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Virtue Epistemology

An approach in epistemology that applies the resources of virtue theory to problems in the theory of knowledge. It is argued that by doing so it is possible to give informative accounts of knowledge, evidence, and other important epistemic concepts, while solving a wide range of problems that have plagued other approaches in the theory of knowledge.


Virtue epistemology begins with the assumption that epistemology is a normative discipline. The main idea of virtue epistemology is to understand the kind of normativity involved on the model of virtue theories in ethics. This main idea is best understood in terms of a thesis about the direction of analysis. Just as virtue theories in ethics try to understand the normative properties of actions in terms of the normative properties of moral agents, virtue epistemology tries to understand the normative properties of beliefs in terms of the normative properties of cognitive agents. Hence virtue theories in ethics have been described as person-based rather than act-based, and virtue epistemology has been described as person-based rather than belief-based.

For example, non-virtue theories might try to understand the epistemic justification of belief in terms of doing one’s epistemic duty, believing according to the evidence, or using a reliable method. In each case the account of justified belief makes no reference to any normative properties of persons. On the contrary, it would be natural on such views to think of epistemic virtues as dispositions to believe in the ways in question. Virtue epistemology changes this direction of analysis by understanding justified belief in terms of epistemic virtues. For example, Ernest Sosa has argued that justified belief is belief that is grounded in epistemic virtue. Similarly, Linda Zagzebski has argued that knowledge is true belief arising out of acts of intellectual virtue. Of course the next task is to give an informative account of the cognitive virtues involved in such definitions. Depending on how this is done, we get further versions of virtue epistemology.

A number of claims have been made on behalf of virtue epistemology. We have already seen that virtue epistemologists promise to define a range of important epistemic concepts by drawing on the resources of virtue theory. Beyond this, it has been claimed that virtue epistemology can overcome the debate between internalist and externalist conceptions of justification, that it can solve problems pertaining to skepticism, that it can solve Gettier problems, and that it can contribute to a unified theory of value across epistemology and ethics. Recent interest in virtue epistemology began with a paper by Ernest Sosa, where he claimed that a turn to virtue theory would allow a solution to the impass between foundationalist theories of justification and coherentist theories of justification. One way to organize the literature is to begin with Sosa’s paper and the development of his own version of virtue epistemology. We may then look at various reactions to Sosa’s seminal work. As we shall see, these may be divided into two categories. While some critics have responded with objections to the idea that we should turn to virtue theory in epistemology, another group has responded with objections that Sosa does not go far enough in exploiting the various resources of virtue theory.

Virtue Perspectivism

In "The Raft and the Pyramid: Coherence versus Foundations in the Theory of Knowledge," Sosa suggested that virtue epistemology would allow a solution to the foundationalism–coherentism problematic in epistemology. We may think of foundationalism on the metaphor of a pyramid: there is a structure to knowledge involving a nonsymmetrical relation of support among levels, with one level having the special status of a foundation which supports all the rest. In the most plausible versions of foundationalism sensory experience plays an important role in the foundation, providing a ground for observational knowledge from which further knowledge can be inferred higher up in the structure. Coherentism counters this account of knowledge with its metaphor of the raft: knowledge is a structure that floats free of any secure anchor or tie. No part of knowledge is more fundamental than the rest to the overall structure, all of the parts being held together by the ties of logical relations.

According to Sosa, both these accounts of knowledge have fatal flaws. The problem with coherentism is that it cannot account for knowledge at the periphery of a system of beliefs. This is because coherentism makes justification entirely a function of the logical relations among beliefs in the system, but perceptual beliefs have very few logical ties to the remainder. This makes it possible to generate counterexamples to coherentism by means of the following recipe. First, take a perfectly coherent system of beliefs that seems to provide good examples of justified belief and knowledge. Second, replace one perceptual belief in the system with its negation, while also making any other slight changes that are necessary to preserve coherence. This will have very little effect on the overall coherence of the system, since that is a function only of the logical relations among the system’s beliefs. Accordingly, it will turn out to be the case that the new "perceptual belief" is as coherent as the old one, and is therefore, according to coherentism, equally well justified. This result is counter-intuitive, however, since the person’s sensory experience has remained the same. Surely she is not justified in believing that she is not standing in front of a tree, for example, if her sensory experience is as if she is standing in front of a tree. Examples like this one suggest that justification is a function of more than the relations among beliefs. Specifically, it is partly a function of one’s sensory experience.

This gives the advantage to foundationalism, which allows a role for sensory experience in justified belief and knowledge. But an equally problematic dilemma arises for foundationalism, depending on how one thinks of foundationalism’s epistemic principles. Suppose we agree that there is some true epistemic principle relating (i) a relevant sensory experience to (ii) one’s justified belief that one is standing in front of a tree. Is this to be understood as a fundmental principle about epistemic justification, or is it to be understood as an instance of some more general principle? If we say the former, then the foundationalist is faced with a seemingly infinite multitude of fundamental principles with no unifying ground. There would be different fundamental principles for visual and auditory experience, for example, as well as possible principles for beings not like us at all, but capable of having their own kind of sensory knowledge. The more attractive alternative is to think of the foundationalist’s principles as derived, but then we need an account of some deeper, unifying ground.

This is the context in which Sosa suggests that virtue epistemology will do the trick. Suppose we think of virtues in general as excellences of character. A virtue is a stable and successful disposition: an innate ability or an acquired habit, that allows one to reliably achieve some good. An intellectual virtue will then be a cognitive excellence: an innate ability or acquired habit that allows one to reliably achieve some intellectual good, such as truth in a relevant matter. We may now think of justified belief as belief that is appropriately grounded in one’s intellectual virtues, and we may think of knowledge as true belief that is so grounded. By adopting this position, we can see the foundationalist’s epistemic principles as instances of this more general account of justified belief and knowledge. The idea is that human beings possess intellectual virtues that involve sensory experience; i.e. stable and reliable dispositions for forming beliefs about the environment on the basis of experiential inputs. Such dispositions involve various sensory modalities such as vision and hearing. Other cognitive beings might be possessed of analogous dispositions, involving kinds of sensory experience unknown to humans. Accordingly, Sosa argues, virtue epistemology provides the unified account that was needed.

The same idea accounts for the truth involved in coherentism as well. Namely, coherence gives rise to justified belief and knowledge precisely because it is the manifestation of intellectual virtue. In our world, and for beings like us, coherence increases reliability, and therefore constitutes a kind of intellectual virtue in its own right. Moreover, coherence of a certain sort allows for reflective knowledge as opposed to mere animal knowledge. According to Sosa, we rise to a different and superior kind of justification and knowledge when we are able to see our beliefs as deriving from intellectual virtues. This perspective on our virtues must itself derive from a second-order intellectual virtue, one that allows us to reliably monitor and adjust our first-level cognitive dispositions.

Notice that the above ideas involve the direction of analysis thesis discussed above. Traditional foundationalism and coherentism try to account for justified belief and knowledge solely by reference to the properties of beliefs; i.e. their logical relations (coherentism) or their logical relations plus their relations to sensory experiences (traditional foundationalism). Sosa’s version of virtue epistemology accounts for various kinds of justified belief and knowledge by first defining the notion of an intellectual virtue, and then by defining various normative properties of beliefs in terms of this more fundamental property of persons.

Responses to Sosa have focussed on various objections to the position outlined above, including the general claim that a turn to virtue theory would be a fruitful approach in epistemology. A second group of critics has endorsed Sosa’s call for a turn to virtue theory in epistemology, but have argued that he does not go far enough in exploiting the various resources that virtue theory offers.

Responsibilism I

One early response to Sosa along this second line is by Lorraine Code, who argues for the centrality of epistemic responsibility in epistemology. Code agrees with Sosa’s direction of analysis thesis, endorsing the idea that primary justification is best understood as attaching to stable dispositions to act in certain ways, while secondary justification accrues to particular acts because of their sources in virtues. This approach, she argues, appropriately focuses epistemology on persons, their cognitive activities, and their membership in a community defined by social practices of enquiry. The individual knower is now recognized as part of a community, with all the moral and intellectual obligations that this entails. However, Code argues, redirecting epistemology in this way gives the notion of epistemic responsibility central importance. Characterizing Sosa’s position as a version of reliabilism, she argues that her own "responsibilism" constitutes a more adequate development of Sosa’s initial insights. This is because, in part, the notion of responsibility emphasizes the active nature of the knower, as well as the element of choice involved in the knower’s activity. Whereas a merely passive recorder of experience can be described as reliable, only an active, creative agent can be assessed as responsible or irresponsible, as having fulfilled her obligations to fellow enquirers, etc. According to Code, then, Sosa is correct to call for a focus on intellectual virtues in epistemology, with the focus on agency and community that this implies. But the natural way to develop this insight is to understand the intellectual virtues in terms of epistemic responsibility. Code goes so far as to say that epistemic responsibility is the central intellectual virtue, from which all other intellectual virtues radiate.

Another interesting feature of Code’s view concerns some theses about the prospects for epistemology. Placing emphasis on virtue and responsibility, she argues, has consequences for both how epistemology should be conducted and the kind of epistemological insights we should hope for. First, emphasizing the contextual and social dimensions of knowledge introduces complexity into theorizing, and in such a way that shows the usual examples and counter-examples in epistemology to be inadequate. Such examples under-describe the relevant epistemic circumstances, leaving out such relevant considerations as history, social role, conflicting obligations, etc. To show how such factors are indeed relevant, it is necessary to replace these thin examples with thickly descriptive narrative. Only stories that tie a whole life together provide an adequate context for epistemic evaluations, precisely because the factors that govern such evaluations are that rich and complex.

Moreover, Code argues, thick narratives are essential for understanding the very nature of intellectual virtue. Echoing a point by Alasdair MacIntyre, Code argues that an adequate understanding of what it is to be virtuous requires placing virtuous selves in the unity of a narrative. A consequence of this is that we should not expect to describe tidy conditions for justification and knowledge. The relevant criteria for epistemic evaluation are too varied and complex for that, and so any simple theory of knowledge will distort rather than adequately capture those criteria. This does not mean, however, that insight into the nature and conditions of justification and knowledge is impossible. Rather, such insight is to be gained by narrative history rather than theory construction of the traditional sort.

Responsibilism II

Following Sosa, Code tends to think of intellectual virtues as broad cognitive faculties or abilities pertaining to some subject matter. In this respect both authors are following Aristotle, who names intuition, science, wisdom and prudence as intellectual virtues. For example, for Aristotle intuition is the ability to know first principles, while science is the ability to deduce further truths from these. James Montmarquet has developed the notion of an intellectual virtue in a different direction, conceiving them on the model of Aristotle’s moral virtues. Rather than thinking of intellectual virtues as cognitive faculties or abilities, he conceives them as personality traits, such as impartiality and intellectual courage. In sum, intellectual virtues are personality traits that a person who desires the truth would want to have.

Like Code, Montmarquet criticizes Sosa’s position for not sufficiently exploiting the resources of virtue theory in ethics. Also like Code, he criticizes Sosa’s emphasis on the reliability of intellectual virtues, and wants to replace this with an emphasis on responsibility and other concepts related to agency. According to Montmarquet, it is a mistake to characterize the intellectual virtues as reliable in the sense of truth-conducive. This is because we can imagine possible worlds, such as Descartes’ demon world, where the beliefs of epistemically virtuous people are almost entirely false. Alternatively, we can imagine worlds where the intellectually lazy and careless have mostly true beliefs. Suppose we were to somehow discover that ours was such a world. Would we then revise our opinions about which traits count as intellectual virtues and which as vices? Montmarquet argues that we would not. Traits like intellectual courage and carefulness are virtues even if we are unfortunate enough to be the victims of a Cartesian deceiver, and traits like laziness and carelessness are vices even if, contrary to appearances, they turn out to be reliable. But then reliability cannot be a distinctive mark of the intellectual virtues.

A different approach is to characterize the virtues in terms of a desire for truth. According to Montmarquet, the central intellectual virtue is epistemic conscientiousness. To be conscientious in this sense is to be motivated to arrive at truth and to avoid error; it is to have an appropriate desire for the truth. Here there is a parallel with moral conscientiousness, where a morally conscientious person is someone who tries her best to do what is right. This notion of epistemic conscientiousness is closely related to that of epistemic responsibility, or perhaps identical with it. Hence with Code, Montmarquet makes epistemic responsibility rather than reliability central to his understanding of intellectual virtue.

According to Montmarquet, then, epistemic conscientiousness is the central intellectual virtue. However, intellectual virtue cannot be understood solely in terms of a desire for truth, since one’s desire for truth must be appropriately regulated. We must therefore countenance additional regulative virtues, which constitute ways of being conscientious. Montmarquet classifies these under three main categories. "Virtues of impartiality" include such personality traits as openness to the ideas of others, willingness to exchange ideas, and a lively sense of one’s own fallibility. "Virtues of intellectual sobriety" oppose the excitement and rashness of the overly enthusiastic. Finally, "virtues of intellectual courage" include a willingness to conceive and examine alternatives to popular ideas, perseverance in the face of opposition from others, and determination to see an inquiry through to the end.

Montmarquet suggests that we can use the above account of intellectual virtue to define an important sense of subjective justification. Specifically,

S is subjectively justified in believing p insofar as S is epistemically virtuous in believing p.
This is not the kind of justification that turns true belief into knowledge. This is because Gettier cases show that a person can be justified in believing something in this sense, but still lack the kind of objective relation to the truth required for knowledge. Nevertheless, Montmarquet argues, the above sense of justification is important regarding a different issue. Namely, Montmarquet is concerned with the problem of morally evaluating actions. More specifically, he is concerned with the problem of blaming persons for actions which, from their own point of view, are morally justified. Often enough, the morally outrageous actions of tyrants, racists and terrorists seem perfectly reasonable, even necessary, in the context of their distorted belief system. In order to find the actions blameworthy in such cases, it would seem that we have to find the beliefs blameworthy as well. In other words, we need some account of "doxastic responsibility," or the kind of responsibility for belief that can ground responsibility for actions. The above account of subjective justification, Montmarquet argues, provides what we are looking for. Precisely because it understands justification in terms of intellectually virtuous behavior, the account allows a plausible sense in which justified (and unjustified) belief is under a person’s control. This, in turn, makes the relevant beliefs to be appropriate objects of blame and praise.

One objection to this sort of view is that judgements of responsibility are inappropriate in the cognitive domain. The idea is that judgements of praise and blame presuppose voluntary control, and that we lack such control over our beliefs. Montmarquet responds to this objection by distinguishing between a weak and a strong sense of voluntary control. Roughly, a belief is voluntary in the weak sense if it is formed in circumstances which do not interfere with virtuous belief formation. This kind of voluntariness amounts to freedom from interference or coercion. A belief is voluntary in the strong sense (again roughly) if it is subject to one’s will. Montmarquet’s strategy is to concede that responsibility requires weak voluntary control, but to argue that we often have this kind of control over our beliefs. Second, he concedes that we do not typically have strong voluntary control over our beliefs, but argues that responsibility does not require it.

The analogy with action is instructive. One can be appropriately blamed for negligent actions and inadvertent actions, and even in cases where there is no actual choice regarding the action in question. In cases of action as well as belief, strong voluntary control is not necessary for responsibility. On the other hand, praise or blame would be inappropriate in cases where action is coerced. However, many of our beliefs satisfy the relevant "no coercion condition," and so are weakly voluntary in that sense.

A Mixed Theory

Greco has argued that intellectual virtue is closely tied to epistemic responsibility, but without rejecting Sosa’s position that the virtues are reliable, or truth-conducive. The main idea is that an adequate account of knowledge ought to contain both a responsibility condition and a reliability condition. Moreover, a virtue account can explain how the two are tied together. In cases of knowledge, objective reliability is grounded in epistemically responsible action.

The way this works is as follows. First, we can give an account of subjective justification in terms of epistemic responsibility:

S is subjectively justified in believing p if and only if S’s believing p is epistemically responsible.
The notion of responsibility, in turn, can be understood in terms of the dispositions S manifests when S is thinking conscientiously, or is motivated to believe the truth. Such motivation need not be self-conscious, or even univocal. Rather, it is meant to specify the kind of default position that people are usually in, and to oppose this to the alternative motivations involved in such things as wishful thinking, pig-headedness and attention grabbing. This suggests the following account of subjective justification.
S is subjectively justified in believing p if and only if S’s believing p results from the dispositions that S manifests when S is motivated to believe the truth.
Finally, this kind of subjective justification gives rise to objective reliability when things go well:
S knows p only in cases where (a) S is subjectively justified in believing p, and (b) as a result of this S is objectively reliable in believing p.
One feature of the above account is that it understands both justified belief and knowledge in terms of the dispositions that make up S’s cognitive character. In other words, it makes the notion of virtuous character primary, and then gives accounts of justified belief and knowledge in terms of this. Accordingly, we can define virtuous character in terms of proper motivation and reliability as these notions are understood above, and then given the following (partial) account of knowledge.
S knows p only in cases where S’s believing p results from a virtuous cognitive character.

A Social/Genetic Approach

Jonathan Kvanvig has argued for a more radical departure from traditional epistemological concerns. According to Kvanvig, traditional epistemology is dominated by an "individualistic" and "synchronic" conception of knowledge. Accordingly, one of the most important tasks from the traditional perspective is to specify the conditions under which an individual S knows a proposition p at a particular time t. Kvanvig argues that this perspective should be abandoned in favor of a new social/genetic approach. Whereas the traditional perspective focuses on questions about justified belief and knowledge of individuals at particular times, a new genetic epistemology would focus on the cognitive life of the mind as it develops within a social context. From the new perspective, questions concerning individuals are replaced with questions concerning the group, and questions concerning knowledge at a particular time are abandoned for questions about cognitive development and learning. Kvanvig argues that there are at least two ways in which the virtues would be central within the new perspective. First, the virtues are essential to understanding the cognitive life of the mind, particularly the development and learning which takes place over time through mimicking and imitation of virtuous agents. Second, in a social/genetic approach the virtues would play a central role in the characterization of cognitive ideals. For example, what makes a certain structuring of information superior, Kvanvig argues, is that it is the kind of structuring that a person of intellectual virtue would come to possess in the appropriate circumstances.

A Neo-Aristotelian Theory

We have seen that both Code and Montmarquet argue for a closer affinity between virtue epistemology and Aristotle’s theory of the moral virtues. For example, Montmarquet thinks of the intellectual virtues as epistemically relevant personality traits, and both authors emphasize the close connection between virtue, agency and responsibility. The most detailed and systematic presentation of a neo-Aristotelian view, however, is due to Linda Zagzebski. She argues for a unified account of the intellectual and moral virtues, modeled on Aristotle’s account of the moral virtues. Her view should be characterize as "neo-Aristotelian" rather than "Aristotelian," because Aristotle did not hold that the moral and intellectual virtues are unified in this way.

First, Zagzebski endorses the "direction of analysis thesis" characterized above. The distinctive feature of a virtue theory in ethics, she argues, is that it analyzes right action in terms of virtuous character, rather than the other way around.

"By a pure virtue theory I mean a theory that makes the concept of a right act derivative from the concept of a virtue or some inner state of a person that is a component of virtue. This is a point both about conceptual priority and about moral ontology. In a pure virtue theory the concept of a right act is defined in terms of the concept of a virtue or a component of virtue such as motivation. Furthermore, the property of rightness is something that emerges from the inner traits of persons." (Zagzebski 1996, p. 79)
An epistemology modeled on this kind of ethical theory, then, would analyze justification and other important normative properties of belief in terms of intellectual virtue. Moreover, Zagzebski argues, we can give a unified account of moral and intellectual virtue based on an Aristotelian model of the moral virtues. In fact, she argues, intellectual virtues are best understood as a subset of the moral virtues.

According to Aristotle, the moral virtues are acquired traits of character that involve both a motivational component and a reliable success component. For example, moral courage is the virtue according to which a person is characteristically motivated to risk danger when something of value is at stake, and is reliably successful at doing so. Likewise, we can understand benevolence as the virtue according to which a person is motivated to bring about the well-being of others, and is reliably successful at doing so. Intellectual virtues have an analogous structure, Zagzebski argues. Just as all moral virtues can be understood in terms of a general motivation for the good, all intellectual virtues may be understood in terms of a general motivation for knowledge and other kinds of high-quality cognitive contact with reality. Individual intellectual virtues can then be specified in terms of more specific motivations that are related to the general motivation for knowledge. For example, open-mindedness is the virtue according to which a person is motivated to be receptive to new ideas, and is reliably successful at achieving the end of this motivation. Intellectual courage is the virtue according to which a person is motivated to be perservering in her own ideas, and is reliably successful at doing this.

Understanding the intellectual virtues this way, we can go on to define a number of important deontic properties of belief. Each definition, Zagzebski argues, is parallel to a definition for an analogous deontic property of actions.

A justified belief is what a person who is motivated by intellectual virtue, and who has the understanding of his cognitive situation a virtuous person would have, might believe in like circumstances.

An unjustified belief is what a person who is motivated by intellectual virtue, and who has the understanding of his cognitive situation a virtuous person would have, would not believe in like circumstances.

A belief of epistemic duty is what a person who is motivated by intellectual virtue, and who has the understanding of his cognitive situation a virtuous person would have, would believe in like circumstances.

As with the moral virtues, it is possible for a conflict among the intellectual virtues to arise. Thus the intellectually courageous thing to do might conflict with the intellectually humble thing to do. This problem is solved by introducing the mediating virtue of phronesis, or practical wisdom. The practically wise person is able to weigh the demands of all the relevant virtues is a given situation, so as to direct her cognitive activity appropriately. Accordingly we get the following definitions of "all things considered" justification.
A justified belief, all things considered, is what a person with phronesis might believe in like circumstances.

An unjustified belief, all things considered, is what a person with phronesis would not believe in like circumstances.

A belief is a duty, all things considered, just in case it is what a person with phronesis would believe in like circumstances.

Finally, Zagzebski argues that we can give a definition of knowledge by first defining an "act of intellectual virtue".
An act of intellectual virtue A is an act that arises from the motivational component of A, is something a person with virtue A would (probably) do in the circumstances, is successful in achieving the end of the A motivation, and is such that the agent acquires a true belief (cognitive contact with reality) through these features of the act.
We may then define knowledge as follows:
Knowledge is a state of true belief (cognitive contact with reality) arising out of acts of intellectual virtue.
Since the truth condition is redundant, we may say alternatively:
Knowledge is a state of belief arising out of acts of intellectual virtue.

The Scope of Virtue Epistemology

We have seen that a number of authors endorse a turn to virtue theory in epistemology. Moreover, these same authors have variously invoked Aristotle, Aquinas, Reid, Dewey and Peirce as early adherents of a virtue approach. This gives rise to the question of the scope of virtue epistemology. In fact, there has been some controversy about this in the contemporary literature.

Kvanvig has argued that early versions of reliabilism, including those of David Armstrong, Alvin Goldman and Robert Nozick, are best understood as versions of virtue epistemology. Although these views make explicit reference to reliable processes and reliable methods, Kvanvig argues that they are most charitably understood as concerned with reliable cognitive character. As such, they are implicit versions of virtue epistemology. Sosa has made similar arguments regarding Alvin Plantinga’s view, and Greco has argued that any view that makes justification or knowledge a function of agent reliability thereby counts as a version of virtue epistemology.

Against this, Code and Zagzebski argue that reliabilist views fail to exploit the most valuable resources of virtue theory. Moreover, Plantinga has explicitly rejected the virtue label, arguing that the foundational concept for his view is proper function rather than intellectual virtue. These disputes are not merely semantic. Rather, they reflect disagreements over what is truly of value in virtue theory. Put another way, they are disputes about what aspects of virtue theory, if any, are doing valuable work in various accounts of justification, knowledge and other important epistemic notions.

However such disputes are resolved, we have seen that there is one way of characterizing virtue epistemology so that a broad range of views count as versions of the position. Specifically, we may understand virtue epistemology primarily as a thesis about the direction of analysis: that the normative properties of beliefs are to be defined in terms of the normative properties of agents, rather than the other way around. If we understand the position this way, then a broad range of views will count as versions of virtue epistemology. We may then understand further disputes among them as concerning the nature of the intellectual virtues. In other words, different versions of virtue epistemology disagree over what kind of agent character is essentially involved in justification, knowledge and other important epistemic notions.


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Related Entries

justification, epistemic: coherentist theories of | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of | skepticism

Copyright © 1999 by
John Greco

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First published: July 9, 1999
Content last modified: July 9, 1999