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Robert Alyngton

Robert Alyngton was one of the most important authors of the generation after John Wyclif. He was deeply influenced by Walter Burley’s logico-ontological system and Wyclif’s metaphysics. (His major extant work, a commentary on the Categories, heavily depends on Burley’s last commentary on the Categories and Wyclif’s De ente praedicamentali.) Yet he was able to develop new logical and semantic theories as well as the general strategy adopted by the Oxford Realists, as he methodically substituted reference to external objective realities for reference to linguistic and/or mental activities.

Life and Works

Not a great deal is known of Robert Alyngton’s life. Most of the information about him comes from Emden 1957-59. From 1379 until 1386, he was fellow of Queens College (the same Oxonian college where Wyclif started his theological studies in 1363 and Johannes Sharpe taught in the 1390s); he became Magister Artium and, by 1393, doctor of theology. He was chancellor of the University in 1393 and 1395. In 1382 he preached Wyclif’s religious and political ideas in Hampshire (McHardy 1987). He was rector of Long Whatton, Leicestershire, where he died by September 1398.

According to Emden 1957-59 and Ashworth & Spade 1992, Alyngton was of considerable repute as a logician. Among his extant works, the following can be mentioned (the most complete list of his writings is found in Bale 1557-59 [pp. 519-20]):

Being and Categories

Like Burley, Alyngton affirms that (i) the division into categories is first of all a division of things existing outside the mind, and only secondarily of the mental concepts and spoken or written terms which signify them, and (ii) things belonging to one categorial field are really distinct from those belonging to another -- for instance, substances are really distinct from quantities, qualities, and relations, quantities are really distinct from substances, qualities, and relations, and so on (In Cat., Conti pp. 251, 252-53).

As far as the problem of the relationship of the ten categories to being is concerned, Alyngton does not follow Burley but Wyclif, since he hypostatises the notion of being and considers equivocity, analogy, and univocity not only as semantic relations between terms and things, but also as real relations between extrametal objects (In Cat., ms. London, Lambeth Palace 393, ff. 69v-70r). According to the common interpretation of the opening passage of the Categories, equivocal terms are correlated with more than one concept and refer to a multiplicity of things sharing different natures, whereas univocal terms are correlated with only one concept and refer to a multiplicity of things sharing one and the same nature. Within Alyngton’s system, what differentiates analogy from univocity is the way in which a certain nature (or property) is shared by a set of things: analogous things share it according to different degrees (secundum magis et minus, or secundum prius et posterius), univocal things share it all in the same manner and to the same degree (In Cat., pp. 255-256). Alyngton admits four main types of equivocity: by chance, deliberate, analogical, and generic. Equivocals by chance are those things to which it just happens that they have the same name, but with different meanings and/or reasons for imposing the name. Those things are deliberate equivocals which have distinct natures but the same name, and are subordinated to different but correlated concepts. Those things are analogical which share the nature signified by their common name in various degrees and/or ways. Generic equivocals are those things which share the same generic nature in the same way, but have distinct specific natures of different absolute value (In Cat., f. 70r). According to this account, being is a sort of basic component of the metaphysical structure of each reality, which posses it in accordance with its own nature, value, and position in the hierarchy of created beings.

Universals and Predication

Alyngton recognizes three main kinds of universals:

  1. ante rem or ideal universals -- that is, the ideas in God, the archetypes of all that is;
  2. in re or formal universals -- that is, the common natures shared by individual things; and
  3. post rem or intentional universals -- that is, mental signs of the formal universals.

The ideas in God are the causes of formal universals, and formal universals are the causes of intentional universals. Furthermore, like Burley and Wyclif, Alyngton holds that formal universals actually exist (in actu) outside our minds, and not potentially only (in potentia) as moderate realists thought (In Cat., p. 279) -- even if, unlike Burley (the Doctor Planus et Perspicuus), he maintains they are really identical with their individuals, for otherwise it would be impossible to explain, against the Nominalists, why and how individual substances show different and more or less close kinds of similarity among themselves (In Cat., pp. 267-68).

According to Alyngton, who depends here on Avicenna and Wyclif, formal universals are common natures in virtue of which the individuals that share them are exactly what they are -- as the human species is the form by which every man formally is a man. Qua natures, they are prior, and so indifferent, to any division into universals and individuals. Universality (universalitas or communicabilitas) is as it were their inseparable property, but not a constitutive mark of the nature itself (In Cat., f. 101v). As a consequence, formal universals can be conceived of in two different manners: as first intentions or as second intentions. In the former case, they are natures of a certain kind and are identical with their individuals (for example, man is the same thing as Socrates). In the latter case, they are properly universals (that is, something that can exist in many things and can be shared by them), and are distinct from their individuals considered qua individuals, because of opposite constitutive principles (In Cat., p. 268). Therefore, universals are really (realiter) identical to, but formally (formaliter) distinct from their individuals. In fact, universals are formal causes in relation to their individuals, and individuals are material causes in relation to their universals. Thus three different kinds of entities can be qualified as formal universals:

  1. the common natures instantiated by individuals -- which are things of first intention;
  2. the form itself of universality, which belongs to a certain common nature when seen in its relation to the individuals -- which is a thing of second intention; and
  3. the thinkability proper to the common nature, by which it is a possible object of our mind -- that is, the real principle that connects formal universals with mental universals (In Cat., p. 277).

Alyngton accepts the traditional realistic account of the relationship between formal universals and individuals, and, like Wyclif, improves it by defining its logical structure more accurately. Alyngton thought that a universal of the category of substance could directly receive only the predications of substantial forms more common than itself. On the other hand, accidental forms inhering in substantial individuals could be predicated only indirectly (essentialiter) of the substantial form itself that those individuals instantiate, predicated indirectly through and in virtue of the individuals of that substantial form. So his description of the logical structure of the relationship between universals and individuals demanded a redefinition of predication. Alyngton was probably the first to ameliorate Wyclif’s theory of predication by dividing predication into formal predication (praedicatio formalis) and remote inherence (inhaerentia remota) or predication by essence (praedicatio secundum essentiam). Remote inherence is grounded in a partial identity between subject and predicate, which share some but not all metaphysical constituents, and does not demand that the form signified by the predicate term be directly present in the entity signified by the subject term. On the other hand, such a direct presence is needed by formal predication. "Man is an animal" and "Socrates is white" are instances of formal predication; "(What is) singular is (what is) common" (singulare est commune) and "Humanity is running" (humanitas est currens) are instances of remote inherence, as according to Alyngton it is possible to attribute the property of being running to the form of humanity if at least one man is running. However, he makes sure to use as a predicate term a substantival adjective in its neuter form, because only in this way can it be made apparent that the form signified by the predicate term is not directly present in the subject, but is indirectly attributed to it, through its individuals (In Cat., pp. 288-90).

The Theory of Relations

Aristotle’s treatment of relations in the Categories and in the Metaphysics is opaque and incomplete. Because of this fact, in Late Antiquity and the Middle Ages many authors tried to reformulate the doctrine of relatives. Alyngton’s attempt is the most interesting among those of the Late Middle Ages, as he was the only one able to work out a concept of relation conceived of as an accidental form which is in both the relatives at once, even if in different ways (In Cat., p. 296). Consequently his notion of relation can be considered the ontological equivalent to our modern functions with two variables, or two-place predicates, whereas all other authors of the Middle Ages had thought of relations in terms of monadic functions.

According to Alyngton, whose account partially differs from those of Burley and Wyclif, in the act of relating one substance to another four distinct constitutive elements can be singled out:

  1. the relation itself -- for instance, the form of paternity;
  2. the substrate of the relation, that is, the substance that denominatively receives the name of the relation -- for instance, the (substance that is the) father;
  3. the object of the relation, that is, the substance the substrate of the relation is connected with -- for instance, the (substance that is the) son; and
  4. the foundation (fundamentum) of the relation, that is, the absolute entity in virtue of which the relation inheres in the substrate and in the object (In Cat., p. 299).

The foundation is the main component, since it (i) joins the relation to the underlying substances, (ii) lets the relation link the substrate to the object, and (iii) transmits some of its properties to the relation. Unlike Burley and Wyclif, Alyngton affirms that not only qualities and quantities, but substances too can be the foundation of a relation (In Cat., p. 291).

On this basis, Alyngton can define relations of reason while eliminating from their description any reference to our mind and using objective criteria only, based on the framework of reality itself. In fact, he maintains that what characterizes relations of reason is the fulfillment of at least one of these conditions: (i) either the rrelation’s subject of inherence or its object is not a substance; (ii) the object is not an actual entity; (iii) the foundation of the relation is not an absolute being -- that is. a substance, a quantity, or a quality (In Cat., pp. 291-92, and 294-95).

The Semantics of Second Intentions

Not until the end of the fourteenth century did anyone claim extramental reality for second intentions, not even Walter Burley. According to him, second intentions are concepts that have a foundation in the extramental world, but are not "things" in the proper sense of the term. This account implied that the keystone of medieval realism, the principle of one-to-one correspondence between language and the world, has to suffer an exception, since no common nature matches second intention terms. It was just in order to do away with this exception that Alyngton (then followed by William Penbygull, Roger Whelpdale, and John Tarteys) hypostatized second intentions, heavily modifying the standard theory of the status of second intentions. In fact, Alyngton not only considers second intentions as objective, but clearly hypostatizes them, speaking of them in terms of real determinations joined to the modes of being of extramental things and directly inhering in them (In Cat., pp. 268-69). As a consequence, he conceives of logic as an analysis of the general framework of reality, since according to him logic turns on structural forms (aimed at building up semantic contents), which are, as forms, independent of both such contents and of the mental acts by which they are learned. It is through these forms that the network connecting the basic constituents of the world (individuals and universals, substances and accidents) is disclosed to us (In Cat., pp. 278-79). The strategy that supports this choice is evident: as in the case of relations of reason, Alyngton is trying to substitute references to external reality for references to mental activity. In other words, he seeks to reduce epistemology to ontology. From a logical point of view, this means that the same interpretative pattern is employed in order to account for both the semantic power of proper names and common terms (that is, those expressions that refer to a class of individuals), and first and second intentions. Like proper names, common terms also primarily signify and label a unique object -- that is, a common nature. But unlike the object signified by a proper name, the reality of the common nature is distributed among many individuals as their main metaphysical constituent, since it determines the typical features of the individuals themselves. By associating common terms with such objects as their main referent, Alyngton thinks he can explain the fact that a common term can stand for and label many individuals at once. Only in this way does he believe we can grant the value of our knowledge, which otherwise lacks an adequate foundation (In Cat., ff. 101v-102v).

Still, this procedure, so strong and powerful, leads to a paradox when applied to terms of second intention by which we speak of singular objects considered as such -- that is, terms (or expressions) like ‘first substance’ (substantia prima), ‘individual’ (individuum), and so on. In fact, according to Alyngton (and many other Realists of that period), a common term is always matched by a common nature really existing in the world. Therefore, as the term ‘individual’ appears to be common, since it can stand for a multiplicity of things, it should signify an extramental common nature shared by them. As a consequence, we would have to admit the existence of an individual common nature, that is a (self-contradictory) entity present in all the individuals as the cause of their being individuals. Alyngton, who would not give up the principle of the one-to-one relation between philosophical language and the world, could remove this paradox only by classifying this kind of term among atomic (discreti) terms -- that is, terms or nominal syntagms, like ‘Socrates’ or ‘this man’ (hic homo), that refer to individuals and not to sets of individuals. According to Alyngton, there are three main kinds of atomic terms:

  1. personal pronouns, which identify a singular definite referent by means of an ostensive definition (a demonstratione);
  2. proper names; and
  3. range-narrowed expressions (a limitatione intellectus) -- that is, expressions, like ‘this man’, that identify a singular referent as a member of a given (manifested) set of individuals. Also expressions like ‘first substance’ and ‘individual’ belong to this third type, since they presuppose a general concept (substance and being, in the example), the range of which is narrowed to a unique object among substances and beings by an act of our intellect -- to one object that is not common (In Cat., pp. 270-71).

The rule that terms can be listed as common ones if and only if they signify a common nature is safe, but at the cost of a counterintuitive categorization of their semantic power. In fact, according to Alyngton’s account, saying that Socrates and Plato are first substances simply means that (i) each one is what he is, and that (ii) what each one is is a non-universal substance. This is a solution that entails that to be an individual is not a positive state of affairs, but a negative one, and therefore connects Alyngton’s ontology with Henry of Ghent’s theory of individuation.


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Burley [Burleigh], Walter | Wyclif, John

Copyright © 2001 by
Alessandro D. Conti

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First published: July 25, 2001
Content last modified: July 25, 2001