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Francis Herbert Bradley

F.H. Bradley (1846-1924) was the most famous, original and philosophically influential of the British Idealists. These philosophers came to prominence in the closing decades of the nineteenth century, but their effect on British philosophy and society at large -- and, through the positions of power attained by some of their pupils in the institutions of the British Empire, on much of the world -- persisted well into the first half of the twentieth. They stood out amongst their peers in consciously rejecting the tradition of their earlier compatriots, such as Hume and Mill, and responding rather to the work of Kant and Hegel.

It is for his metaphysics that Bradley has become best known. He argued that our everyday conceptions of the world (as well as those more refined ones common among his philosophical predecessors) contain hidden contradictions which appear, fatally, when we try to think out their consequences. In particular, Bradley rejected on these grounds the view that reality can be understood as consisting of many objects existing independently of each other (pluralism) and of our experience of them (realism). Consistently, his own view combined monism -- the claim that reality is one, that there are no real separate things -- with absolute idealism -- the claim that reality consists solely of idea or experience. This vision of the world had a profound effect on the verse of T.S. Eliot, who studied philosophy at Harvard and wrote a Ph.D. thesis on Bradley.

On philosophers, however, Bradley’s contributions to moral philosophy and the philosophy of logic were far more influential than his metaphysics. His critical examination of hedonism -- the view that the goal of morality is the maximization of general pleasure -- was seminal and stands as a permanent contribution to the subject which can still be read with profit today. Some of the doctrines of his logic have become standard and unnoticed assumptions through their acceptance by Bertrand Russell, an acceptance which survived Russell’s subsequent repudiation of idealist logic and metaphysics.

Other notable figures among the British Idealists were Bernard Bosanquet, Edward Caird, T.H. Green, Harold Joachim and J.M.E. McTaggart.

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Bradley was born on 30th January, 1846 in Clapham (then in the county of Surrey, since absorbed into a much expanded London). He was the fourth child and eldest surviving son of Charles Bradley, a prominent Evangelical preacher, and his second wife, Emma Linton. The family was talented and well connected: George Granville Bradley, a son from the first marriage, was successively Head Master of Marlborough College, Master of University College, Oxford, and Dean of Westminster Abbey; A.C. Bradley, a younger son from the second marriage, taught philosophy at Oxford until 1881, and, after moving to literary studies, held chairs at Liverpool and Glasgow, refused one at Cambridge, and became the most distinguished Shakespearean critic of his day. Charles Bradley’s ‘Clapham Sect’ (as this actively evangelical humanitarian group was known at the time) had strong imperial connections, including among its members a Governor-General of Bengal, a Governor of Sierra Leone, several members of Parliament and a permanent head of the Colonial Office.

In 1856 F.H. Bradley’s schooling began at Cheltenham College; in 1861 he was transferred to Marlborough College, then under his half-brother’s Headship. While at Cheltenham he began learning German; he read at least some of Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason while still at school, though it is not clear that this was in the original language. In the winter of 1862-3 he contracted typhoid fever (at one stage expected to kill him), followed shortly by pneumonia. Surviving both, he was protected from further exposure to the rigours of English public school life by leaving Marlborough in 1863.

In 1865 Bradley entered University College, Oxford, as a Scholar, getting a first in classical moderations (Mods) in 1867 but only an unexpected second in literae humaniores (Greats) in 1869. A.E. Taylor, a later admirer of Bradley and sympathetic to his idealism, attributed his reverse in Greats to ‘the complete incapacity of examiners whose philosophical scriptures were the writings of John Stuart Mill to comprehend what philosophy meant to the brilliant younger men who were shortly to revolutionize philosophical studies in Great Britain.’ Whether or not this is true, there is certainly an undisguised contempt for Mill and his followers exhibited in Bradley’s Principles of Logic. After more than one failure to obtain a college fellowship, he was in December 1870 elected to one at Merton College Oxford, tenable for life, with no teaching duties, and terminable only on marriage. He never married, and remained in his fellowship until his death.

In June 1871 Bradley suffered a severe inflammation of the kidneys which appears to have had permanent effects. It has been suggested, possibly with malice, that the Bradleys in general were disposed to hypochondria; be that as it may, he was prone thereafter to be incapacitated by cold, physical exhaustion or anxiety, and in consequence lived a retired life. He took an active part in the running of his college, but avoided public occasions, to the extent, for example, of declining an invitation to become a founding member of the British Academy. Collingwood records of Bradley in his Autobiography, ‘[A]lthough I lived within a few hundred yards of him for sixteen years, I never to my knowledge set eyes on him.’ This relative seclusion added an element of mystery to his philosophical reputation, a mystery enhanced by the dedication of some of his books to a person identified only by the initials ‘E.R.’

But although Bradley devoted himself to philosophy, so that the history of his public life is largely that of his books and articles, it is clear that his was not a narrowly bookish existence. To protect his health, he frequently escaped the damp chill of Oxford winters for the kinder weather of southern English and Mediterranean seaside resorts. His metaphysics, a striking combination of the rational and the mystical, makes more than grudging room for the life of the senses and emotions, and his writings, especially his posthumously published Aphorisms, could not be the work of a man whose experience had been confined to the study. He liked guns and disliked cats, indulging his preferences economically by using the former to shoot the latter in the college grounds at night.

Bradley’s political views are said to have been conservative, though not of a narrowly doctrinaire kind. Although his writings reveal a religious temperament, he seems (judging by a letter of 1922) to have found the evangelical religiosity of his father’s household oppressive, and, perhaps in consequence, the attitude to Christianity displayed later in his writings exhibits a certain ambivalence; on the whole, he appears to have been a freethinker. (To imagine growing up amongst the members of the Clapham Sect, we might use John Sutherland’s suggestion that the characters of Edmund and Fanny in Jane Austen’s Mansfield Park give us some idea of what they would have been like.)

Bradley’s public recognition included the conferring of the honorary degree LL.D. by the University of Glasgow (1883), election to membership of the Royal Danish Academy (1921), of the Accademia dei Lincei and the Reale Istituto Lombardo of Milan (1922), and election to an Honorary Fellowship of the British Academy (1923). In 1924, King George V bestowed on him, the first philosopher to be singled out for this very rare honour, the Order of Merit. Three months later, after a few days’ illness, he died from blood poisoning on 18th September, 1924. He is buried in Holywell Cemetery, Oxford.

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As the above (by no means complete) account of his public recognition reveals, in his own day Bradley’s intellectual reputation stood remarkably high: he was widely held to be the greatest English philosopher of his generation, and although the idealists were never a dominant majority, amongst some philosophers the attitude towards him seems to have been one almost of veneration.

This reputation began to collapse fairly quickly after his death. The reasons for this are complex, and include matters seemingly extraneous to philosophy itself, such as the reaction against British imperialism (whose moral and spiritual mission had been justified by some idealist philosophers and undertaken by their pupils) following the Great War. One more locally significant factor was the tendentious but still damaging accounts of his views which appeared in the writings of Moore and Russell following their defection from the idealist camp. Another was logical positivism: for example, in the first chapter of A.J. Ayer’s anti-metaphysical tract Language, Truth and Logic, Bradley is presented solely as a metaphysician and, on the basis of a single out-of-context sentence, selected for ridicule. Consequent upon such influences was a change, inimical to idealism, in the whole style of doing philosophy, a change characterized by the development of formal logic and the new respect paid to the deliverances of common sense and of ordinary language. Bradley’s highly wrought prose and his confidence in the metaphysician’s right to adjudicate on the ultimate truth began to seem alien to a later generation of philosophers reared on a mixture of plain talk and formalization and encouraged to defer to mathematics and empirical science.

Such influences ensured that a misleading and dismissive stereotype of Bradley became current among analytic philosophers and established in their textbooks, so that serious discussion of his work largely disappeared. One result has been that, despite his seminal influence on Russell and their extended controversy over fundamental matters, books and articles on Russell can contain few or even no references to Bradley. Another is that the incidental textbook references to some of Bradley’s most characteristic, original and significant views, e.g. on relations and on truth, are often based on hostile caricatures. With a few exceptions (for instance, McTaggart’s argument for the unreality of time), discussion of the work of the idealists has been sparse since the nineteen thirties. Discussion of Bradley began to revive, as did his reputation, in the nineteen seventies. At the time of writing it is clear that he is still widely underrated; it is, however, far from clear that his reputation will ever again stand as high as it did in his own lifetime.

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Philosophy of History

Bradley’s first substantial contribution to philosophy was the publication in 1874 of his pamphlet ‘The Presuppositions of Critical History’. Although it was not widely noticed at the time, it did have an impact on the thinking of R.G. Collingwood, whose epistemology of history, like Bradley’s, evinces a certain scepticism concerning historical facts and the authority of testimony, and it has had a considerable subsequent influence. Bradley’s views were inspired by his reading of German biblical critics, and such views have been prominent since in religious studies, where a reluctance to take at face value testimony of the occurrence of miracles which violate the laws of nature is appropriate. But Bradley’s attempt to extend this reluctance to historical reports in general underestimates the contrast between the uniformity of nature and the variety of human history.

Although its overall argument cannot be regarded as satisfactory, the pamphlet is nevertheless worth reading both for its historical significance and for its value as a fairly brief introduction to Bradley’s thought. Some characteristic later themes, such as the fallibility of individual judgments and the rejection of correspondence accounts of truth, here make an early appearance; and Bradley’s philosophical style -- often obscure, typically disdainful of illustrative example, and by late twentieth-century standards uncomfortably literary -- can be seen in high relief.

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Bradley’s views on ethics were expressed at length in his first widely acknowledged publication, Ethical Studies (1876). One reason it was noticed is that the book is highly polemical. (Sidgwick called it ‘vehemently propagandist’ in his Mind review.) He did not change these views significantly in later years: in 1893 he described it as ‘a book which, in the main, still expresses my opinions’ (Appearance and Reality, p. 356n) and at the time of his death was working on a second edition which, characteristically, was to retain the original text intact but incorporate additional matter.

Bradley says in his Preface that his object is ‘mainly critical’ and that the ethical theory of his time rests on ‘preconceptions metaphysical and psychological’, which are ‘confused or even false’. In this the most Hegelian of his books, his approach is, in a series of connected essays, to work dialectically through these erroneous theories towards a proper understanding of ethics. Accordingly he tells us that the essays ‘must be read in the order in which they stand’, and a corollary of this is that the common practice of extracting one or two of them (usually the brilliantly written ‘Pleasure for Pleasure’s Sake’ and ‘My Station and Its Duties’) from the whole, on the basis of their individual merits, can result in a misleading impression of their significance within Bradley’s moral thinking: neither represents some finished position.

The development of this proper understanding begins by examining the ‘vulgar’ notion of moral responsibility and the apparent threats to it posed by the philosophical doctrines of determinism and indeterminism, threats which he argues evaporate once we examine the reality of human action. (A prominent theme in the book is that everyday moral thought is not to be overturned by moral philosophy.) It proceeds by turning to the question ‘Why should I be moral?’, which he answers by suggesting that the moral end for each of us is self-realization. What this is, is then gradually unfolded through examination of representative philosophical theories each of which is rejected as unsatisfactory because of its one-sided concentration upon particular features of the moral life. Nevertheless, he thinks, each theory captures something important which must not be forgotten in the proper understanding he aims at. For example, in the third essay, ‘Pleasure for Pleasure’s Sake’, a still-classic critique of hedonistic utilitarianism, Bradley argues that its individualism is insupportable, as is its hedonistic conception of happiness as a pleasurable state identifiable independently of the means by which it is attained (so that it could in principle be achieved more conveniently than through moral behaviour). But purged of these errors, the essential utilitarian insight of the importance of happiness as the point of morality can be retained. Likewise, in the next essay’s examination of a Kantian (if not quite Kant’s) ethics of duty, he argues that from this conception of morality we should abandon, as the result of a false abstraction, its idea that duty should be done just for duty’s sake. We can, however, retain the insight that morality requires the performance of individual duties, provided we are clear that their obligatoriness arises from the nature of each duty rather than from some formal principle.

These theories are inadequate because they have a deficient conception of the self, a deficiency he begins to remedy in the fifth essay, the famous ‘My Station and Its Duties’, where he outlines a social conception of the self and of morality with such vigour that it is understandable that the mistaken idea that it expresses his own position has gained some currency. This Hegelian account of the moral life, in which the self is fully realized by fulfilling its role in the social organism which grounds its duties, is clearly one which greatly attracted Bradley, and he seems never to have noticed the implicit tension between the metaphysical account of the self as necessarily social and the moral injunction to realize the self in society. But he finally acknowledges its inadequacy, pointing out, for instance, that any actual society may exhibit moral imperfections requiring reform from the standpoint of an ideal which cannot be exemplified in the roles available within that society. This leads him naturally into the next essay’s consideration of ideal morality, where he discusses the scope of morality’s demands on the individual, and, by a further natural extension, into the seventh essay’s discussion of the distinction between the good and the bad self, a discussion which involves an attempted demonstration that the bad self is a kind of unrealizable parasite on the good. This is necessary to his enterprise: without it, he could not hope to make plausible his suggestion that the aim of morality is self-realization. But in one way the enterprise still founders: the final essay argues that morality is ultimately self-contradictory, depending for its existence on the evil it seeks to overcome. Realization of the ideal self is thus unattainable through morality, but the book closes by suggesting that it is still possible in religion.

Some of Bradley’s metaphysical ideas are displayed in his defence of his moral philosophy. An example is his claim that the self is a concrete universal and that the ethical doctrines he criticizes are damaged by their reliance upon abstract notions of the self. The self is universal in that it retains its identity over time and through many different actions, thus collecting together the series of abstract particulars which make up its history in a way analogous to that in which the abstract universal red collects together its scattered individual instances (now often called ‘tropes’); it is concrete in that, unlike red it is a real non-abstract individual. For such claims to be fully convincing, a developed system in which the underlying metaphysical ideas are fully worked out is needed, as he himself admitted. But in this later working out, most of it in Appearance and Reality, the expression ‘concrete universal’ almost disappears from Bradley’s vocabulary, mainly because he eventually concludes that there can be only one such thing; nevertheless, the idea involved remains, reappearing in the form of the recurring theme that abstraction is falsification, and in this form is central to his logic and his metaphysics.

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Bradley’s most sustained treatment of logic comes in The Principles of Logic, published contemporaneously with Frege’s Grundlagen. The benefit of hindsight provides a striking contrast between these works, the former apparently looking back to the nineteenth century, the latter anticipating the twentieth. While both books eschew formal methods, in Frege’s case this results merely from an attempt to give a readable account of some applications of mathematical logic. But the absence of formulae (theorems, axioms, rules of inference) from Bradley’s book is intrinsic to it, expressing an opposition (shared by Mill) to the formalization of reasoning in principle, as detaching inference from the practical acquisition of scientific knowledge. This, together with the fact that familiar terms (e.g. ‘contradiction’) are used in unfamiliar ways, gives the book an archaic feel. Nevertheless, and despite the fact that Principles would no longer ordinarily be consulted by a modern logician unless for historical purposes, it focuses on issues central to logic, and the impression of its being backward-looking is to some extent misleading: for example, it uses the older vocabulary of ‘ideas’ and ‘judgments’ to express views which, often through their (selective) impact upon Russell, gave rise to doctrines subsequently expressed in terms of sentences and propositions; and it effectively exposed the notion of meaning to a sceptical scrutiny which has continued long since.

Although the treatment is less rigidly dialectical than that of Ethical Studies, Bradley develops his views through criticism of others, and alters them as he goes along. One result is that the book is far from easy to consult, and a reader determined to find out what Bradley thinks must be prepared to follow its argument through many twists and turns.

Traditionally, logic books came divided into three parts, dealing respectively with Conception (usually via ideas, the traditional components of judgments), Judgment and Inference. Bradley both inherits and transforms this tradition, keeping the three-part format but devoting the first to Judgment and both second and third parts to Inference, thus dropping the separate treatment of Conception. This is significant in that it reflects his rejection of the standard view that judgments are formed by somehow conjoining ideas: for example, the Port-Royal Logic’s Aristotelian claim that they are ‘necessarily composed of three elements -- the subject-idea, the attribute, and the joining of these two ideas’. Bradley attacks such doctrines on more than one front.

He argues, for instance, that those who, like Hume, think judgments to consist of separable ideas, fail to identify the sense of ‘idea’ in which ideas are important to logic: ideas in this sense are not separate and datable psychological events (such as my now visualizing a rainbow) but abstract universals. Once ideas are properly understood, he suggests, they can no longer even plausibly be thought of as individual and mutually independent entities which can be put together to create a judgment (as Locke maintains in Chapter XIV of Book IV of An Essay Concerning Human Understanding): the order of dependence is the opposite, ideas being abstractions from complete judgments. Here, albeit in his archaic vocabulary, Bradley identifies in advance the difficulties which Russell was later to face in trying to reconcile the unity of the proposition with what he thought to be the mutual independence of its constituents, difficulties which appeared in another guise for Frege in his attempt to maintain a strict division between concepts and objects.

Further, given that ideas are universals, accounts like that of Port-Royal make it impossible to see how judgment can be about reality, since its ideas represent kinds of things, while those real things themselves are particular; so long as judgment is confined to ideas, there can be no unique identification of any item about which we judge. Bradley applies the point to language, arguing that even grammatically proper names and demonstratives are disguised general terms. He thus anticipates that application of Russell’s Theory of Descriptions in which it is used to eliminate grammatical names in favour of quantified general sentences. Whether or not this is actually the origin of that theory, there is no doubt in another case: Russell, who claimed in correspondence to have read Principles closely, acknowledged openly that he was convinced by Bradley’s argument that the logical form of universal sentences is hypothetical (so that, e.g., ‘All cows eat grass’ is to be understood as saying ‘If anything is a cow then it eats grass’). In this way, Bradley had a significant, if indirect, impact on predicate calculus.

Bradley’s own account of judgment is that it is ‘the act which refers an ideal content ... to a reality beyond the act’, so that the logical form of every judgment is ‘Reality is such that, if anything is S then it is P’. This formulation makes intelligible what is superficially paradoxical in Bradley, when he says: ‘All judgments are categorical, for they all do affirm about the reality, and assert their content of that. Again, all are hypothetical, for not one of them can ascribe to reality its content unconditionally’ (Principles, Bk I, Ch. II, sec. 79, modified according to Bradley’s notes to the Second Edition). It is not hard to see in this an informal anticipation of the representation of sentences in terms of a combination of universal quantifier and object- and predicate-variables. (Here as elsewhere the book looks forward as well as back.) But it is an exaggeration to claim, as some have done, that Bradley’s strictures on the account of judgment as a combination of ideas mean that he is straightforwardly opposed to psychologism in logic, for it is clear that he thinks logic’s subject matter to be mental acts, not sentences or statements.

Bradley continues to criticize traditional logic when he turns from judgment to inference. Just as he rejected the Aristotelian account of judgments as combinations of subject and predicate, he rejects Aristotelian syllogistic (for the same reason as he later rejects Mill’s canons of induction): it misses the fact that reasoning can take place only through the generality involved in universals. Universals are thus essential to inference, and for this reason Hume’s account of inference in terms of the association of ideas collapses: Humean ideas are particulars, fleeting episodes which cannot be revived by association. This does not mean that association of ideas is impossible, but genuine association (which Bradley calls ‘redintegration’) can involve only universals.

Surprisingly for those who subscribe to the common view, first broadcast by Russell in The Principles of Mathematics and much repeated thereafter, that Bradley thought all judgments to be of subject/predicate form and accordingly failed to recognize relational judgments as a distinct kind, Bradley’s treatment of inference includes the complaint that the mathematical logics of his time cannot represent valid relational inferences. His own initial account of inference is that it is ‘ideal experiment’: ‘ideal’ in that these are thought-experiments which remain in the realm of idea, but nevertheless experiments in that their results are not guaranteed in advance by a complete set of logical laws which infallibly determine their own application (a view reminiscent of Wittgenstein). But later, after a long and tangled consideration of the question of how it is possible for a deductive inference to be reflected in reality, he comes up with a revised account: ‘Every inference is the ideal self-development of an object taken as real’ (Principles, Terminal Essay I, p. 598).

Much of The Principles of Logic is polemical, and it affords occasional examples of Bradley at his funniest and most acerbic, such as this note to a short chapter criticizing Herbert Spencer’s view of the nature of inference (Bk II, Pt II, Ch. II, sec. 14, n. 3),

With regard to Mr. Spencer’s view I would suggest, as a possibility, that it never was taken from the facts, but was a development of or from something about Comparison which he found in Hamilton. Reading so few books, Mr. Spencer was naturally more at the mercy of those he did read.
and this passing swipe at Hamilton himself (Bk II, Pt II, Ch. I, sec. 9),
This may be called the law of Redintegration. For we may take this name from Sir W. Hamilton (Reid, p. 897), having found nothing else that we could well take.

It is clear that much of Bradley’s criticism of his predecessors and contemporaries expresses his hostility to the sort of psychological atomism evident in extreme form in Hume but equally to be found presupposed in accounts of judgment like those mentioned above. What Bradley particularly objected to about such views is that the particulars (ideas) which they treated as realities in their own right, and out of which judgments are said to be composed, are anything but: far from being themselves genuine individuals, they are abstractions from the continuous whole of psychological life and incapable of independent existence. This is an early version of a holism which has since had many adherents. But he then goes on to point out that judgments too involve abstractions, since the subject matter of any judgment is necessarily detached from its background (as, for example, ‘Julius Caesar crossed the Rubicon’ detaches the river from its location and the general from his army) and this process inevitably misrepresents the way things really are. Thus the objections which Bradley deployed against misleading accounts of logic now begin to pose a threat against logic itself by eroding the integrity of the judgments which go into its inferences, and he ends Principles appropriately by suggesting that no judgment is ever really true nor any inference fully valid.

At this point Bradley’s attempt to write a book on logic without getting entangled in metaphysics begins to succumb to his doubts about the notion of truth. He holds that logic presupposes a correspondence theory of truth (he calls it the ‘copy’ theory), but it is apparent that he thinks this theory metaphysically inadequate: indeed, he marshals against it counter-examples drawing on, e.g., disjunctions, counter-examples which had to await the theory of truth-functions before they could be accommodated. In Essays on Truth and Reality he takes these ideas further, arguing for ‘the identity of truth knowledge and reality’. It could hardly be more clear that Bradley holds an identity theory of truth, and although he is commonly believed to have been a supporter of a coherence theory of truth (and is standardly identified as such in the textbooks), this common belief is at the very least greatly misleading. However, the combination of the identity theory and his metaphysical doctrine that reality is a unified whole enables coherence to be deduced from his views as a consequence, and he himself thought the test of truth to be ‘system’, a notion under which he included what is commonly meant by coherence; this explains why he has so often been thought to be a coherence theorist. It might be thought that his famous attack on the Hegelian idea that the rational is the real (Principles Bk III, Pt II, Ch. IV, sec. 16) is inconsistent with his holding an identity theory of truth: but the two are reconciled through his doctrine of degrees of truth, a doctrine which has to be understood within the context of his metaphysics.

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After the completion of The Principles of Logic, Bradley turned to the task of giving a full account of his metaphysics. The result was Appearance and Reality (1893). But Bradley was philosophically active for a further thirty years thereafter, continuing to elucidate, defend and refine his views, and engaging with critics and rivals (notably, and revealingly for both sides, with Russell). Concentration upon Appearance and Reality alone, therefore, risks placing undue weight upon what turn out to be temporary features of thought or expression, and this has in fact contributed to the distorted impressions of his thinking so often to be found in the textbooks of analytic philosophy.

Appearance and Reality is divided into two books. The first, ‘Appearance’, is brief, and its aim destructive, arguing that ‘the ideas by which we try to understand the universe’ all bring us ultimately to contradictions when we try to think out their implications. Some of these ideas belong especially to philosophy, such as the view that only the primary qualities are real; others, for instance the notions of cause, motion, self, space, thing and time, are deployed in everyday life. The second book, ‘Reality’, is long; its aim is to provide a positive account of the Absolute -- the ultimate, unconditioned reality as it is in itself, not distorted by projection through the conceptual mechanisms of thought. A large proportion of his discussion is devoted to consideration of natural objections to this positive account.

Much of Book I involves presentation of familiar suggestions which make only part of Bradley’s case: he alleges, for example, that motion involves paradoxes, and that primary qualities alone cannot give us reality, for they are inconceivable without secondary qualities. But Chapter III, entitled ‘Relation and Quality’, is uniquely Bradleian, alarming in the breadth of its implications, and has caused intermittent controversy ever since. In generalized form, its contention is that relations (such as greater than) are unintelligible either with or without terms, and, likewise, terms unintelligible either with or without relations. Bradley himself says of the arguments he wields in support of this contention,

The reader who has followed and has grasped the principle of this chapter, will have little need to spend his time on those which succeed it. He will have seen that our experience, where relational, is not true; and he will have condemned, almost without a hearing, the great mass of phenomena.
And it is clear that his views on relations are both highly controversial and central to his thought.

In view of this, it was a serious tactical error on Bradley’s part to present his arguments so sketchily and unconvincingly that even sympathetic commentators have not found it easy to defend him, while C.D. Broad was able to say later, ‘Charity bids us avert our eyes from the pitiable spectacle of a great philosopher using an argument which would disgrace a child or a savage.’

The impression that Bradley’s crucial metaphysical arguments are negligible arises in part from reading them as designed to prove the doctrine of the internality of all relations (i.e., their reducibility to qualities, or their holding necessarily, depending on the sense of ‘internal’, Russell having interpreted the doctrine in the former way, Moore in the latter). Whichever sense we take, this is a misreading -- and an impossible one, if we take ‘internal’ in Russell’s sense, because of Bradley’s rejection of the subject/predicate account of judgment. If, however, we use Moore’s sense of ‘internal’, the reading is understandable: in Chapter III Bradley confusingly applies this word to relations in a metaphysically innocent way which has no connection with the doctrine of internality, without drawing attention to this fact; while in other parts of Appearance and Reality he openly flirts with the doctrine of internality, repudiating it clearly only in later works less often read, such as the important essay ‘Relations’ left incomplete at his death. Further, Bradley does uniformly reject the reality of external relations, and it is natural, though not logically inevitable, to interpret this as a commitment to the doctrine of internality.

His considered view, though, is that neither external nor internal relations, nor yet their terms, are real; and that is the proper conclusion of his arguments in the chapter in question, arguments which he deploys as a team, systematically excluding the possible positions available to those who would disagree. The member of this team which has attracted the greatest attention is the one which alleges that if a relation were a further kind of real thing along with its terms (as, e.g., Russell later assumed in his multiple relation theory of judgment), then a further relation would be required to relate it to its terms, and so on ad infinitum. It is clear from this argument (which is an obvious descendant of The Principles of Logic’s attack on the traditional analysis of judgment), as well as from his own explanation, that for him ‘real’ is a technical term: to be real is to be an individual substance (in the sense commonly found in Descartes, Leibniz and Spinoza), so that to deny the reality of relations is to deny that they are independent existents. It is this which explains reactions like Broad’s: in common with others, he took Bradley to be assuming that relations are a kind of object, when what Bradley was doing was arguing by a kind of reductio against that very assumption.

Some, however, have thought that the denial of the reality of relations amounts to the assertion that all relational judgments are false, so that it is, for example, not true that 7 is greater than 3 or that hydrogen is lighter than oxygen. Such an interpretation is made credible by Bradley’s account of truth, for on that account no ordinary judgment is ever perfectly true; in consequence, to one who reads him under the influence of the later but anachronistic assumption that truth is two-valued, his claim appears to be that relational judgments are all false. On Bradley’s account of truth, however, while for ordinary purposes it is true that 7 is greater than 3 and false that oxygen is lighter than hydrogen, once we try to meet the more exacting demands of metaphysics we are forced to recognize that truth admits degrees and that, while the former is undoubtedly more true than the latter, it is not fully true. The imperfection of even the more true of these judgments, though, is nothing to do with the its being relational rather than predicative. For, as was observed above in the section on Logic, Bradley thought all judgments to be defective in that representation can proceed only on the basis of separating in thought what is not separate in reality: when, for example, we say ‘These apples are hard and sour’, we not only implicitly abstract the apples from their container but detach the hardness and sourness from each other and abstract them from the apples themselves. A perfect truth, one completely faithful to reality, would thus have to be one which did not abstract from reality at all; and this means that it would have to be identical with the whole of reality and accordingly no longer even a judgment. The final truth about reality is, on Bradley’s view, quite literally and in principle inexpressible.

It is, however, possible to give an outline. The impression of reality’s consisting of a multiplicity of related objects is a result of the separations imposed by thought; in fact ‘the Absolute is not many; there are no independent reals.’ (All quotations from here on are from Appearance and Reality, Ch. XIV.) Reality is one -- but one what? Experience, he says, in a wide sense of the term: ‘Feeling, thought and volition (any groups under which we class psychological phenomena) are all the material of existence, and there is no other material, actual or even possible.’ The immediate argument he gives for this unintuitive doctrine is brief to the point of offhandedness, merely challenging the reader to think otherwise without self-contradiction; his greater concern is to make it quite clear that this experience does not belong to any individual mind, and his doctrine not a form of solipsism. But he is not quite as offhand as he appears, for he soon makes clear that he thinks the whole book to be a best-explanation argument for this objective (or absolute) idealism: ‘This conclusion will, I trust, at the end of my work bring more conviction to the reader; for we shall find that it is the one view which will harmonize all facts.’

So ‘the Absolute is one system, and ... its contents are nothing but sentient experience. It will hence be a single and all-inclusive experience, which embraces every partial diversity in concord. For it cannot be less than appearance, and hence no feeling or thought, of any kind, can fall outside its limits.’ But how can we understand this diversity to be possible, when it cannot be accounted for through terms and relations? Bradley’s answer is that we cannot understand this in detail, but can get some grasp on what he means by considering a pre-conceptual state of immediate experience in which there are differences but no separations, a state from which our familiar, cognitive, adult human consciousness arises by imposing conceptual distinctions upon the differences. Reality is like this primitive state, but not exactly like, for it transcends thought rather than falls short of it, and everything, even conceptual thought itself, is included in one comprehensive and harmonious whole. Appearances thus contribute to Reality in a fashion analogous to the ways in which segments of a painting contribute to the whole work of art: detached from their background, they would lose their significance and might in isolation even be ugly; in context, they can themselves be beautiful and make an essential contribution to the beauty and integrity of the whole. Such limited comparisons are all the help we can get in understanding the Absolute and its relation to its appearances: Bradley rejects as impossible the demand for detailed explanations of how phenomena like error and evil belong to the Absolute, instead trying to shift the burden of proof to critics who express confidence in their incompatibility. His general answer is that anything that exists, even the worst of evils, is somehow real: the Absolute must comprehend both evil and good. But, just as truth admits of degrees, a judgment being less true the further it is from comprehending the whole of reality, so (consistent with ‘the identity of truth knowledge and reality’) reality itself admits of degrees, a phenomenon being the less real the more it is just a fragmentary aspect of the whole. The Absolute is in such a way further from evil than from good, but is itself neither, transcending them both as it transcends even religion -- it is in a sense a Supreme Being, but not a personal God.

In Bradley’s often rhapsodic descriptions of the Absolute, a conception of the world based both on his sceptical scrutiny of the inadequacies of philosophers’ accounts of judgment and, it is clear, on a kind of personal experience of a higher unity which in another context might have made him one of the world’s revered religious mystics, we can see why, at the start of this article, his metaphysics was described as ‘a striking combination of the rational and the mystical’. The very idiosyncrasy of this combination has meant that few philosophers have been convinced by it. Nevertheless, in its bold and direct confrontation of what he called ‘the great problem of the relation between Thought and Reality’, it stands in Western philosophy as a permanent and unsettling challenge to the capacity of discursive thought to display the world without distortion; unsettling because it arises, not from the imposition of an external standard which could be rejected as arbitrary or inappropriate, but from the demand that our mechanisms of representation meet the standards they themselves implicitly set.

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Works by Bradley

The more recent of the editions produced in Bradley’s lifetime are the ones now usually cited and the most useful: while the earlier text is left intact, Bradley’s later thoughts are added in the form of notes, appendices and essays, enabling the reader to trace the changes in his ideas. (Such additional material is particularly extensive in the Logic, where Bradley frequently defers to Bosanquet’s criticisms of the first edition.) Collected Essays contains the two pamphlets ‘The Presuppositions of Critical History’ (1874) and ‘Mr Sidgwick’s Hedonism’ (1877) as well as the valuable unfinished essay on relations (1923-4) and a good bibliography. Between them, this book and the important Essays on Truth and Reality contain all his articles of any substance; these are the versions normally cited. Aphorisms, after many years out of print, appeared in 1993 (bound together with ‘Presuppositions of Critical History’ and an introduction by Guy Stock) in a facsimile edition (Bristol: Thoemmes Press). Bradley’s unpublished papers, notebooks and letters received are in the library of Merton College, Oxford. Correspondence between Bradley and Russell is in the Russell Archives at McMaster University; interesting extracts appear on pp. 349-353 of Volume 6 of The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell (London: Routledge 1992). The John Rylands Library of the University of Manchester has letters from Bradley to Samuel Alexander. Much previously unpublished material has been made available in the 1999 Collected Works.

Other Authors

There is also a journal, Bradley Studies, which (in its own words) "aims to publish critical and scholarly articles on philosophical issues arising from Bradley’s writings and from those of related authors [and] to include each year an ongoing list of what has been published on Bradley and related themes." The journal is distributed to all members of the Bradley Society as a part of their annual membership, but may also be bought separately by individuals and institutions. Enquiries about the journal should be directed to its Editor.

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Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Bosanquet, Bernard | Frege, Gottlob | Moore, George Edward | Russell, Bertrand | truth: identity theory of

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First published: May 9, 1996
Content last modified: May 31, 1999