions. The inequalities that thus emerge are justified, since one has to take responsibility for one’s "option luck" in the realm of personal responsibility. In contrast, unjustified inequalities based on different innate provisions and gifts as well as brute luck should be compensated for through a fictive differentiated insurance system: its premiums are established behind Dworkin’s own ‘veil of ignorance,’ in order to then be distributed in real life to everyone and collected in taxes. For Dworkin, this is the key to the natural lottery being balanced fairly, preventing an "slavery of the talented" through excessive redistribution.

Objections to all versions of "brute-luck egalitarianism" come from two sides. Some authors criticize its in their view unjustified or excessively radical rejection of merit: The egalitarian thesis of desert only being justifiably acknowledged if it involves desert "all the way down" (Nozick 1974, p. 225) not only destroys the classical, everyday principle of desert, since everything has a basis that we ourselves have not created. In the eyes of such critics, along with the merit-principle this argument also destroys our personal identity, since we can no longer accredit ourselves with our own capacities and accomplishments. (Cf. the texts in Pojman & McLeod 1998.) Other authors consider the criterion for responsibility to be too strong, indeed inhuman in its consequences, since human beings responsible for their own misery would be left alone with their misery (Anderson 1999).

3.6 Equality of Opportunity for Welfare or Advantage

Approaches based on equality of opportunity can be read as revisions of both welfarism and resourcism. Ranged against welfarism and designed to avoid its pitfalls, they incorporate the powerful ideas of choice and responsibility into various, improved forms of egalitarianism. Such approaches are meant to equalize outcomes, insofar as they are the consequences of causes beyond a person’s control (i.e., beyond circumstances or endowment), but to allow differential outcomes in so far as they result from autonomous choice or ambition. But the approaches are also aimed at maintaining the insight that individual preferences have to count, as the sole basis for a necessary linkage back to the individual perspective: otherwise, there is an overlooking of the person’s value. In Arneson’s (1989, 1990) concept of equal opportunity for welfare, the preferences determining the measure of individual well-being are meant to be conceived hypothetically -- i.e., a person would decide on them after a process of ideal reflection. In order to correspond to the morally central vantage of personal responsibility, what should be equalized are not enlightened preferences themselves, but rather real opportunities to achieve or receive a good, to the extent that it is aspired to. G.A. Cohen’s (1989, p. 916 f.) broader conception of equality of access to advantage attempts to link and integrate the perspectives of welfare equality and resource equality through the overriding concept of advantage. For Cohen, there are two grounds for egalitarian compensation. Egalitarians will be moved to furnish a paralyzed person with a compensatory wheelchair independently of the person’s welfare level. This egalitarian response to disability overrides equality of (opportunity to) welfare. Egalitarians also favor compensation for phenomena such as pain, independent of any loss of capacity -- for instance by paying for expensive medicine. But, Cohen claims, any justification for such compensation has to invoke the idea of equality of opportunity to welfare. He thus views both aspects, resources and welfare, as necessary and irreducible. Much of Roemer’s (1998) more technical argument is devoted to constructing the scale to calibrate the extent to which something is the result of circumstances. An incurred adverse consequence is the result of circumstances, not choice, precisely to the extent that it is a consequence that persons of one or another specific type can be expected to incur.

3.7 Capabilities Approaches

Theories that limit themselves to the equal distribution of basic means -- this in the hope of doing justice to the different goals of all human beings -- are often criticized as fetishistic, in that they focus on means, rather than on what individuals gain with these means (Sen 1980). For the value goods have for someone depends on objective possibilities, the natural environment, and individual capacities. Hence in contrast to the resourcist approach, Amartya Sen proposes orientating distribution around "capabilities to achieve functionings," i.e., the various things that a person manages to do or be in leading a life (Sen 1992). In other words, evaluating individual well-being has to be tied to a capability for achieving and maintaining various precious conditions and "functionings" constitutive of a person’s being, such as adequate nourishment, good health, the ability to move about freely or to appear in public without shame, and so forth. Also important here is the real freedom to acquire well-being -- a freedom represented in the capability to oneself choose forms of achievement and the combination of "functionings." For Sen, capabilities are thus the measure of an equality of capabilities human beings enjoy to lead their lives. A problem consistently raised with capability approaches is the ability to weigh capabilities in order to arrive at a metric for equality. The problem is intensified by the fact that various moral perspectives are comprised in the concept of capability (Cohen 1993, p. 17-26, Williams 1987). Martha Nussbaum (1992, 2000) has linked the capability approach to an Aristotelian, essentialistic, "thick" theory of the good -- a theory meant to be, as she puts it, "vague," incomplete, and open-ended enough to leave place for individuality and cultural variations. On the basis of such a "thick" conception of necessary and universal elements of a good life, certain capabilities and functionings can be designated as foundational. In this manner, Nussbaum can endow the capability approach with a precision that furnishes an index of interpersonal comparison, but at some risk: that of not being neutral enough regarding the plurality of personal conceptions of the good ? a neutrality normally required by most liberals (most importantly Rawls 1993).

4. Equality Among Whom?

Justice is primarily related to individual actions. Individual persons are the primary bearers of responsibility (the key principle of ethical individualism). This raises two controversial issues in the contemporary debate.

One could regard the norms of distributive equality as applying to groups rather than individuals. It is often groups that rightfully raise the issue of an inequality between themselves and the rest of society -- e.g. women; so-called racial and ethnic groups. The question arises of whether inequality among such groups should be considered morally objectionable in itself, or whether even in the case of groups, the underlying concern should be how individuals (as members of such groups) fare in comparative terms.

Do the norms of distributive equality (whatever they are) apply to all individuals, regardless of where (and when) they live? Or rather, do they only hold for members of communities within states and nations? Most theories of equality deal exclusively with distributive equality among people in a single society. But there does not seem to be any rationale for that limitation. Can the group of the entitled be restricted prior to the examination of concrete claims? Many theories seem to imply this when they connect distributive justice or the goods to be distributed with social cooperation or production. For those who contribute nothing to cooperation, such as the disabled, children, or future generations, would have to be denied a claim to a fair share. The circle of persons who are to be the recipients of distribution would thus be restricted from the outset. Other theories are less restrictive, insofar as they do not link distribution to actual social collaboration, yet nonetheless do restrict it, insofar as they bind it to the status of citizenship. In this view, distributive justice is limited to the individuals within a society. Those outside the community have no entitlement to social justice. Unequal distribution among states and the social situations of people outside the particular society could not, in this view, be a problem of social distributive justice. Yet here too, the universal morality of equal respect and the principle of equal distribution demand that we consider each person as prima facie equally entitled to the goods, unless reasons for an unequal distribution can be put forth. It may be that in the process of justification, reasons will emerge for privileging those who were particularly involved in the production of a good. But prima facie, there is no reason to exclude from the outset other persons, e.g. those from other countries, from the process of distribution and justification. That may seem most intuitively plausible in the case of natural resources (e.g. oil) that someone discovers by chance on or beneath the surface of his or her property. Why should such resources belong to the person who discovers them, or on whose property they are located? Nevertheless, in the eyes of many if not most people, global justice, i.e., extending distributive justice globally, demands too much from individuals and their states (Miller 1998). The charge, open, of course, to challenge, is one of excessive demands being made.

5. The Value of Equality: Why Equality?

Does equality play a major role in a theory of justice, and if so, what is this role?

A conception of justice is egalitarian when it views equality as a fundamental goal of justice. L. Temkin has put it as follows: "an egalitarian is any person who attaches some value to equality itself (that is, any person that cares at all about equality, over and above the extent it promotes other ideals). So, equality needn’t be the only value, or even the ideal she values most....Egalitarians have the deep and (for them) compelling view that it is a bad thing -- unjust and unfair -- for some to be worse off than others through no fault of their own." (Temkin 1986, p. 100, cf. 1993, p. 7). In general, the focus of the modern egalitarian effort to realize equality is on the possibility of a good life, i.e., on an equality of life prospects and life circumstances -- interpreted in various ways according to various positions in the "equality of what" debate (see above).

I maintain the presence of three sorts of egalitarianism: intrinsic, instrumental and constitutive. (For a two fold distinction cf. Parfit 1997, Temkin 1993, p. 11, McKerlie, 1996, p. 275.) Intrinsic egalitarians view equality as an intrinsic good in itself. As pure egalitarians, they are concerned solely with equality, most of them with equality of social circumstances, according to which it is intrinsically bad if some people are worse off than others through no fault of their own. But it is in fact the case that we do not always consider inequality a moral evil. Intrinsic egalitarians regard equality as desirable even when the equalization would be of no use to any of the affected parties -- e.g. when equality can only be produced through depressing the level of everyone’s life. But something can only have an intrinsic value when it is good for at least one person, i.e., makes one life better in some way or another. The following "leveling-down" objection indicates that doing away with inequality in fact ought to produce better circumstances -- it otherwise being unclear why equality should be desired. (For such an objection, cf. Nozick 1974, p. 229, Raz 1986, chap. 9, p. 227, 235, Temkin 1993, pp. 247-8.) Sometimes inequality can only be ended by depriving those who are better off of their resources, rendering them as poorly off as everyone else. (For anyone looking for a drastic literary example, Kurt Vonnegut’s science-fiction story Harrison Bergeron (1950) is recommended.) This would have to be an acceptable approach according to the intrinsic concept. But would it be morally good if, in a group consisting of both blind and seeing persons, those with sight were rendered blind because the blind could not be offered sight? That would in fact be morally perverse. Doing away with inequality by bringing everyone down contains -- so the objection -- nothing good. Such leveling-down objections would of course only be valid if there were indeed no better and equally egalitarian alternatives available; and nearly always there are such: e.g. those who can see should have to help the blind, financially or otherwise. In case there are no alternatives, in order to avoid such objections, intrinsic egalitarianism cannot be strict, but needs to be pluralistic. Then intrinsic egalitarians could say there is something good about the change, namely greater equality -- although they would concede that much is bad about it. Pluralistic egalitarians do not have equality as their only goal; they also admit other values and principles -- above all the principle of welfare, according to which it is better when people are doing better. In addition, pluralistic egalitarianism should be moderate enough to not always grant equality victory in the case of conflict between equality and welfare. Instead, it needs to be able to accept reductions in equality for the sake of a higher quality of life for all (as e.g. with Rawls’ difference principle).

At present, many egalitarians are ready to concede that equality in the sense of equality of life circumstances has no compelling value in itself; but that, in a framework of liberal concepts of justice, its meaning emerges in pursuit of other ideals: universal freedom, full development of human capacities and the human personality, the mitigation of suffering and defeat of domination and stigmatization, the stable coherence of modern, freely constituted societies, and so forth (Scanlon 1996). For those who are worse off, unequal circumstances often mean considerable (relative) disadvantages and many (absolute) evils; and as a rule these (relative) disadvantages and (absolute) evils are the source for our moral condemnation of unequal circumstances. But this does not mean that inequality as such is an evil. Hence, the argument goes, fundamental moral ideals other than equality stand behind our aspiring for equality. When we are against inequality on such grounds, we are for equality either as a byproduct or as a means and not as a goal or intrinsic value. In its treatment of equality as a derived virtue, the sort of egalitarianism -- if the term is actually suitable -- here at play is instrumental.

As indicated, there is also a third, more suitable approach to the equality ideal: a constitutive egalitarianism. According to this approach, we aspire to equality on other moral grounds -- namely, because certain inequalities are unjust. Equality has value, but this is an extrinsic value, since it derives from another, higher moral principle of equal dignity and respect. But it is not instrumental for this reason, i.e., it is not only valued on account of moral equality, but also on its own account. (For the distinction between the origin of a value and the kind of value it is, cf. Korsgaard 1996.) Equality stands in relation to justice as does a part to a whole. The requirement of justification is based on moral equality; and in certain contexts, successful justification leads to the above-named principles of equality, i.e., formal, proportional equality and the presumption of equality. Thus according to constitutive egalitarianism, these principles and the resulting equality are justified and required by justice, and by the same token constitute social justice.

We should further distinguish two levels of egalitarianism and non-egalitarianism, respectively. On a first level, a constitutive egalitarian presumes that every explication of the moral standpoint is incomplete without terms such as ‘equal,’ ‘similarly,’ etc. In contrast, a non-egalitarianism operating on the same level considers such terms misplaced or redundant. On a second level, when it comes to concretizing and specifying conceptions of justice, a constitutive egalitarian gives equality substantive weight. On this level, we can find more and less egalitarian positions according to the chosen currency of equality (the criteria by which just equality is measured) and according to the reasons for unequal distributions (exemptions of the presumption of equality) the respective theories regard as well grounded. Egalitarianism on the second level thus relates to the kind, quality and quantity of things to be equalized. Because of such variables, a clear-cut definition of second level egalitarianism cannot be formulated. In contrast, non-egalitarians on this second level advocate a non-relational entitlement theory of justice.

Alongside the often-raised objections against equality mentioned in the section on "simple equality" there is a different and more fundamental critique formulated by first level non-egalitarians: that equality does not have a foundational role in the grounding of claims to justice. While the older version of a critique of egalitarianism comes mainly from a the right side of the political spectrum, thus arguing in general against "patterned principles of justice" (Nozick 1974, esp. pp. 156-157), the critique’s newer version also often can be heard in liberal circles (Walzer 1983, Raz 1986, chap. 9, Frankfurt 1987. 1997, Parfit 1997, Anderson 1999). This first-level critique of equality poses the basic question of why justice should in fact be conceived relationally and (what is here the same) comparatively. Referring back to Joel Feinberg’s (1974) distinction between comparative and non-comparative justice, non-egalitarians object to the moral requirement to treat people as equals and many demands for justice emerging from it. They argue that neither the postulate nor these demands involve comparative principles -- let alone any equality principles. They reproach first-level egalitarians for a confusion between "equality" and "universals." As the non-egalitarians see things, within many principles of justice -- at least the especially important ones -- the equality-terminology is redundant. Equality is thus merely a byproduct of the general fulfillment of actually non-comparative standards of justice: something obscured through the unnecessary inserting of an expression of equality (Raz 1986, p. 227f.). At least the central standards of dignified human life are not relational but "absolute." As Harry Frankfurt puts it: "It is whether people have good lives, and not how their lives compare with the lives of others." (Frankfurt 1997, p. 6) And again: "The fundamental error of egalitarianism lies in supposing that it is morally important whether one person has less than another regardless of how much either of them has." (Frankfurt 1987, p. 34)

From the non-egalitarian vantage, what is really at stake in helping those worse off and improving their lot is humanitarian concern, a desire to alleviate suffering. Such concern is understood as not egalitarian. It is not centered on the difference between those better off and those worse off as such (whatever the applied standard), but on improving the situation of persons in bad circumstances. Their distress constitutes the actual moral foundation. The wealth of those better off only furnishes a means that has to be transferred for the sake of mitigating the distress, as long as other, morally negative consequences do not emerge in the process. The strength of the impetus for more equality lies in the urgency of the claims of those worse off, not in the extent of the inequality. For this reason, instead of equality the non-egalitarian critics favor one or another entitlement theory of justice, such as Nozick’s (1974) libertarianism (cf. 3.2. above) and Frankfurt’s (1987) doctrine of sufficiency, according to which "What is important from the moral point of view is not that everyone should have the same but that each should have enough. If everyone had enough, it would be of no moral consequence whether some had more than others." (Frankfurt 1987, p. 21) Parfit’s (1997) priority view accordingly calls for focus on improving the situation of society’s weaker and poorer members and indeed all the more urgently the worse off they are, even if they can be less helped than others in the process. In any case, entitlement-based non-egalitarian arguments can result in praxis in an equality of outcome as far-reaching as egalitarian theories. Hence fulfilling an absolute or non-comparative standard for everyone (e.g. to the effect that nobody should starve) frequently results in a certain equality of outcome, such a standard comprising not only a decent living but a good life. Consequently, the debate here centers on the basis -- is it equality or something else? -- and not so much on the outcome -- are persons or groups more or less equal, according to a chosen metric? Possibly, the difference is even deeper, lying in the conception of morality in general, rather than in equality at all.

Egalitarians can respond to the anti-egalitarian critique by conceding that it is the nature of some (if certainly far from all) essential norms of morality and justice to be concerned primarily with the adequate fulfillment of the separate claims of individuals. However whether a claim can itself be considered suitable can be ascertained only by asking whether it can be agreed on by all those affected in hypothetical conditions of freedom and equality. This justificatory procedure is all the more needed the less evident -- indeed the more unclear or controversial -- it is if what is at stake is actually suffering, distress, an objective need. In the view of the constitutive egalitarians, all the judgments of distributive justice should be approached relationally by asking which distributive scheme all concerned parties can universally and reciprocally agree to. As described at some length in the pertinent section above, many egalitarians argue that a presumption in favor of equality follows from this justification requirement. In the eyes of such egalitarians, this is all one needs for the justification and determination of the constitutive value of equality.

Secondly, even if -- for the sake of argument -- the question is left open of whether demands for distribution according to objective needs (e.g. alleviating hunger) involve non-comparative entitlement-claims, it is nonetheless always necessary to resolve the question of what we do owe needy individuals. And this is tied in a basic way to the question of what we owe persons in comparable or worse situations, and how we need to invest our scarce resources (money, goods, time, energy) in light of the sum total of our obligations. While the claim on our help may well appear non-relational, determining the kind and extent of the help must always be relational -- at least in circumstances of scarcity (and resources are always scarce). Claims are either "satiable" (Raz 1986, p. 235), i.e., an upper limit or sufficiency level can be indicated after which each person’s claim to X has been fulfilled, or they are not so. For insatiable claims, to stipulate any level at which one is or ought to be sufficiently satisfied is arbitrary. If the standards of sufficiency are defined as a bare minimum, why should persons be content with that minimum? Why should the manner in which welfare and resources are distributed above the poverty level not also be a question of justice? If, by contrast, we are concerned solely with claims that are in principle "satiable," such claims having a reasonable definitions of sufficiency, then these standards of sufficiency will most likely be very high. In Frankfurt’s definition, for example, sufficiency is reached only when persons are satisfied and no longer actively strive for more. Since we find ourselves operating, in practice, in circumstances far beneath such a high sufficiency level, we (of course) live in (moderate) scarcity. Then the above mentioned argument holds as well -- namely, that in order to determine to what extent it is to be fulfilled, each claim has to be judged in relation to the claims of all others and all available resources. In addition, the moral urgency of lifting people above dire poverty cannot be invoked to demonstrate the moral urgency of everyone having enough. In both forms of scarcity, i.e., with satiable and insatiable claims, the social right or claim to goods cannot be conceived as something absolute or non-comparative. Egalitarians may thus conclude that distributive justice is always comparative. This would suggest that distributive equality, especially equality of life-conditions, is due a fundamental role in an adequate theory of justice in particular and of morality in general.


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consequentialism | egalitarianism | equality: of opportunity | impartiality | justice: distributive | justification, political: public | libertarianism | luck: justice and bad luck

Copyright © 2001 by
Stefan Gosepath
Hochschule der Künste Berlin

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First published: March 26, 2001
Content last modified: October 8, 2001