Common Knowledge (Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy/Winter 2001 Edition)
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Common Knowledge

A proposition A is mutual knowledge among a set of agents if each agent knows that A. Mutual knowledge by itself implies nothing about what, if any, knowledge anyone attributes to anyone else. Suppose each student arrives for a class meeting knowing that the instructor will be late. That the instructor will be late is mutual knowledge, but each student might think only she knows the instructor will be late. However, if one of the students says openly "Peter told me he will be late again," then each student knows that each student knows that the instructor will be late, each student knows that each student knows that each student knows that the instructor will be late, and so on, ad infinitum. The announcement made the mutually known fact common knowledge among the students.

Common knowledge is a phenomenon which underwrites much of social life. In order to communicate or otherwise coordinate their behavior successfully, individuals typically require mutual or common understandings or background knowledge. Indeed, if a particular interaction results in "failure", the usual explanation for this is that the agents involved did not have the common knowledge that would have resulted in success. If a married couple are separated in a department store, they stand a good chance of finding one another because their common knowledge of each others’ tastes and experiences leads them each to look for the other in a part of the store both know that both would tend to frequent. Since the spouses both love cappuccino, each expects the other to go to the coffee bar, and they find one another. But in a less happy case, if a pedestrian causes a minor traffic jam by crossing against a red light, she explains her mistake as the result of her not noticing, and therefore not knowing, the status of the traffic signal that all the motorists knew. The spouses coordinate successfully given their common knowledge, while the pedestrian and the motorists miscoordinate as the result of a breakdown in common knowledge.

Given the importance of common knowledge in social interactions, it is remarkable that only quite recently have philosophers and social scientists attempted to analyze the concept. David Hume (1740) was perhaps the first to make explicit reference to the role of mutual knowledge in coordination. In his account of convention in A Treatise of Human Nature, Hume argued that a necessary condition for coordinated activity was that agents all know what behavior to expect from one another. Without the requisite mutual knowledge, Hume maintained, mutually beneficial social conventions would disappear. Much later, J. E. Littlewood (1953) presented some examples of common-knowledge-type reasoning, and Thomas Schelling (1960) and John Harsanyi (1967-1968) argued that something like common knowledge is needed to explain certain inferences people make about each other. Yet it was David Lewis (1969) who first gave an explicit analysis of common knowledge in the monograph Convention. Stephen Schiffer (1972) and Robert Aumann independently gave alternate definitions of common knowledge which are in some contexts more convenient to use than Lewis’ definition. The analysis of common knowledge as a hierarchy of epistemic claims that Lewis, Schiffer and Aumann all develop has become standard in the philosophical and social science literature. More recently, Margaret Gilbert (1989) proposed a somewhat different account of common knowledge which she argues is preferable to the standard account. Others have developed accounts of mutual knowledge, approximate common knowledge, and common belief which require less stringent assumptions than the standard account, and which serve as more plausible models of what agents know in cases where strict common knowledge seems impossible (Brandenburger and Dekel 1987, Stinchcombe 1988, Monderer and Samet 1989, Rubinstein 1992). The analysis and applications of common knowledge and related multi-agent knowledge concepts has become a lively field of research.

The purpose of this essay is to overview of some of the most important results stemming from this contemporary research. The topics reviewed in each section of this essay are as follows: Section 1 gives motivating examples which illustrate a variety of ways in which the actions of agents depend crucially upon their having, or lacking, certain common knowledge. Section 2 discusses alternative analyses of common knowledge. Section 3 reviews applications of multi-agent knowledge concepts, particularly to game theory (von Neumann and Morgenstern 1944), in which common knowledge assumptions have been found to have great importance in justifying solution concepts for mathematical games. Section 4 discusses skeptical doubts about the attainability of common knowledge. Finally, Section 5 discusses the common belief concept which result from weakening the assumptions of Lewis’ account of common knowledge.

1. Motivating Examples

Most of the examples in this section are familiar in the common knowledge literature, although some of the details and interpretations presented here are new. Readers may want to ask themselves what, if any, distinctive aspects of mutual and common knowledge reasoning each example illustrates.

1.1. The Clumsy Waiter[1]

A waiter serving dinner slips, and spills gravy on a guest’s white silk evening gown. The guest glares at the waiter, and the waiter declares "I’m sorry. It was my fault." Why did the waiter say that he was at fault? He knew that he was at fault, and he knew from the guest’s angry expression that she knew he was at fault. However, the sorry waiter wanted assurance that the guest knew that he knew he was at fault. By saying openly that he was at fault, the waiter knew that the guest knew what he wanted her to know, namely, that he knew he was at fault. Note that the waiter’s declaration established at least three levels of nested knowledge.

Certain assumptions are implicit in the preceding story. In particular, the waiter must know that the guest knows he has spoken the truth, and that she can draw the desired conclusion from what he says in this context. More fundamentally, the waiter must know that if he announces "It was my fault" to the guest, she will interpret his intended meaning correctly and will infer what his making this announcement ordinarily implies in this context. This in turn implies that the guest must know that if the waiter announces "It was my fault" in this context, then the waiter indeed knows he is at fault. Then on account of his announcement, the waiter knows that the guest knows that he knows he was at fault. The waiter’s announcement was meant to generate higher-order levels of knowledge of a fact each already knew.

Just a slight strengthening of the stated assumptions results in even higher levels of nested knowledge. Suppose the waiter and the guest each know that the other can infer what he infers from the waiter’s announcement. Can the guest now believe that the waiter does not know that she knows that he knows he is at fault? If the guest considers this question, she reasons that if the waiter falsely believes it is possible that she does not know that he knows he is at fault, then the waiter must believe it to be possible that she cannot infer that he knows he is at fault from his own declaration. Since she knows she can infer that the waiter knows he is at fault from his declaration, she knows that the waiter knows she can infer this, as well. Hence the waiter’s announcement establishes the fourth-order knowledge claim: The guest knows that the waiter knows that she knows that he knows he is at fault. By similar, albeit lengthier, arguments, the agents can verify that corresponding knowledge claims of even higher-order must also obtain under these assumptions.

1.2 The Barbecue Problem

This is a variation of an example first published by Littlewood (1953), although he notes that his version of the example was already well-known at the time.[2] N individuals enjoy a picnic supper together which includes barbecued spareribs. At the end of the meal, k greater than or equal to 1 of these diners have barbecue sauce on their faces. No one wants to continue the evening with a messy face. No one wants to wipe her face if it’s not messy, for this would make her appear neurotic. And no one wants to take the risk of being thought rude by telling anyone else that he has barbecue sauce on his face. Since no one can see her own face, none of the messy diners makes a move to clean her face. Then the cook who served the spareribs returns with a carton of ice cream. Amused by what he sees, the cook rings the dinner bell and makes the following announcement: "At least one of you has barbecue sauce on her face. I will ring the dinner bell over and over, until anyone who is messy has wiped her face. Then I will serve dessert." For the first k minus 1 rings, no one does anything. Then, at the kth ring, each of the messy individuals suddenly reaches for a napkin, and soon afterwards, the diners are all enjoying their ice cream.

How did the messy diners finally realize that their faces needed cleaning? The k = 1 case is easy, since in this case, the lone messy individual will realize he is messy immediately, since he sees that everyone else is clean. Consider the k = 2 case next. At the first ring, messy individual i1 knows that one other person, i2, is messy, but does not yet know about himself. At the second ring, i1 realizes that he must be messy, since had i2 been the only messy one, i2 would have known this after the first ring when the cook made his announcement, and would have cleaned her face then. By a symmetric argument, messy diner i2 also concludes that she is messy at the second ring, and both pick up a napkin at that time.

Let’s next consider k = 3. Again at the first ring, each of the messy diners i1, i2, and i3 knows the status of the other diners, but not her own. The situation is apparently unchanged after the second ring. But on the third ring, i1 realizes that she is messy. For if i2 and i3 were the only messy ones, then they would have discovered this after the second ring by the argument of the previous paragraph. Since i1 can see that all of the diners other than i2 and i3 are clean, she concludes that she must be messy. i2 and i3 draw similar conclusions at the third ring, and all clean their faces at that time.

The general case follows by induction. Suppose that if k = j, then each of the j messy diners can determine that he is messy after j rings. Then if k = j + 1, then at the j + 1st ring, each of the j + 1 individuals will realize that he is messy. For if he were not messy, then the other j messy ones would have all realized their messiness at the jth ring and cleaned themselves then. Since no one cleaned herself after the jth ring, at the j + 1st ring each messy person will conclude that someone besides the other j messy people must also be messy, namely, himself.

The "paradox" of this argument is that for k > 1, like the case of the clumsy waiter of Example 1.1, the cook’s announcement told the diners something that each already knew. Yet apparently the cook’s announcement also gave the diners useful information. How could this be? By announcing a fact already known to every diner, the cook made this fact common knowledge among them, enabling each of them to eventually deduce the condition of his own face after sufficiently many rings of the bell. Note that the inductive argument the agents run through depends upon the conclusions they each draw from several counterfactual conditionals. In general, the consequences of agents’ common knowledge are intimately related to how they evaluate subjunctive and counterfactual conditionals.[3]

1.3 The Farmer’s Dilemma

Does meeting one’s obligations to others serve one’s self-interest? Plato and his successors recognized that in certain cases, the answer seems to be "No." Hobbes (1651, pp. 101-102) considers the challenge of a "Foole", who claims that it is irrational to honor an agreement made with another who has already fulfilled his part of the agreement. Noting that in this situation one has gained all the benefit of the other’s compliance, the Foole contends that it would now be best for him to break the agreement, thereby saving himself the costs of compliance. Of course, if the Foole’s analysis of the situation is correct, then would the other party to the agreement not anticipate the Foole’s response to agreements honored, and act accordingly?

Hume (1740, pp. 520-521) takes up this question, using an example: Two neighboring farmers each expect a bumper crop of corn. Each will require his neighbor’s help in harvesting his corn when it ripens, or else a substantial portion will rot in the field. Since their corn will ripen at different times, the two farmers can ensure full harvests for themselves by helping each other when their crops ripen, and both know this. Yet the farmers do not help each other. For the farmer whose corn ripens later reasons that if she were to help the other farmer, then when her corn ripens he would be in the position of Hobbes’ Foole, having already benefited from her help. He would no longer have anything to gain from her, so he would not help her, sparing himself the hard labor of a second harvest. Since she cannot expect the other farmer to return her aid when the time comes, she will not help when his corn ripens first, and of course the other farmer does not help her when her corn ripens later.

The structure of Hume’s Farmers’ Dilemma problem can be summarized using the following tree diagram:

Figure 1.1a
Figure 1.1a
This tree is an example of a game in extensive form. At each stage i, the agent who moves can either choose Ci, which corresponds to helping or cooperating, or Di, which corresponds to not helping or defecting. The relative preferences of the two agents over the various outcomes are reflected by the ordered pairs of payoffs each receives at any particular outcome. If, for instance, Fiona chooses Ci and Alan chooses Di, then Fiona’s payoff is 0, her worst payoff, and Alan’s is 4, his best payoff. In a game such as the Figure 1.1.a game, agents are (Bayesian) rational if each chooses an act that maximizes her expected payoff, given what she knows.

In the Farmers’ Dilemma game, following the C1,C2-path is strictly better for both farmers than following the D1,D2-path. However, Fiona chooses D1, as the result of the following simple argument: "If I were to choose C1, then Alan, who is rational and who knows the payoff structure of the game, would choose D2. I am also rational and know the payoff structure of the game. So I should choose D1." Since Fiona knows that Alan is rational and knows the game’s payoffs, she concludes that she need only analyze the reduced game in the following figure:

Figure 1.1b
Figure 1.1b

In this reduced game, Fiona is certain to gain a strictly higher payoff by choosing D1 than if she chooses C1, so D1 is her unique best choice. Of course, when Fiona chooses D1, Alan, being rational, responds by choosing D2. If Fiona and Alan know: (i) that they are both rational, (ii) that they both know the payoff structure of the game, and (iii) that they both know (i) and (ii), then they both can predict what the other will do at every node of the Figure 1.1.a game, and conclude that they can rule out the D1,C2-branch of the Figure 1.1.b game and analyze just the reduced game of the following figure:

Figure 1.1c
Figure 1.1c

On account of this mutual knowledge, both know that Fiona will choose D1, and that Alan will respond with D2. Hence, the D1,D2-outcome results if the Farmers’ Dilemma game is played by agents having this mutual knowledge, though it is suboptimal since both agents would fare better at the C1,C2-branch.[4] This argument, which in its essentials is Hume’s argument, is an example of a standard technique for solving sequential games known as backwards induction.[5] The basic idea behind backwards induction is that the agents engaged in a sequential game deduce how each will act throughout the entire game by ruling out the acts that are not payoff-maximizing for the agents who would move last, then ruling out the acts that are not payoff-maximizing for the agents who would move next-to-last, and so on. Clearly, backwards induction arguments rely crucially upon what, if any, mutual knowledge the agents have regarding their situation, and they typically require the agents to evaluate the truth values of certain subjunctive conditionals, such as "If I (Fiona) were to choose C1, then Alan would choose D2".

1.4 The Centipede

The mutual knowledge assumptions required to construct a backwards induction solution to a game become more complex as the number of stages in the game increases. To see this, consider the sequential Centipede game depicted in the following figure:

Figure 1.2
Figure 1.2
At each stage i, the agent who moves can either choose Ri, which in the first three stages gives the other agent an opportunity to move, or Li, which ends the game.

Like the Farmers’ Dilemma, this game is a commitment problem for the agents. If each agent could trust the other to choose Ri at each stage, then they would each expect to receive a payoff of 3. However, Alan chooses L1, leaving each with a payoff of only 1, as the result of the following backwards induction argument: "If node n4 were to be reached, then Fiona, (being rational) would choose L4. I, knowing this, would (being rational) choose L3 if node n3 were to be reached. Fiona, knowing this, would (being rational) choose L2 if node n2 were to be reached. Hence, I (being rational) should choose L1." To carry out this backwards induction argument, Alan implicitly assumes that: (i) he knows that Fiona knows he is rational, and (ii) he knows that Fiona knows that he knows she is rational. Put another way, for Alan to carry out the backwards induction argument, at node n1 he must know what Fiona must know at node n2 to make L2 her best response should n2 be reached. While in the Farmer’s Dilemma Fiona needed only first-order knowledge of Alan’s rationality and second-order knowledge of Alan’s knowledge of the game to derive the backwards induction solution, in the Figure 1.2 game, for Alan to be able to derive the backwards induction solution, the agents must have third-order mutual knowledge of the game and second-order mutual knowledge of rationality, and Alan must have fourth-order knowledge of this mutual knowledge of the game and third-order knowledge of their mutual knowledge of rationality. This argument also involves several counterfactuals, since to construct it the agents must be able to evaluate conditionals of the form, "If node ni were to be reached, Alan (Fiona) would choose Li (Ri)", which for i > 1 are counterfactual, since third-order mutual knowledge of rationality implies that nodes n2, n3, and n4 are never reached.

The method of backwards induction can be applied to any sequential game of perfect information, in which the agents can observe each others’ moves in turn and can recall the entire history of play. However, as the number of potential stages of play increases, the backwards induction argument evidently becomes harder to construct. This raises certain questions: (1) What precisely are the mutual or common knowledge assumptions that are required to justify the backwards induction argument for a particular sequential game? (2) As a sequential game increases in complexity, would we expect the mutual knowledge that is required for backwards induction to start to fail?

1.5 The Department Store

When a man loses his wife in a department store without any prior understanding on where to meet if they get separated, the chances are good that they will find each other. It is likely that each will think of some obvious place to meet, so obvious that each will be sure that it is "obvious" to both of them. One does not simply predict where the other will go, which is wherever the first predicts the second to predict the first to go, and so ad infinitum. Not "What would I do if I were she?" but "What would I do if I were she wondering what she would do if she were wondering what I would do if I were she . . . ?"

Thomas Schelling, The Strategy of Conflict

Schelling’s department store problem is an example of a pure coordination problem, that is, an interaction problem in which the interests of the agents coincide perfectly. Schelling (1960) and Lewis (1969), who were the first to make explicit the role common knowledge plays in social coordination, were also among the first to argue that coordination problems can be modeled using the analytic vocabulary of game theory. A very simple example of such a coordination problem is given in the next figure:

Figure 1.3
Figure 1.3

The matrix of Figure 1.3 is an example of a game in strategic form. At each outcome of the game, which corresponds to a cell in the matrix, the row (column) agent receives as payoff the first (second) element of the ordered pair in the corresponding cell. However, in strategic form games, each agent chooses without first being able to observe the choices of any other agent, so that all must choose as if they were choosing simultaneously. The Figure 1.3 game is a game of pure coordination (Lewis 1969), that is, a game in which at each outcome, each agent receives exactly the same payoff. One interpretation of this game is that Schelling’s spouses, Liz and Robert, are searching for each other in the department store with four floors, and they find each other if they go to the same floor. Four outcomes at which the spouses coordinate correspond to the strategy profiles (sjsj), 1 less than or equal to j less than or equal to 4, of the Figure 1.3 game. These four profiles are strict Nash equilibria (Nash 1950, 1951) of the game, that is, each agent has a decisive reason to follow her end of one of these strategy profiles provided that the other also follows this profile.[6]

The difficulty the agents face is trying to select an equilibrium to follow. For suppose that Robert hopes to coordinate with Liz on a particular equilibrium of the game, say (s2s2). Robert reasons as follows: "Since there are several strict equilibria we might follow, I should follow my end of (s2s2) if, and only if, I have sufficiently high expectations that Liz will follow her end of (s2s2). But I can only have sufficiently high expectations that Liz will follow (s2s2 ) if she has sufficiently high expectations that I will follow (s2s2). For her to have such expectations, Liz must have sufficiently high (second-order) expectations that I have sufficiently high expectations that she will follow (s2s2), for if Liz doesn’t have these (second-order) expectations, then she will believe I don’t have sufficient reason to follow (s2s2) and may therefore deviate from (s2, s2) herself. So I need to have sufficiently high (third-order) expectations that Liz has sufficiently high (second-order) expectations that I have sufficiently high expectations that she will follow (s2s2 ). But this implies that Liz must have sufficiently high (fourth-order) expectations that I have sufficiently high (third-order) expectations that Liz has sufficiently high (second-order) expectations that I have sufficiently high expectations that she will follow (s2s2), for if she doesn’t, then she will believe I don’t have sufficient reason to follow (s2s2), and then she won’t, either. Which involves me in fifth-order expectations regarding Liz, which involves her in sixth-order expectations regarding me, and so on." What would suffice for Robert, and Liz, to have decisive reason to follow (s2s2) is that they each know that the other knows that . . . that the other will follow (s2, s2) for any number of levels of knowledge, which is to say that between Liz and Robert it is common knowledge that they will follow (s2, s2). If agents follow a strict equilibrium in a pure coordination game as a consequence of their having common knowledge of the game, their rationality and their intentions to follow this equilibrium, and no other, then the agents are said to be following a Lewis-convention (Lewis 1969).

Lewis’ theory of convention applies to a more general class of games than pure coordination games, but pure coordination games already model a variety of important social interactions. In particular, Lewis models conventions of language as equilibrium points of a pure coordination game. The role common knowledge plays in games of pure coordination sketched above of course raises further questions: (1) Can people ever attain the common knowledge which characterizes a Lewis-convention? (2) Would less stringent epistemic assumptions suffice to justify Nash equilibrium behavior in a coordination problem?

2. Alternative Accounts of Common Knowledge

2.1 The Hierarchical Account

Monderer and Samet (1988) and Binmore and Brandenburger (1989) give a particularly elegant set-theoretic definition of common knowledge.[7] I will review this definition here, and then show that it is logically equivalent to the ‘i knows that j knows that … k knows that A’ hierarchy that is Schiffer’s (1972) definition of common knowledge.[8] Schiffer’s hierarchical account has become the most widely accepted analysis of common knowledge.

Some preliminary notions must be stated first. Following C. I. Lewis (1943-1944) and Carnap (1947), propositions are formally subsets of a set Omega of state descriptions or possible worlds. One can think of the elements of Omega as representing Leibniz’s possible worlds or Wittgenstein’s possible states of affairs. Some results in the common knowledge literature presuppose that Omega is of finite cardinality. If this admittedly unrealistic assumption is needed in any context, this will be explicitly stated in this essay, and otherwise one may assume that Omega may be either a finite or an infinite set. A distinguished actual world omega is an element of Omega. A proposition A subset Omega obtains (or is true) if the actual world omega in A. In general, we say that A obtains at a world omega in Omega if omega in A. What an agent i knows about the possible worlds is stated formally in terms of a knowledge operator Ki. Given a proposition A subset Omega, Ki(A) denotes a new proposition, corresponding to the set of possible worlds at which agent i knows that A obtains. Ki(A) is read as ‘i knows (that) A (is the case)’. The knowledge operator Ki satisfies certain axioms, including:

K1:   Ki(A) subset A

K2:   Omega subset Ki(Omega)

K3:   Ki(intersectionk Ak)   =   intersectionk Ki(Ak)

K4:   Ki(A) subset KiKi(A)[9]

In words, K1 says that if i knows A, then A must be the case. K2 says that i knows that some possible world in Omega occurs no matter which possible world omega occurs. K3 says that i knows a conjunction if, and only if, i knows each conjunct. K4 is a reflection axiom, which says that if i knows A, then i knows that she knows A. Note that by K3, if A subset B then Ki(A) subset Ki(B), by K1 and K2, Ki(Omega) = Omega, and by K1 and K4, Ki(A) = KiKi(A). Any system of knowledge satisfying K1 - K4 corresponds to the modal system S4 (Kripke 1963). If one drops the K1 axiom and retains the others, the resulting system would give a formal account of what an agent believes, but does not necessarily know.

A useful notion in the formal analysis of knowledge is that of a possibility set. An agent i’s possibility set at a state of the world Omega is the smallest set of possible worlds that i thinks could be the case if omega is the actual world. More precisely,

Definition 2.1
Agent i’s possibility set calligraphic-Hi(omega) at omega in Omega is defined as
calligraphic-Hi(omega) equivalent to intersection{ E | omega in Ki(E) }
The collection of sets
calligraphic-Hi   =   unionomegainOmega calligraphic-Hi(omega)
is i’s private information system.

Since in words, calligraphic-Hi(omega) is the intersection of all propositions which i knows at omega, calligraphic-Hi(omega) is the smallest proposition in Omega that i knows at omega. Put another way, calligraphic-Hi(omega) is the most specific information that i has about the possible world omega. The intuition behind assigning agents private information systems is that while an agent i may not be able to perceive or comprehend every last detail of the world in which i lives, i does know certain facts about that world. The elements of i’s information system represent what i knows immediately at a possible world. We also have the following:

Proposition 2.2
Ki(A) = { omega | calligraphic-Hi(omega) subset A }

In many formal analyses of knowledge in the literature, possibility sets are taken as primitive and Proposition 2.2 is given as the definition of knowledge. If one adopts this viewpoint, then the axioms K1 - K4 follow as consequences of the definition of knowledge. In many applications, the agents’ possibility sets are assumed to partition[10] the set, in which case calligraphic-Hi is called i’s private information partition.

To illustrate the idea of possibility sets, let us return to the Barbecue Problem described in Example 1.2. Suppose there are three diners: Cathy, Jennifer and Mark. Then there are 8 relevant states of the world, summarized by Table 2.1:

Table 2.1
      Table 2.1

Each diner knows the condition of the other diners’ faces, but not her own. Suppose the cook makes no announcement, after all. Then none of the diners knows the true state of the world whatever omega in Omega the actual world turns out to be, but they do know a priori that certain propositions are true at various states of the world. For instance, Cathy’s information system before any announcement is made is depicted in Figure 2.1a:

Figure 2.1a

In this case, Cathy’s information system is a partition calligraphic-H1 of Omega defined by

calligraphic-H1 = {HCC, HCM, HMC, HMM}


HCC = {omega1, omega2} (i.e., Jennifer and Mark are both clean)

HCM = {omega4, omega6} (i.e., Jennifer is clean and Mark is messy)

HMC = {omega3, omega5} (i.e., Jennifer is messy and Mark is clean)

HMM = {omega7, omega8} (i.e., Jennifer and Mark are both messy)

Cathy knows immediately which cell calligraphic-H1(omega) in her partition is the case at any state of the world, but does not know which is the true state at any omega in Omega.

If we add in the assumption stated in Example 1.2 that if there is at least one messy diner, then the cook announces the fact, then Cathy’s information partition is depicted by Figure 2.1b:

Figure 2.1b

In this case, Cathy’s information system is a partition calligraphic-H1 of Omega defined by

calligraphic-H1 = {HCCC, HMCC, HCM, HMC, HMM}


HCCC = {omega1} (i.e., Jennifer, Mark, and I are all clean)
HMCC = {omega2} (i.e., Jennifer and Mark are clean and I am messy)
HCM = {omega4,omega6} (i.e., Jennifer is clean and Mark is messy)
HMC = {omega3,omega5} (i.e., Jennifer is messy and Mark is clean)
HMM = {omega7,omega8} (i.e., Jennifer and Mark are both messy)

In this case, Cathy’s information partition is a refinement of the partition she has when there is no announcement, for in this case, then Cathy knows a priori that if omega1 is the case there will be no announcement and will know immediately that she is clean, and Cathy knows a priori that if omega2 is the case, then she will know immediately from the cook’s announcement that she is messy.

A slightly more complex case occurs if we alter the Barbecue problem so that the cook makes an announcement only if he sees at least two messy diners. Cathy’s possibility set is now depicted by the diagram in Figure 2.1c:

Figure 2.1c

This time, Cathy’s information system does not partition Omega. For Cathy knows a priori that at omega5, the cook will make his announcement, and since at omega5 Jennifer is messy and Mark is clean, Cathy will realize immediately that she is messy. However, Cathy also knows a priori that at omega3, either omega3 or omega5 could be the case, since at omega3 she does not know in advance whether or not the cook will make an announcement. Hence calligraphic-H1(omega5) = {omega5}, but calligraphic-H1(omega3) = {omega3, omega5}. Similarly, calligraphic-H1(omega6) = {omega6}, but calligraphic-H1(omega4) = {omega4, omega6}. Jennifer’s and Mark’s information systems given any of the above three scenarios are derived similarly to Cathy’s information system, and the details of this are left as an exercise for the reader.

We can now define mutual and common knowledge as follows:

Definition 2.3
Let a set Omega of possible worlds together with a set of agents N be given.

1. The proposition that A is (first level or first order) mutual knowledge for the agents of N, K1N(A), is the set defined by

K1N(A) equivalent to intersectioniinN Ki(A).

2. The proposition that A is mth level (or mth order) mutual knowledge among the agents of N, KmN(A), is defined recursively as the set

KmN(A) equivalent to intersectioniinN Ki(Kmminus1N(A)).

3. The proposition that A is common knowledge among the agents of N, K*N(A), is defined as the set

K*N(A) equivalent to infinity

As a consequence of Proposition 2.2, the agents’ private information systems determine an a priori structure of propositions over the space of possible worlds regarding what they can know, including what mutual and common knowledge they potentially have. The world omega in Omega which obtains determines a posteriori what individual, mutual and common knowledge agents in fact have. Hence, one can read omega in Ki(A) as ‘i knows A at (possible world) omega’, omega in KmN(A) as ‘A is mth level mutual knowledge for the agents of N at omega’, and so on. If omega obtains, then one can conclude that i does know A, that A is mth level mutual knowledge, and so on. Common knowledge of a proposition E implies common knowledge of all that E implies, as is shown in the following:

Proposition 2.4
If omega in K*N(E) and E subset F, then omega in K*N(F).


Note that (KmN(E))mgreater than or equal to1 is a decreasing sequence of events, in the sense that Km+1N(E) subset KmN(E), for all m greater than or equal to 1. It is also easy to check that if everyone knows E, then E must be true, that is, K1N(E) subset E. If Omega is assumed to be finite, then if E is common knowledge at omega, this implies that there must be a finite m such that

KmN(E) = infinity

The following result relates the set-theoretic definition of common knowledge to the hierarchy of ‘i knows that j knows that … knows A’ statements.

Proposition 2.5
omega in KmN(A) iff
(1) For all agents i1, i2, … , im in N, omega in Ki1Ki2Kim(A)
Hence, omega in K*N(A) iff (1) is the case for each m greater than or equal to 1.


The condition that omega in Ki1Ki2Kim(A) for all m greater than or equal to 1 and all i1, i2, … , im in N is Schiffer’s definition of common knowledge, and is often used as the definition of common knowledge in the literature.

2.2 Lewis’ Account

Lewis is credited with the idea of characterizing common knowledge as a hierarchy of ‘i knows that j knows that … knows that A’ propositions. However, it is far less well recognized that in Convention, Lewis also shows how this hierarchy is generated from a finite set of assumptions regarding the agents’ knowledge. These assumptions taken together constitute Lewis’ official definition of common knowledge.[11] A mathematically precise account of Lewis’ analysis of common knowledge is given here, and it is shown that Lewis’ analysis does result in the common knowledge hierarchy following from a finite set of axioms.

Lewis presents his account of common knowledge on pp. 52-57 of Convention. Lewis does not specify what account of knowledge is needed for common knowledge. As it turns out, Lewis’ account is satisfactory for any formal account of knowledge in which the knowledge operators Ki, i in N, satisfy K1, K2, and K3. A crucial assumption in Lewis’ analysis of common knowledge is that agents know they share the same "rationality, inductive standards and background information" (Lewis 1969, p. 53) with respect to a state of affairs Aprime, that is, if an agent can draw any conclusion from Aprime, she knows that all can do likewise. This idea is made precise in the following:

Definition 2.6
Given a set of agents N and a proposition Aprime subset Omega, the agents of N are symmetric reasoners with respect to Aprime (or Aprime-symmetric reasoners) iff, for each i, j in N and for any proposition E subset Omega, if Ki(Aprime) subset Ki(E) and Ki(Aprime) subset KiKj(Aprime), then Ki(Aprime) subset KiKj(E).[12]

The definiens says that for each agent i, if i can infer from Aprime that E is the case and that everyone knows that Aprime is the case, then i can also infer that everyone knows that E is the case.

Definition 2.7
A proposition E is Lewis-common knowledge at omega in Omega among the agents of a set N = {1, … , n} iff there is a proposition A* such that omega in A*, the agents of N are A*-symmetric reasoners, and for every i in N,
L1:   omega in Ki(A*)

L2:   Ki(A*) subset Ki(intersectionjinN Kj(A*))

L3:   Ki(A*) subset Ki(E)

A* is a basis for the agents’ common knowledge. L*N (E) denotes the proposition defined by L1 - L3 for a set N of A*-symmetric reasoners, so we can say that E is Lewis-common knowledge for the agents of N iff omega in L*N(E).

In words, L1 says that i knows A* at omega. L2 says that if i knows that A* obtains, then i knows that everyone knows that A* obtains. This axiom is meant to capture the idea that common knowledge is based upon a proposition A* that is publicly known, as is the case when agents hear a public announcement. If the agents’ knowledge is represented by partitions, then a typical basis for the agents’ common knowledge would be an element calligraphic-M(omega) in the meet[13] of their partitions. L3 says that i can infer from A* that E.

A human agent obviously cannot work her way mentally through an infinite mutual knowledge hierarchy. Lewis argues that this is not a problem for his analysis of common knowledge, since the mutual knowledge claims of a common knowledge hierarchy for a chain of logical consequences, not a series of steps in anyone’s actual reasoning. Lewis uses an example to show how his definition of common knowledge generates the first few levels of mutual knowledge. In fact, Lewis’ definition implies the entire common knowledge hierarchy, as is shown in the following result.

Proposition 2.8
L*N(E) subset K*N (E), that is, Lewis-common knowledge of E implies common knowledge of E.


2.3 Aumann’s Account

Aumann (1976) gives a different characterization of common knowledge which gives another simple algorithm for determining what information is commonly known. Aumann’s original account assumes that the each agent’s possibility set forms a private information partition of the space Omega of possible worlds. Aumann shows that a proposition C is common knowledge if, and only if, C contains a cell of the meet of the agents’ partitions. One way to compute the meet calligraphic-M of the partitions calligraphic-Hi, i in N is to use the idea of "reachability".

Definition 2.9
A state omegaprime in Omega is reachable from omega in Omega iff there exists a sequence omega=omega0, omega1, omega2, … , omegam=omegaprime such that for each k in {0,1, … , m1}, there exists an agent ik in N such that calligraphic-Hik(omegak) = calligraphic-Hik(omegak+1).

In words, omegaprime is reachable from omega if there exists a sequence or "chain" of states from omega to omegaprime such that two consecutive states are in the same cell of some agent’s information partition. To illustrate the idea of reachability, let us return to the modified Barbecue Problem in which Cathy, Jennifer and Mark receive no announcement. Their information partitions are all depicted in Figure 2.1d:

Figure 2.1d

One can understand the importance of the notion of reachability in the following way: If omegaprime is reachable from omega, then if omega obtains then some agent can reason that some other agent thinks that omegaprime is possible. Looking at Figure 2.1d, if omega = omega1 occurs, then Cathy (who knows only that {omega1, omega2} has occurred) knows that Jennifer thinks that omega5 might have occurred (even though Cathy knows that omega5 did not occur). So Cathy cannot rule out the possibility that Jennifer thinks that Mark thinks that that omega8 might have occurred. And Cathy cannot rule out the possibility that Jennifer thinks that Mark thinks that Cathy believes that omega7 is possible. In this sense, omega7 is reachable from omega1. The chain of states which establishes this is omega1, omega 2, omega5, omega8, omega7, since calligraphic-H1(omega1) = calligraphic-H1(omega2), calligraphic-H2(omega2) = calligraphic-H2(omega5), calligraphic-H3(omega5) = calligraphic-H3(omega8), and calligraphic-H1(omega8) = calligraphic-H1(omega7). Note that one can show similarly that in this example any state is reachable from any other state. This example also illustrates the following immediate result:

Proposition 2.10
omegaprime is reachable from omega iff there is a sequence i1, i 2, … , im in N such that
(1) omegaprime in calligraphic-Him( … (calligraphic-Hi2(calligraphic-Hi1(omega))))

One can read (1) as: ‘At omega, i1 thinks that i2 thinks that … , im thinks that omegaprime is possible.’

We now have:

Lemma 2.11
omegaprime in calligraphic-M(omega) iff omegaprime is reachable from omega.


Lemma 2.12.
calligraphic-M(omega) is common knowledge for the agents of N at omega.


Proposition 2.13 (Aumann 1976)
Let calligraphic-M be the meet of the agents’ partitions calligraphic-Hi for each i in N. A proposition E subset Omega is common knowledge for the agents of N at omega iff calligraphic-M(omega) subset E. (In Aumann (1976), E is defined to be common knowledge at omega iff calligraphic-M(omega) subset E.)


If E = K1N(E), then E is a public event (Milgrom 1981) or a common truism (Binmore and Brandenburger 1989). Clearly, a common truism is common knowledge whenever it occurs, since in this case E = K1N(E) = K2N(E) = … , so E = K*N(E). The proof of Proposition 2.13 shows that the common truisms are precisely the elements of calligraphic-M and unions of elements of calligraphic-M, so any commonly known event is the consequence of a common truism.

2.4 Gilbert’s Account

Gilbert (1989, Chapter 3) presents an alternative account of common knowledge, which is meant to be more intuitively plausible than Lewis’ and Aumann’s accounts. Gilbert gives a highly detailed description of the circumstances under which agents have common knowledge.

Definition 2.14
A set of agents N are in a common knowledge situation calligraphic-S(A) with respect to a proposition A if, and only if, omega in A and for each i in N,
G1: i is epistemically normal, in the sense that i has normal perceptual organs which are functioning normally and has normal reasoning capacity.[14]
G2: i has the concepts needed to fulfill the other conditions.
G3: i perceives the other agents of N.
G4: i perceives that G1 and G2 are the case.
G5: i perceives that the state of affairs described by A is the case.
G6: i perceives that all the agents of N perceive that A is the case.

Gilbert’s definition appears to contain some redundancy, since presumably an agent would not perceive A unless A is the case. Gilbert is evidently trying to give a more explicit account of single agent knowledge than Lewis and Aumann give. For Gilbert, agent i knows that a proposition E is the case if, and only if, omega in E, that is, E is true, and either i perceives that the state of affairs E describes obtains or i can infer E as a consequence of other propositions i knows, given sufficient inferential capacity.

Like Lewis, Gilbert recognizes that human agents do not in fact have unlimited inferential capacity. To generate the infinite hierarchy of mutual knowledge, Gilbert introduces the device of an agent’s smooth-reasoner counterpart. The smooth-reasoner counterpart iprime of an agent i is an agent that draws every logical conclusion from every fact that i knows. Gilbert stipulates that iprime does not have any of the constrains on time, memory, or reasoning ability that i might have, so iprime can literally think through the infinitely many levels of a common knowledge hierarchy.

Definition 2.15
If a set of agents N are in a common knowledge situation calligraphic-SN(A) with respect to A, then the corresponding set Nprime of their smooth-reasoner counterparts is in a parallel situation calligraphic-SprimeNprime(A) if, and only if, for each iprime in N,
G1prime: iprime can perceive anything that the counterpart i can perceive.
G2prime: G2 - G6 obtain for iprime with respect to A and Nprime, same as for the counterpart i with respect to A and N.
G3prime: iprime perceives that all the agents of Nprime are smooth-reasoners.

From this definition we get the following immediate consequence:

Proposition 2.16
If a set of smooth-reasoner counterparts to a set N of agents are in a situation calligraphic-SprimeNprime(A) parallel to a common knowledge situation calligraphic-SN(A) of N, then Consequently, KmNprime(A) for any m in the natural numbers.

Gilbert argues that, given calligraphic-SprimeNprime(A), the smooth-reasoner counterparts of the agents of N actually satisfy a much stronger condition, namely mutual knowledge KalphaNprime(A) to the level of any ordinal number alpha, finite or infinite. When this stronger condition is satisfied, the proposition A is said to be open* to the agents of N. With the concept of open*-ness, Gilbert gives her definition of common knowledge.

Definition 2.17
A proposition E subset Omega is Gilbert-common knowledge among the agents of a set N = {1, … ,n}, if and only if,
G1*: E is open* to the agents of N.
G2*: For every i in N, Ki(G1*).
GN*(E) denotes the proposition defined by G1* and G2* for a set N of A*-symmetric reasoners, so we can say that E is Lewis-common knowledge for the agents of N iff omega in GN*(E).

One might think that an immediate corollary to Gilbert’s definition is that Gilbert-common knowledge implies the hierarchical common knowledge of Proposition 2.5. However, this claim follows only on the assumption that an agent knows all of the propositions that her smooth-reasoner counterpart reasons through. Gilbert does not explicitly endorse this position, although she correctly observes that Lewis and Aumann are committed to something like it.[15] Gilbert maintains that her account of common knowledge expresses our intuitions with respect to common knowledge better than Lewis’ and Aumann’s accounts, since the notion of open*-ness presumably makes explicit that when a proposition is common knowledge, it is "out in the open", so to speak.

3. Applications of Mutual and Common Knowledge

Readers primarily interested in philosophical applications of common knowledge may want to focus on the No Disagreement Theorem and Convention subsections. Readers interested in applications of common knowledge in game theory may continue with the Strategic Form Games, and Games of Perfect Information subsections.

3.1 The "No Disagreement" Theorem

Aumann (1976) originally used his definition of common knowledge to prove a celebrated result that says that in a certain sense, agents cannot "agree to disagree" about their beliefs, formalized as probability distributions, if they start with common prior beliefs. Since agents in a community often hold different opinions and know they do so, one might attribute such differences to the agents’ having different private information. Aumann’s surprising result is that even if agents condition their beliefs on private information, mere common knowledge of their conditioned beliefs and a common prior probability distribution implies that their beliefs cannot be different, after all!

Proposition 3.1
Let Omega be a finite set of states of the world. Suppose that Then qi(E) = qj(E).

[Note that in the proof of this proposition, and in the sequel, (|B) denotes conditional probability; that is, given (B)>0, (A|B) = (AB)/(B).]

In a later article, Aumann (1987) argues that the assumptions that Omega is finite and that mu(omega) > 0 for each omega in Omega reflect the idea that agents only regard as "really" possible a finite collection of salient worlds to which they assign positive probability, so that one can drop the states with probability 0 from the description of the state space. Aumann also notes that this result implicitly assumes that the agents have common knowledge of their partitions, since a description of each possible world includes a description of the agents’ possibility sets. And of course, this result depends crucially upon (i), which is known as the common prior assumption (CPA).

Aumann’s "no disagreement" theorem has been generalized in a number of ways in the literature (McKelvey and Page 1986, Monderer and Samet 1989, Geanakoplos 1994). However, all of these "no disagreement" results raise the same philosophical puzzle raised by Aumann’s original result: How are we to explain differences in belief? Aumann’s result leaves us with two options: (1) admit that at some level, common knowledge of the agents’ beliefs or how they form their beliefs fails, or (2) deny the CPA. For instance, agents in the real world often do not express their opinions probabilistically. If one agent announces‘I believe that E is the case’ while another announces‘I doubt that E is the case’, then they might attribute their divergent opinions to a lack of common knowledge of each other’s true posteriors for E. Even if agents do assign precise posterior probabilities to an event, Aumann shows that if they have merely first-order mutual knowledge of the posteriors, they can "agree to disagree". Suppose the following all hold:

Omega = {omega1, omega2, omega3, omega4},
calligraphic-H1 = {{omega1,omega2}, {omega3,omega4}}
calligraphic-H2 = {{omega1,omega2,omega3}, {omega4}}
mu(omegai) = 1/4
Then if E = {omega1,omega4}, then at omega1, we have:
q1(E) = mu(E | {omega1,omega2}) = 1/2, and

q2(E) = mu(E | {omega1,omega2,omega3}) = 1/3

Moreover, at omega = omega1, Agent 1 knows that calligraphic-H2(omega) = {omega1,omega2,omega3}, so she knows that q2(E) = 1/3. Agent 2 knows at omega1 that either calligraphic-H1(omega) = {omega1,omega2} or calligraphic-H1(omega) = {omega3,omega4}, so either way he knows that q1(E) = 1/2. Hence the agents’ posteriors are mutually known, and yet they are unequal. The reason for this is that the posteriors are not common knowledge. For Agent 2 does not know what Agent 1 thinks q2(E) is, since if omega = omega3, which is consistent with what Agent 2 knows, then Agent 1 will believe that q2(E) = 1/3 with probability 1/2 (if omega = omega3) and q2(E) = 1 with probability 1/2 (if omega = omega4).

Aumann’s result could fail if the agents’ partitions are not common knowledge. For suppose in the example just given, the agents do not know each other’s partitions. Then at omega = omega1, if their posteriors are common knowledge, then Agent 1, who knows that omega in {omega1,omega2}, can explain Agent 2’s posterior as the result of Agent 2 having observed either {omega1,omega2,omega3}, {omega1,omega2,omega4}, {omega1,omega3,omega4} or {omega2,omega3,omega4}. Still another way Aumann’s result might fail is if agents do not have common knowledge that they update their beliefs by Bayesian conditionalization. Then clearly, agents can explain divergent opinions as the result of others having modified their beliefs in the "wrong" way. However, there are cases in which none of these explanations will seem convincing. For instance, odds makers sometimes publicly announce different probabilities for an event, such as a particular winner of a prize at a forthcoming Academy Awards presentation, and they will know that none of them have any private information regarding the event. In cases such as this, the agents have common knowledge that they all have the same information structure and common knowledge of their posteriors. And knowing that they are all competent odds makers, they have common knowledge that they update by Bayesian conditionalization. Still, the odds makers’ beliefs violate the conclusion of Aumann’s result. More generally, denying the requisite common knowledge seems a rather ad hoc move. For instance, to deny that agents have common knowledge of information structures is simply to deny that agents can all infer the same conclusions regarding possible worlds as Aumann defines them. To deny that agents have common knowledge that they update their beliefs by Bayesian conditionalization is to assert that some believe that some might be updating their beliefs incoherently, in the sense that their belief updating leaves them open to a Dutch book (Skyrms 1984). As just noted, these failures of agents’ beliefs in each others’ competence do not fail in all cases. Why should one think that such failures of common knowledge provide a general explanation for divergent beliefs?

What of the second option, that is, denying the CPA?[16] The main argument put forward in favor of the CPA is that any differences in agents’ probabilities should be the result of their having different information only, that is, there is no reason to think that the different beliefs that agents have regarding the same event are the result of anything other than their having different information. However, one can reply that this argument amounts simply to a restatement of the Harsanyi Doctrine.[17] And while defenders of the Harsanyi Doctrine may be right in thinking that there is apparently no compelling reason to think that agents’ priors can be different, neither is there compelling reason to think they must be the same! In any event, while the controversy over the Harsanyi Doctrine remains unresolved, we can conclude that the "no disagreement" results have interesting implications for the viability of common knowledge and the very nature of probability. Defenders of the CPA take an objectivist view of probability, and by virtue of the "no disagreement" results are evidently committed to the view that common knowledge of agents beliefs and how they are formed is a rare phenomenon in the world. Those who are prepared to deny the CPA allow for a genuinely subjectivist conception of probability. They take the view that common knowledge of agents’ beliefs and how they come by them can be a commonplace phenomenon, and that differences in opinion can stem from differences in (subjective) prior probabilities.

3.2 Convention

Schelling’s Department Store problem of Example 1.5 is a very simple example in which the agents "solve" their coordination problem appropriately by establishing a convention. Using the vocabulary of game theory, Lewis (1969) defines a convention as a strict coordination equilibrium of a game which agents follow on account of their common knowledge that they all prefer to follow this coordination equilibrium. A coordination equilibrium of a game is a strategy combination such that no agent is better off if any agent unilaterally deviates from this combination. As with equilibria in general, a coordination equilibrium is strict if any agent who deviates unilaterally from the equilibrium is strictly worse off. The strategic form game of Figure 1.3 summarizes Liz’s and Robert’s situation. The Department Store game has four Nash equilibrium outcomes in pure strategies: (s1, s1), (s2, s2), (s3, s3), and (s4, s4).[18] These four equilibria are all strict coordination equilibria. If the agents follow either of these equilibria, then they coordinate successfully. For agents to be following a Lewis-convention in this situation, they must follow one of the game’s coordination equilibria. However, for Lewis to follow a coordination equilibrium is not a sufficient condition for agents to be following a convention. For suppose that Liz and Robert fail to analyze their predicament properly at all, but Liz chooses s2 and Robert chooses s2, so that they coordinate at (s2, s2) by sheer luck. Lewis does not count accidental coordination of this sort as a convention.

Suppose next that both agents are Bayesian rational, and that part of what each agent knows is the payoff structure of the Intersection game. If the agents expect each other to follow (s2, s2) and they consequently coordinate successfully, are they then following a convention? Not necessarily, contends Lewis, in a subtle argument on p. 59 of Convention. For while each knows the game and that she is rational, she might not attribute like knowledge to the other agent. If each agent believes that the other agent will follow her end of the (s2, s2) equilibrium mindlessly, then her best response is to follow her end of (s2, s2). But in this case the agents coordinated as the result of their each falsely believing that the other acts like an automaton, and Lewis thinks that any proper account of convention must require that agents have correct beliefs about one another. In particular, Lewis requires that each agent involved in a convention must have mutual expectations that each is acting with the aim of coordinating with the other, that is, that each knows that:

A1: Both are rational,
A2: Both know the payoff structure of the game, and
A3: Both intend to follow (s2, s2), and not some other strategy combination.

Suppose that the agents’ beliefs are appropriately augmented so that each agent knows that A1, A2, and A3 are the case. Again they coordinate on (s2, s2). Are they following a convention this time? Still not necessarily, says Lewis. For what if it turns out that Liz thinks that Robert does not know that they are both rational? Then Liz has a false belief about Robert. Beyond this, there are two other points which Lewis does not himself raise in this argument, but which clearly support his view. First, it would be counterintuitive, at the very least, to suppose that any agent following a convention believes that he has reasoning abilities that the other agents lack. If Liz has determined that A1, A2, and A 3 are the case, then if they are following a convention she should expect that Robert has arrived at the same conclusion. Second, what could explain Liz’s knowledge of A3? The most natural explanation for Liz’s expectation that Robert will follow his end of (s2, s2) is that Liz knows that Robert knows that A1, A2, and A3 are the case. So convention evidently involves agents having at least second-order mutual knowledge of A1, A2, and A3, that is, Robert (Liz) must know that Liz (Robert) knows that A1, A2, and A3 are the case. But this raises the question: Can third-order mutual knowledge that A1, A 2, and A3 obtain fail? No, argues Lewis. For if Robert thought that Liz did not know that Robert knew that A1, A2, and A3 were the case, then Robert would have a false belief about Liz. The additional supporting points also kick in again: If Robert has second-order mutual knowledge that A1, A2, and A3 obtain, then he should conclude that Liz also has this second-order mutual knowledge. To conclude otherwise would require Robert to assume, counterintuitively, that he has analyzed their deliberations in this situation in a way that Liz cannot. And how did Robert get his second-order mutual knowledge of A3? The most obvious way to account for Robert’s second-order mutual knowledge would be to attribute to Robert the knowledge that Liz has second-order mutual knowledge that A1, A2, and A3 are the case. So convention requires third-order mutual knowledge that A1, A2, and A 3 are the case. And the argument can be continued for any higher level of mutual knowledge.

Lewis concludes that a necessary condition for agents to be following a convention is that their preferences to follow the corresponding coordination equilibrium be common knowledge. So on Lewis’ account, a convention for a set of agents is a coordination equilibrium which the agents follow on account of their common knowledge of their rationality, the payoff structure of the relevant game and that each agent follows her part of the equilibrium.

A regularity R in the behavior of members of a population P when they are agents in a recurrent situation S is a convention if and only if it is true that, and it is common knowledge in P that, in any instance of S among the members of P,
  1. everyone conforms to R;
  2. everyone expects everyone else to conform to R;
  3. everyone has approximately the same preferences regarding all possible combinations of actions;
  4. everyone prefers that everyone conform to R, on condition that at least all but one conform to R;
  5. everyone would prefer that everyone conform to Rprime, on condition that at least all but one conform to Rprime,
where Rprime is some possible regularity in the behavior of members of P in S, such that no one in any instance of S among members of P could conform both to Rprime and to R.
(Lewis 1969, p. 76)[19]

Lewis includes the requirement that there be an alternate coordination equilibrium Rprime besides the equilibrium R that all follow in order to capture the fundamental intuition that how the agents who follow a convention behave depends crucially upon how they expect the others to behave. In the Department Store game, the (s2, s2) equilibrium is a Lewis-convention when Liz and Robert have common knowledge of A1, A2, and A3. Had their expectations been different, so either had believed that the other would not follow (s2, s2), then the outcome might have been very different.

Sugden (1986) and Vanderschraaf (1997) argue that it is not crucial to the notion of convention that the corresponding equilibrium be a coordination equilibrium. Lewis’ key insight is that a convention is a pattern of mutually beneficial behavior which depends on the agents’ common knowledge that all follow this pattern, and no other. Vanderschraaf gives a more general definition of convention as a strict equilibrium together with common knowledge that all follow this equilibrium and that all would have followed a different equilibrium had their beliefs about each other been different. An example of this more general kind of convention is given below in the discussion of the Figure 3.1 example.

3.3 Strategic Form Games

Lewis formulated the notion of common knowledge as part of his general account of conventions. In the years following the publication of Convention, game theorists have recognized that any explanation of a particular pattern of play in a game depends crucially on mutual and common knowledge assumptions. More specifically, solution concepts in game theory are both motivated and justified in large part by the mutual or common knowledge the agents in the game have regarding their situation.

To establish the notation that will be used in the discussion that follows, the usual definitions of a game in strategic form, expected utility and agents’ distributions over their opponents’ strategies, are given here:

Definition 3.2
A game Gamma is an ordered triple (N, S, u) consisting of the following elements:

The subscript ‘-k’ indicates the result of removing the kth component of an n-tuple or an n-fold Cartesian product. For instance,

S-k = S1 × … × Sk1 × Sk+1 × … × Sn

denotes the pure strategy combinations that agent k’s opponents may play.

Now let us formally introduce a system of the agents’ beliefs into this framework. Deltak(S-k) denotes the set of probability distributions over the measurable space (S-k, gothic-Fk), where gothic-Fk denotes the Boolean algebra generated by the strategy combinations S-k. Each agent k has a probability distribution muk in Deltak(S-k), and this distribution determines the (Savage) expected utilities for each of k’s possible acts:

E(uk(sk j)) = sum
A-k in S-k
uk(sk j, s-k) muk(s-k),   j = 1, 2, … , nk

If i is an opponent of k, then i’s individual strategy si j may be characterized as a union of strategy combinations union{ s-k | si j in s-k } in gothic-Fk, and so k’s marginal probability for i’s strategy si j may be calculated as follows:

muk(si j) = sum
{ s-k | si j in s-k }
muk(dot | A) denotes k’s conditional probability distribution given a set A, and E(dot | A) denotes k’s conditional expectation given muk(dot | A).

Suppose first that the agents have common knowledge of the full payoff structure of the game they are engaged in and that they are all rational, and that no other information is common knowledge. In other words, each agent knows that her opponents are expected utility maximizers, but does not in general know exactly which strategies they will choose or what their probabilities for her acts are. These common knowledge assumptions are the motivational basis for the solution concept for noncooperative games known as rationalizability, introduced independently by Bernheim (1984) and Pearce (1984). Roughly speaking, a rationalizable strategy is any strategy an agent may choose without violating common knowledge of Bayesian rationality. Bernheim and Pearce argue that when only the structure of the game and the agents’ Bayesian rationality are common knowledge, the game should be considered "solved" if every agent plays a rationalizable strategy. For instance, in the "Chicken" game with payoff structure defined by Figure 3.1,

Figure 3.1
if Joanna and Lizzi have common knowledge of all of the payoffs at every strategy combination, and they have common knowledge that both are Bayesian rational, then any of the four pure strategy profiles is rationalizable. For if their beliefs about each other are defined by the probabilities
alpha1 = mu1 (Joanna plays s1), and
alpha2 = mu2 (Lizzi plays s1)
E(ui(s1)) = 3alphai + 2(1 alphai) = alphai + 2
E(ui(s2)) = 4alphai + 0(1 alphai) = 4alphai,   i = 1, 2

so each agent maximizes her expected utility by playing s1 if alphai + 2 greater than or equal to 4alphai or alphai less than or equal to 2/3 and maximizes her expected utility by playing s2 if alphai greater than or equal to 2/3. If it so happens that alphai > 2/3 for both agents, then both conform with Bayesian rationality by playing their respective ends of the strategy combination (s2,s2) given their beliefs, even though each would want to defect from this strategy combination were she to discover that the other is in fact going to play s2. Note that the game’s pure strategy Nash equilibria, (s1, s2) and (s2, s1), are rationalizable, since it is rational for Lizzi and Joanna to conform with either equilibrium given appropriate distributions. In general, the set of a game’s rationalizable strategy combinations contains the set of the game’s pure strategy Nash equilibria, and this example shows that the containment can be proper.

To show that rationalizability is a nontrivial notion, consider the 2-agent game with payoff structure defined by Figure 3.2a:

Figure 3.2a

In this game, s1 and s3 strictly dominate s2 for Lizzi, so Lizzi cannot play s2 on pain of violating Bayesian rationality. Joanna knows this, so Joanna knows that the only pure strategy profiles which are possible outcomes of the game will be among the six profiles in which Lizzi does not choose s2. In effect, the 3 × 3 game is reduced to the 2 × 3 game defined by Figure 3.2b:

Figure 3.2b

In this reduced game, s2 is strictly dominated for Joanna by s1, and so Joanna will rule out playing s2. Lizzi knows this, and so she rules out strategy combinations in which Joanna plays s2. The rationalizable strategy profiles are the four profiles that remain after deleting all of the strategy combinations in which either Lizzi or Joanna play s2. In effect, common knowledge of Bayesian rationality reduces the 3 × 3 game of Figure 3.2a to the 2 × 2 game defined by Figure 3.2c:

Figure 3.2c
since Lizzi and Joanna both know that the only possible outcomes of the game are (s1, s1), (s1, s3), (s3, s1), and (s3, s3).

Rationalizability can be defined formally in several ways. A variation of Bernheim’s original (1984) definition is given here.

Definition 3.3
Given that each agent k in N has a probability distribution muk in Deltak(s-k), the system of beliefs
bold-mu   =   (mu1, … , mun) in Delta1(S-1) × … × Deltan(S-n)
is Bayes concordant if and only if,
(3.i) For i not equal to k, mui(sk j) > 0 doublerightarrow sk j maximizes k’s expected utility for some sigmak in Deltak(s-k),
and (3.i) is common knowledge. A pure strategy combination s = (sj1, … , sn jn) in S is rationalizable if and only if the agents have a Bayes concordant system bold-mu of beliefs and, for each agent k in N,
(3.ii) E(uk(sk jk)) greater than or equal to E(uk(sk ik)), for ik not equal to jk.[20]

The following result shows that the common knowledge restriction on the distributions in Definition 3.1 formalizes the assumption that the agents have common knowledge of Bayesian rationality.

Proposition 3.4
In a game Gamma, common knowledge of Bayesian rationality is satisfied if, and only if, (3.i) is common knowledge.


When agents have common knowledge of the game and their Bayesian rationality only, one can predict that they will follow a rationalizable strategy profile. However, rationalizability becomes an unstable solution concept if the agents come to know more about one another. For instance, in the Chicken example above with alphai > 2/3, i = 1, 2, if either agent were to discover the other agent’s beliefs about her, she would have good reason not to follow the (s2,s2) profile and to revise her own beliefs regarding the other agent. If, in the other hand, it so happens that alpha1 = 1 and alpha2 = 0, so that the agents maximize expected payoff by following the (s2, s1) profile, then should the agents discover their beliefs about each other, they will still follow (s2, s1). Indeed, if their beliefs are common knowledge, then one can predict with certainty that they will follow (s2,s1). The Nash equilibrium (s2,s1) is characterized by the belief distributions defined by alpha1 = 1 and alpha2 = 0.

The Nash equilibrium is a special case of correlated equilibrium concepts, which are defined in terms of the belief distributions of the agents in a game. In general, a correlated equilibrium-in-beliefs is a system of agents’ probability distributions which remains stable given common knowledge of the game, rationality and the beliefs themselves. We will review two alternative correlated equilibrium concepts (Aumann 1974, 1987; Vanderschraaf 1995), and show how each generalizes the Nash equilibrium concept.

Definition 3.5
Given that each agent k in N has a probability distribution muk in Deltak (s-k), the system of beliefs
bold-mu* = (mu1*, . . . , mun* ) in Delta1(s-1) × . . . × Deltan(s-n)

is an endogenous correlated equilibrium if, and only if,

(3.iii) For i not equal to k, mui*(sk j) > 0 doublerightarrow sk j maximizes k’s expected utility given muk*.

If bold-mu* is an endogenous correlated equilibrium a pure strategy combination s* = (s1*, . . . ,sn* ) in S is an endogenous correlated equilibrium strategy combination given bold-mu* if, and only if, for each agent k in N,

(3.iv) E(uk(sk*)) greater than or equal to E(uk(sk i)) for sk i not equal to sk*.

Hence, the endogenous correlated equilibrium bold-mu* restricts the set of strategies that the agents might follow, as do the Bayes concordant beliefs of rationalizability. However, the endogenous correlated equilibrium concept is a proper refinement of rationalizability, because the latter does not presuppose that condition (3.iii) holds with respect to the beliefs one’s opponents actually have. If exactly one pure strategy combination s* satisfies (3.iv) given bold-mu*, then bold-mu* is a strict equilibrium, and in this case one can predict with certainty what the agents will do given common knowledge of the game, rationality and their beliefs. Note that Definition 3.5 says nothing about whether or not the agents regard their opponents’ strategy combinations as probabilistically independent. Also, this definition does not require that the agents’ probabilities are consistent, in the sense that agents’ probabilities for a mutual opponent’s acts agree. A simple refinement of the endogenous correlated equilibrium concept characterizes the Nash equilibrium concept.

Definition 3.6
A system of agents’ beliefs bold-mu* is a Nash equilibrium if, and only if,

In other words, an endogenous correlated equilibrium is a Nash equilibrium-in-beliefs when each agent regards the moves of his opponents as probabilistically independent and the agents’ probabilities are consistent. Note that in the 2-agent case, conditions (b) and (c) of the Definition 3.6 are always satisfied, so for 2-agent games the endogenous correlated equilibrium concept reduces to the Nash equilibrium concept. Conditions (b) and (c) are traditionally assumed in game theory, but Skyrms (1991) and Vanderschraaf (1995) argue that there may be good reasons to relax these assumptions in games with 3 or more agents.

Brandenburger and Dekel (1988) show that in 2-agent games, if the beliefs of the agents are common knowledge, condition (3.iii) characterizes a Nash equilibrium-in-beliefs. As they note, condition (3.iii) characterizes a Nash equilibrium in beliefs for the n-agent case if the probability distributions are consistent and satisfy probabilistic independence. Proposition 3.7 extends Brandenburger and Dekel’s result to the endogenous correlated equilibrium concept by relaxing the consistency and probabilistic independence assumptions.

Proposition 3.7
Assume that the probabilities
bold-mu = (mu1,…,mun) in Delta1(s-1) × . . . × Deltan(s-n)
are common knowledge. Then common knowledge of Bayesian rationality is satisfied if, and only if, bold-mu is an endogenous correlated equilibrium.


In addition, we have:
Corollary 3.8 (Brandenburger and Dekel, 1988)
Assume in a 2-agent game that the probabilities
bold-mu = (mu1,mu2) in Delta1(s-1) × Delta2(s-2)

are common knowledge. Then common knowledge of Bayesian rationality is satisfied if, and only if, bold-mu is a Nash equilibrium.

The endogenous correlated equilibrium concept reduces to the Nash equilibrium concept in the 2-agent case, so the corollary follows by Proposition 3.7.

If bold-mu* is a strict equilibrium, then one can predict which pure strategy profile the agents in a game will follow given common knowledge of the game, rationality and bold-mu*. But if bold-mu* is such that several distinct pure strategy profiles satisfy (3.iv) with respect to bold-mu*, then one can no longer predict with certainty what the agents will do. For instance, in the Chicken game of Figure 3.1, the belief distributions defined by alpha1 = alpha2 = 2/3 together are a Nash equilibrium-in-beliefs. Given common knowledge of this equilibrium, either pure strategy is a best reply for each agent, in the sense that either pure strategy maximizes expected utility. Indeed, if agents can also adopt randomized or mixed strategies at which they follow one of several pure strategies according to the outcome of a chance experiment, then any of the infinitely mixed strategies an agent might adopt in Chicken is a best reply given bold-mu*.[21] So the endogenous correlated equilibrium concept does not determine the exact outcome of a game in all cases, even if one assumes probabilistic consistency and independence so that the equilibrium is a Nash equilibrium.

Another correlated equilibrium concept formalized by Aumann (1974, 1987) does give a determinate prediction of what agents will do in a game given appropriate common knowledge. To illustrate Aumann’s correlated equilibrium concept, let us consider the Figure 3.1 game once more. If Joanna and Lizzi can tie their strategies to their knowledge of the possible worlds in a certain way, they can follow a system of correlated strategies which will yield a payoff vector they both prefer to that of the mixed Nash equilibrium and which is itself an equilibrium. One way they can achieve this is to have their friend Ron play a variation of the familiar shell game by hiding a pea under one of three walnut shells, numbered 1, 2 and 3. Joanna and Lizzi both think that each of the three relevant possible worlds corresponding to omegak = {the pea lies under shell k} is equally likely. Ron then gives Lizzi and Joanna each a private recommendation, based upon the outcome of the game, which defines a system of strategy combinations f as follows

(star) f(omega) = cases bracket
(s1,s1) if omegak = omega1
(s1,s2) if omegak = omega2
(s2,s1) if omegak = omega3

f is a correlated strategy system because the agents tie their strategies, by following their recommendations, to the same set of states of the world Omega. f is also a strict Aumann correlated equilibrium, for if each agent knows how Ron makes his recommendations, but knows only the recommendation he gives her, either would do strictly worse were she to deviate from her recommendation.[22] Since there are several strict equilibria of Chicken, f corresponds to a convention as defined in Vanderschraaf (1997). The overall expected payoff vector of f is (3,3), which lies outside the convex hull of the payoffs for the game’s Nash equilibria and which Pareto-dominates the expected payoff vector (4/3, 4/3), of the mixed Nash equilibrium defined by alpha1 = 2/3, i = 1, 2.[23] The correlated equilibrium f is characterized by the probability distribution of the agents’ play over the strategy profiles, given in Figure 3.3:

Figure 3.3

Aumann (1987) proves a result relating his correlated equilibrium concept to common knowledge. To review this result, we must give the formal definition of Aumann correlated equilibrium.

Definition 3.9
Given a game Gamma = (N, S, u) together with a finite set of possible worlds Omega, the vector valued function f: Omega implies S is a correlated n-tuple. If f(omega) = (f1(omega), . . . , fn(omega)) denotes the components of f for the agents of N, then agent k’s recommended strategy at omega is fk(omega). f is an Aumann correlated equilibrium iff
E(uk circle f) greater than or equal to E(uk(f-k, gk)),
for each k in N and for any function gk that is a function of fi.

The agents are at Aumann correlated equilibrium if at each possible world omega in Omega, no agent will want to deviate from his recommended strategy, given that the others follow their recommended strategies. Hence, Aumann correlated equilibrium uniquely specifies the strategy of each agent, by explicitly introducing a space of possible worlds to which agents can correlate their acts. The deviations gi are required to be functions of fi, that is, compositions of some other function with fi, because i is informed of fi(omega) only, and so can only distinguish between the possible worlds of Omega that are distinguished by fi. As noted already, the primary difference between Aumann’s notion of correlated equilibrium and the endogenous correlated equilibrium is that in Aumann’s correlated equilibrium, the agents correlate their strategies to some event omega in Omega that is external to the game. One way to view this difference is that agents who correlate their strategies exogenously can calculate their expected utilities conditional on their own strategies.

In Aumann’s model, a description of each possible world omega includes descriptions of the following: the game Gamma, the agent’s private information partitions, and the actions chosen by each agent at omega, and each agent’s prior probability distribution muk(dot) over Omega. The basic idea is that conditional on omega, everyone knows everything that can be the object of uncertainty on the part of any agent, but in general, no agent necessarily knows which world omega is the actual world. The agents can use their priors to calculate the probabilities that the various act combinations s in S are played. If the agents’ priors are such that for all i, j in N, mui(omega) = 0 iff muj(omega) = 0, then the agents’ priors are mutually absolutely continuous. If the agents’ priors all agree, that is, mu1(omega) = . . . = mun(omega) = mu(omega) for each omega in Omega, then it is said that the common prior assumption, or CPA, is satisfied. If agents are following an Aumann correlated equilibrium f and the CPA is satisfied, then f is an objective Aumann correlated equilibrium. An Aumann correlated equilibrium is a Nash equilibrium if the CPA is satisfied and the agents’ distributions satisfy probabilistic independence.[24]

Let si(omega) denote the strategy chosen by agent i at possible world omega. Then sOmega implies S defined by s(omega) = (s1(omega),…,sn(omega)) is a correlated n-tuple. Given that calligraphic-Hi is a partition of Omega,[25] the function siOmega implies si defined by s is calligraphic-Hi-measurable if for each calligraphic-Hi j in calligraphic-Hi, si(omegaprime) is constant for each omegaprime in calligraphic-Hi j. calligraphic-Hi-measurability is a formal way of saying that i knows what she will do at each possible world, given her information.

Definition 3.10
Agent i is Bayes rational with respect to omega in Omega (alternatively, omega-Bayes rational) iff si is calligraphic-Hi-measurable and
E(uicircles | calligraphic-Hi)(omega) greater than or equal to E(ui(vi,s-i) | calligraphic-Hi)(omega)
for any calligraphic-Hi-measurable function vi : Omega implies si.

Note that Aumann’s definition of omega-Bayesian rationality implies that mui(calligraphic-Hi(omega)) > 0, so that the conditional expectations are defined. Aumann’s main result, given next, implicitly assumes that mui(calligraphic-Hi(omega)) > 0 for every agent i in N and every possible world omega in Omega. This poses no technical difficulties if the CPA is satisfied, or even if the priors are only mutually absolutely continuous, since if this is the case then one can simply drop any omega with zero prior from consideration.

Proposition 3.11 (Aumann 1987)
If each agent i in N is omega-Bayes rational at each possible world omega in Omega, then the agents are following an Aumann correlated equilibrium. If the CPA is satisfied, then the correlated equilibrium is objective.


Part of the uncertainty the agents might have about their situation is whether or not all agents are rational. But if it is assumed that all agents are omega-Bayesian rational at each omega in Omega, then a description of this fact forms part of the description of each possible omega and thus lies in the meet of the agents’ partitions. As noted already, descriptions of the agents’ priors, their partitions and the game also form part of the description of each possible world, so propositions corresponding to these facts also lie in the meet of the agents’ partitions. So another way of stating Aumann’s main result is as follows: Common knowledge of omega-Bayesian rationality at each possible world implies that the agents follow an Aumann correlated equilibrium.

Propositions 3.7 and 3.11 are powerful results. They say that common knowledge of rationality and of agents beliefs about each other, quantified as their probability distributions over the strategy profiles they might follow, implies that the agents’ beliefs characterize an equilibrium of the game. Then if the agents’ beliefs are unconditional, Proposition 3.7 says that the agents are rational to follow a strategy profile consistent with the corresponding endogenous correlated equilibrium. If their beliefs are conditional on their private information partitions, then Proposition 3.11 says they are rational to follow the strategies the corresponding Aumann correlated equilibrium recommends. However, we must not overestimate the importance of these results, for they say nothing about the origins of the common knowledge of rationality and beliefs. For instance, in the Chicken game of Figure 3.1, we considered an example of a correlated equilibrium in which it was assumed that Lizzi and Joanna had common knowledge of the system of recommended strategies defined by (star). Given this common knowledge, Joanna and Lizzi indeed have decisive reason to follow the Aumann correlated equilibrium f. But where did this common knowledge come from? How, in general, do agents come to have the common knowledge which justifies their conforming to an equilibrium? Philosophers and social scientists have made only limited progress in addressing this question.

3.4 Games of Perfect Information

In extensive form games, the agents move in sequence. At each stage, the agent who is to move must base her decisions upon what she knows about the preceding moves. This part of the agent’s knowledge is characterized by an information set, which is the set of alternative moves that an agent knows her predecessor might have chosen. For instance, consider the extensive form game of Figure 3.4:

Figure 3.4
When Joanna moves she is at her information set I22 = {C1, D1}, that is, she moves knowing that Lizzi might have chosen either C1 or D1, so this game is an extensive form representation of the Chicken game of Figure 3.1.

In a game of perfect information, each information set consists of a single node in the game tree, since by definition at each state the agent who is to move knows exactly how her predecessors have moved. In Example 1.4 it was noted that the method of backwards induction can be applied to any game of perfect information.[26] The backwards induction solution is the unique Nash equilibrium of a game of perfect information. The following result gives sufficient conditions to justify backwards induction play in a game of perfect information:

Proposition 3.12 (Bicchieri 1993)
In an extensive form game of perfect information, the agents follow the backwards induction solution if the following conditions are satisfied for each agent i at each information set Iik: Proof.

Proposition 3.12 says that far less than common knowledge of the game and of rationality suffices for the backwards induction solution to obtain in a game of perfect information. All that is needed is for each agent at each of her information sets to be rational, to know the game and to know what the next agent to move knows! For instance, in the Figure 1.2 game, if R1 (R2) stands for "Alan (Fiona) is rational" and Ki(Gamma ) stands for "i knows the game Gamma", then the backwards induction solution is implied by the following:

One might think that a corollary to Proposition 3.11 is that in a game of perfect information, common knowledge of the game and of rationality implies the backwards induction solution. This is the classical argument for the backwards induction solution. Many game theorists continue to accept the classical argument, but in recent years, the argument has come under strong challenge, led by the work of Reny (1987, 1992), Binmore (1987) and Bicchieri (1989, 1993). The basic idea underlying their criticisms of backwards induction can be illustrated with the Figure 1.2 game. According to the classical argument, if Alan and Fiona have common knowledge of rationality and the game, then each will predict that the other will follow her end of the backwards induction solution, to which his end of the backwards induction solution is his unique best response. However, what if Fiona reconsiders what to do if she finds herself at the information set I22? If the information set I22 is reached, then Alan has of course not followed the backwards induction solution. If we assume that at I22, Fiona knows only what is stated in (iii), then she can explain her being at I22 as a failure of either K1K2K1(R2) or K1K2K1K2(Gamma) at I11. In this case, Fiona’s thinking that either notK1K2K1(R2) or notK1K2K1K2(Gamma) at I11 is compatible with what Alan in fact does know at I11, so Fiona should not necessarily be surprised to find herself at I22, and given that what she knows there is characterized by (iii), following the backwards induction solution is her best strategy. But if rationality and the game are common knowledge, or even if Fiona and Alan both have just have mutual knowledge of the statements characterized by (iii) and (iv), then at I22, Fiona knows that K1K2K1(R2) or K1K2K1K2(Gamma) at I11. Hence given this much mutual knowledge, Fiona no longer can explain why Alan has deviated from the backwards induction solution, since this deviation contradicts part of what is their mutual knowledge. So if she finds herself at I22, Fiona does not necessarily have good reason to think that Alan will follow the backwards induction solution of the subgame beginning at I22, and hence she might not have good reason to follow the backwards induction solution, either. Bicchieri (1993), who along with Binmore (1987) and Reny (1987, 1992) extends this argument to games of perfect information with arbitrary length, draws a startling conclusion: If agents have strictly too few or strictly too many levels of mutual knowledge of rationality and the game relative to the number of potential moves, one cannot predict that they will follow the backwards induction solution. This would undermine the central role backwards induction has played in the analysis of extensive form games. For why should the number of levels of mutual knowledge the agents have depend upon the length of the game?

The classical argument for backwards induction implicitly assumes that at each stage of the game, the agents discount the preceding moves as strategically irrelevant. Defenders of the classical argument can argue that this assumption makes sense, since by definition at any agents’ decision node, the previous moves that led to this node are now fixed. Critics of the classical argument question this assumption, contending that when reasoning about how to move at any of his information sets, including those not on the backwards induction equilibrium path, part of what an agent must consider is what conditions might have led to his being at that information set. In other words, agents should incorporate reasoning about the reasoning of the previous movers, or forward induction reasoning, into their deliberations over how to move at a given information set. Binmore (1987) and Bicchieri (1993) contend that a backwards induction solution to a game should be consistent with the solution a corresponding forward induction argument recommends. As we have seen, given common knowledge of the game and of rationality, forward induction reasoning can lead the agents to an apparent contradiction: The classical argument for backwards induction is predicated on what agents predict they would do at nodes in the tree that are never reached. They make these predictions based upon their common knowledge of the game and of rationality. But forward induction reasoning seems to imply that if any off-equilibrium node had been reached, common knowledge of rationality and the game must have failed, so how could the agents have predicted what would happen at these nodes?

This section has barely scratched the surface of this controversy over common knowledge and backwards induction. The key unresolved issue is of course explaining what happens at the off-equilibrium information sets. To date, there is not a generally accepted theory of what agents having certain mutual or common knowledge will do at off-equilibrium nodes. However, we can at least repeat one generally accepted conclusion: In a game of perfect information, mutual knowledge of rationality and the game which falls far short of common knowledge can suffice to explain why agents follow the game’s Nash equilibrium, the backwards induction solution. On the other hand, unlike other examples we have considered in which agents have mutual and even common knowledge without having to reason through levels of knowledge, backwards induction arguments in games of perfect information require that at each information set, the agent who would move were the information set to be reached must reason her way through at least as many levels of knowledge as there are remaining potential moves in the game.

4. Is Common Knowledge Attainable?

Lewis formulated an account of common knowledge which generates the hierarchy of‘i knows that j knows that … k knows that A’ propositions in order to ensure that in his account of convention, agents have correct beliefs about each other. But since human agents obviously cannot reason their way through such an infinite hierarchy, it is natural to wonder whether any group of people can have full common knowledge of any proposition. More broadly, the analyses of common knowledge reviewed in §3 would be of little worth to social scientists and philosophers if this common knowledge lies beyond the reach of human agents.

Fortunately for Lewis’ program, there are strong arguments that common knowledge is indeed attainable. Lewis (1969) and Schiffer (1972) argue that the common knowledge hierarchy should be viewed as a chain of implications, and not as steps in anyone’s actual reasoning. They give informal arguments that the common knowledge hierarchy is generated from a finite set of axioms. We saw in §2 that it is possible to formulate Lewis’ axioms precisely and to derive the common knowledge hierarchy from these axioms. Again, the basic idea behind Lewis’ argument is that for a set of agents, if a proposition A is publicly known among them and each agent knows that everyone can draw the same conclusions from A that she can, then A is common knowledge. These conditions are obviously context dependent, just as an individual’s knowing or not knowing a proposition is context dependent. Yet there are many cases where it is natural to assume that Lewis’ conditions are satisfied. If, for instance, a group of English speaking persons in an automobile are listening to the radio, and the following special news announcement, "The Pope has abdicated", is audibly broadcast, then one may safely conclude that it is common knowledge for this group that the Pope has abdicated. If one has skeptical doubts about the agents’ common knowledge in this situation, then one would have to explain the failure of common knowledge as the result of some circumstance that would be quite surprising in this context. Common knowledge could fail if some of the people failed to hear the announcement, or if some of them believed that some of the others could not understand the announcement, but circumstances such as these would be quite peculiar given the stated assumptions in this story. In this context, skeptical doubt about common knowledge is certainly possible, but such doubt relies upon ad hoc assumptions similar to those that are needed to explain failure of individual knowledge, not with the attainability of common knowledge in principle.

Aumann (1976) gives an alternate finitary procedure for generating the common knowledge hierarchy in the special case in which the relevant number of possible worlds in Omega is finite and each agent’s information system partitions Omega. To be sure, knowledge does not always come so neatly packaged, but in many applications a finite state space together with partitions is a good model of the actual situation agents face. Aumann shows that a proposition A is common knowledge for a set N of agents at omega, if and only if, calligraphic-M(omega) subset A where calligraphic-M(omega) is the element in the meet of the agents’ private information partitions containing omega. In words, anything implied by the agents’ common information partition is common knowledge. If the set Omega is finite, then the meet calligraphic-M of the agents’ partitions calligraphic-Hi, i in N, can be computed in finitely many steps. In a certain sense, the issue of skepticism regarding common knowledge never arises in Aumann’s model. Common knowledge is built into Aumann’s model, as a result of the agents’ having private knowledge which is defined by partitions over the possible worlds. Put another way, common knowledge could fail in Aumann’s model only if at some omega in Omega, some individual i’s knowledge of calligraphic-Hi(omega) in i’s private information partition could fail, which reinforces the point made in the previous paragraph. To reiterate, if one accepts Lewis’ and Aumann’s analysis of common knowledge, then common knowledge is in principle no more problematic than individual knowledge.

Nevertheless, care must be taken in ascribing common knowledge to a group of human agents. Common knowledge is a phenomenon highly sensitive to the agents’ circumstances. The following section gives an example that shows that in order for A to be a common truism for a set of agents, they ordinarily must perceive an event which implies A simultaneously and publicly.

5. Coordination and Common p-Belief

In certain contexts, agents might not be able to achieve common knowledge. Might they achieve something "close"? One weakening of common knowledge is of course mth level mutual knowledge. For a high value of m, KmN(A) might seem a good approximation of K*N(A). However, the following example, due to Rubinstein (1989, 1992), shows that simply truncating the common knowledge hierarchy at any finite level can lead agents to behave as if they had no mutual knowledge at all.[28]

5.1 The E-mail Coordination Example

Lizzi and Joanna are faced with the coordination problem summarized in the following figure:
Figure 5.1
Figure 5.1
In Figure 5.1, the payoffs are dependent upon a pair of possible worlds. World omega1 occurs with probability mu(omega1) = .51, while omega2 occurs with probability mu(omega2) = .49. Hence, they coordinate with complete success by both choosing A (B) only if the state of the world is omega1 (omega2).

Suppose that Lizzi can observe the state of the world, but Joanna cannot. We can interpret this game as follows: Joanna and Lizzi would like to have a dinner together prepared by Aldo, their favorite chef. Aldo alternates between A and B, the two branches of Sorriso, their favorite restaurant. State omegai is Aldo’s location that day. At state omega1 (omega2), Aldo is at A (B). Lizzi, who is on Sorriso’s special mailing list, receives notice of omegai. Lizzi’s and Joanna’s best outcome occurs when they meet where Aldo is working, so they can have their planned dinner. If they meet but miss Aldo, they are disappointed and do not have dinner after all. If either goes to A and finds herself alone, then she is again disappointed and does not have dinner. But what each really wants to avoid is going to B if the other goes to A. If either of them arrives at B alone, she not only misses dinner but must pay the exorbitant parking fee of the hotel which houses B, since the headwaiter of B refuses to validate the parking ticket of anyone who asks for a table for two and then sits alone. This is what Harsanyi (1967) terms a game of incomplete information, since the game’s payoffs depend upon states which not all the agents know.

A is a "play-it-safe" strategy for both Joanna and Lizzi.[29] By choosing A whatever the state of the world happens to be, the agents run the risk that they will fail to get the positive payoff of meeting where Aldo is, but each is also sure to avoid the really bad consequence of choosing B if the other chooses A. And since only Lizzi knows the state of the world, neither can use information regarding the state of the world to improve their prospects for coordination. For Joanna has no such information, and since Lizzi knows this, she knows that Joanna has to choose accordingly, so Lizzi must choose her best response to the move she anticipates Joanna to make regardless of the state of the world Lizzi observes. Apparently Lizzi and Joanna cannot achieve expected payoffs greater than 1.02 for each, their expected payoffs if they choose (A, A) at either state of the world.

If the state omega were common knowledge, then the conditional strategy profile (A, A) if omega = omega1 and (B, B), if omega = omega2 would be a strict Nash equilibrium at which each would achieve a payoff of 2. So the obvious remedy to their predicament would be for Lizzi to tell Joanna Aldo’s location in a face-to-face or telephone conversation and for them to agree to go where Aldo is, which would make the state omega and their intentions to coordinate on the best outcome given omega common knowledge between them. Suppose for some reason they cannot talk to each other, but they prearrange that Lizzi will send Joanna an e-mail message if, and only if, omega2 occurs. Suppose further that Joanna’s and Lizzi’s e-mail systems are set up to send a reply message automatically to the sender of any message received and viewed, and that due to technical problems there is a small probability, epsilon > 0, that any message can fail to arrive at its destination. Then if Lizzi sends Joanna a message, and receives an automatic confirmation, then Lizzi knows that Joanna knows that omega2 has occurred. If Joanna receives an automatic confirmation of Lizzi’s automatic confirmation, then Joanna knows that Lizzi knows that Joanna knows that omega2 occurred, and so on. That omega2 has occurred would become common knowledge if each agent received infinitely many automatic confirmations, assuming that all the confirmations could be sent and received in a finite amount of time.[30] However, because of the probability epsilon of transmission failure at every stage of communication, the sequence of confirmations stops after finitely many stages with probability one. With probability one, therefore, the agents fail to achieve full common knowledge. But they do at least achieve something "close" to common knowledge. Does this imply that they have good prospects of settling upon (B, B)?

Rubinstein shows by induction that if the number of automatically exchanged confirmation messages is finite, then A is the only choice that maximizes expected utility for each agent, given what she knows about what they both know.

Rubinstein’s Proof

So even if agents have "almost" common knowledge, in the sense that the number of levels of knowledge in "Joanna knows that Lizzi knows that . . . that Joanna knows that omega2 occurred" is very large, their behavior is quite different from their behavior given common knowledge that omega2 has occurred. Indeed, as Rubinstein points out, given merely "almost" common knowledge, the agents choose as if no communication had occurred at all! Rubinstein also notes that this result violates our intuitions about what we would expect the agents to do in this case. (See Rubinstein 1992, p. 324.) If Ti = 17, wouldn’t we expect agent i to choose B? Indeed, in many actual situations we might think it plausible that the agents would each expect the other to choose B even if T1 = T2 = 2, which is all that is needed for Lizzi to know that Joanna has received her original message and for Joanna to know that Lizzi knows this!

5.2 Common p-Belief

The example in Section 5.1 hints that mutual knowledge is not the only weakening of common knowledge that is relevant to coordination. Brandenburger and Dekel (1987), Stinchcombe (1988) and Monderer and Samet (1989) explore another option, which is to weaken the properties of the K*N operator. Monderer and Samet motivate this approach by noting that even if a mutual knowledge hierarchy stops at a certain level, agents might still have higher level mutual beliefs about the proposition in question. So they replace the knowledge operator Ki with a belief operator Bpi:
Definition 5.1
If i(dot) is agent i’s probability distribution over Omega, then
Bpi(A) = { omega | mui(A | calligraphic-Hi(omega)) greater than or equal to p }

Bpi(A) is to be read ‘i believes A (given i’s private information) with probability at least p at omega’, or ‘i   p-believes A’. The belief operator Bpi satisfies axioms K2, K3, and K4 of the knowledge operator. Bpi does not satisfy K1, but does satisfy the weaker property

mui(A | Bpi(A)) greater than or equal to p

that is, if one believes A with probability at least p, then the probability of A is indeed at least p.

One can define mutual and common p-beliefs recursively in a manner similar to the definition of mutual and common knowledge:

Definition 5.2
Let a set Omega of possible worlds together with a set of agents N be given.

(1) The proposition that A is (first level or first order) mutual p-belief for the agents of N, BpN1(A), is the set defined by

BpN1(A) equivalent to intersectioniinN Bpi(A).
(2) The proposition that A is mth level (or mth order) mutual p-belief among the agents of N, BpNm(A), is defined recursively as the set
BpNm(A) equivalent to intersectioniinN Bpi(BpNm1(A))
(3) The proposition that A is common p-belief among the agents of N, BpN*(A), is defined as the set
BpN*(A) equivalent to infinity

If A is common (or mth level mutual) knowledge at world omega, then A is common (mth level) p-belief at omega for every value of p. So mutual and common p-beliefs formally generalize the mutual and common knowledge concepts. However, note that B1N*(A) is not necessarily the same proposition as K*N (A), that is, even if A is common 1-belief, A can fail to be common knowledge.

Common p-belief forms a hierarchy similar to a common knowledge hierarchy:

Proposition 5.3
omega in BpNm(A) iff
(1) For all agents i1, i2, … , im in N, omega in Bpi1Bpi2Bpim(A)
Hence, omega in BpN*(A) iff (1) is the case for each m greater than or equal to 1.

Proof. Similar to the Proof of Proposition 2.5.

One can draw several morals from the e-mail game of Example 5.1. Rubinstein (1987) argues that his conclusion seems paradoxical for the same reason the backwards induction solution of Alan’s and Fiona’s perfect information game might seem paradoxical: Mathematical induction does not appear to be part of our "everyday" reasoning. This game also shows that in order for A to be a common truism for a set of agents, they ordinarily must perceive an event which implies A simultaneously in each others’ presence. A third moral is that in some cases, it may make sense for the agents to employ some solution concept weaker than Nash or correlated equilibrium. In their analysis of the e-mail game, Monderer and Samet (1989) introduce the notions of ex ante and ex post epsilon-equilibrium. An ex ante equilibrium h is a system of strategy profiles such that no agent i expects to gain more than epsilon-utiles if i deviates from h. An ex post equilibrium hprime is a system of strategy profiles such that no agent i expects to gain more than epsilon-utiles by deviating from hprime given i’s private information. When epsilon = 0, these concepts coincide, and h is a Nash equilibrium. Monderer and Samet show that, while the agents in the e-mail game can never achieve common knowledge of the world omega, if they have common p-belief of omega for sufficiently high p, then there is an ex ante equilibrium at which they follow (A,A) if omega = omega1 and (B,B), if omega = omega2. This equilibrium turns out not to be ex post. However, if the situation is changed so that there are no replies, then Lizzi and Joanna could have at most first order mutual knowledge that omega = omega2. Monderer and Samet show that in this situation, given sufficiently high common p-belief that omega = omega2, there is an ex post equilibrium at which Joanna and Lizzi choose (B,B) if omega = omega2! So another way one might view this third moral of the e-mail game is that agents’ prospects for coordination can sometimes improve dramatically if they rely on their common beliefs as well as their mutual knowledge.



Lewis (1969) is the classic pioneering study of common knowledge and its potential applications to conventions and game theory. As Lewis acknowledges, parts of his work are foreshadowed in Hume (1740) and Schelling (1960).

Aumann (1976) gives the first mathematically rigorous formulation of common knowledge using set theory. Schiffer (1972) uses the formal vocabulary of epistemic logic (Hintikka 1962) to state his definition of common knowledge. Schiffer’s general approach is to augment a system of sentential logic with a set of knowledge operators corresponding to a set of agents, and then to define common knowledge as a hierarchy of propositions in the augmented system. Bacharach (1992), Bicchieri (1993) and Fagin, et. al. (1995) adopt this approach, and develop logical theories of common knowledge which include soundness and completeness theorems. Fagin, et. al. show that the syntactic and set-theoretic approaches to developing common knowledge are logically equivalent.

Aumann (1995) gives a recent defense of the classical view of backwards induction in games of imperfect information. For criticisms of the classical view, see Binmore (1987), Reny (1992), Bicchieri (1989) and especially Bicchieri (1993). Brandenburger (1992) surveys the known results connecting mutual and common knowledge to solution concepts in game theory. For more in-depth survey articles on common knowledge and its applications to game theory, see Binmore and Brandenburger (1989), Geanakoplos (1994) and Dekel and Gul (1996). For her alternate account of common knowledge along with an account of conventions which opposes Lewis’ account, see Gilbert (1989).

Monderer and Samet (1989) remains one of the best resources for the study of common p-belief.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

game theory | prisoner’s dilemma

Copyright © 2001 by
Peter Vanderschraaf

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Table of Contents SymbolTable of Contents

First published: August 27, 2001
Content last modified: August 27, 2001