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To understand the thesis of actualism, consider the following example. Imagine a race of beings -- call them ‘Aliens’ -- that is very different from any life-form that actually exists anywhere in the universe; different enough, in fact, that no actually existing thing could have been an Alien, any more than a given gorilla could have been a fruitfly. Now, even though there are no Aliens, it seems intuitively true that there could have been such things. After all, life could have evolved very differently than the way it did in fact, differently enough, at least, that other kinds of things might have existed. So why is it true that there could have been Aliens when in fact there are none, and when, moreover, nothing that actually exists could have been an Alien?

To answer this question, a philosopher should try to identify the special features of the world that are responsible for the truth of claims about what could have been been the case. One group of philosophers, the possibilists, offer the following answer: ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ is true because there are in fact individuals that could have been Aliens. By hypothesis, however, such individuals are simply possible and not actual. No actually existing thing could possibly have been an Alien. Hence, the truth of ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ is, according to possibilism, grounded in the fact that there are possible-but-nonactual Aliens, i.e., things that are not actual but which could have been, and such that, moreover, if they had been actual, they would have been Aliens.

Actualists reject this answer; they deny that there are any nonactual individuals. Actualism is the philosophical position that everything there is -- everything that can be said to exist in any sense -- is actual. Put another way, actualism denies that there is any kind of being beyond actuality; to be is to be actual. Actualism therefore stands in stark contrast to possibilism, which, as we’ve seen, takes the things there are to include possible but non-actual objects.

Of course, actualists will agree that there could have been Aliens. Actualism, therefore, can be thought of as the metaphysical theory that attempts to account for the truth of claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ without appealing to any nonactual objects whatsoever. What makes actualism so philosophically interesting, is that there is no obviously correct way to account for the truth of claims like ‘It is possible that there are Aliens’ without appealing to possible but nonactual objects. In the rest of this article, we will lay out the various attempts to do so in some detail and assess their effectiveness.

§1: The Possibilist Challenge to Actualism

The fundamental thesis of actualism is:[1]
(A) Everything that exists (i.e., everything there is) is actual.
Possibilism is the denial of this thesis and there are various forms of possibilism that correspond to the various ways in which one can deny Thesis (A). (This is explained in more detail in the supplementary document: Three Types of Possibilism.)

The possibilist challenge to actualism is to give an analysis of our ordinary modal beliefs which is consistent with Thesis (A), i.e., which doesn’t appeal to possible but nonactual objects. There are two central aspects to the possibilist challenge: the challenge of possible worlds, and the challenge of possible objects. The latter will be the central focus of this article, but, for the sake of completeness, we begin with a brief discussion of the former.


Claims such as ‘it is possible that there are Aliens’, ‘it is possible that there is a planet disturbing the orbit of planet X’, and ‘it is necessary that everything is self-identical’ are known as modal claims, because the sentential prefixes ‘it is possible that’ and ‘it is necessary that’ indicate a ‘mode’ in which the statements they precede are true. Modal claims are ubiquitous in our thought and discourse. Many of our reflective and creative thoughts seem to be about possibilities (consider, for example, the possibility that there are clean, fuel-efficient automobiles that cause no harm to the environment) and much of our logical reasoning involves drawing conclusions which, in some sense, necessarily follow from premises that we already believe. Modal logic is the logic of possibility and necessity and the study of modal logic, as a discipline, has flourished in the latter half of the twentieth century. This was due in no small part to the introduction of the concept of possible worlds to investigate the truth conditions of modal claims. A large part of the logic of possibility and necessity seems to be captured by treating the modal operators ‘it is necessary that’ and ‘it is possible that’ as quantifiers over possible worlds. That is, the following semantic analyses seem to capture a large part of the logic of modality:
(a) The statement ‘It is necessary that p’ (‘p’) is true just in case p is true in all possible worlds.

(b) The statement ‘It is possible that p’ (‘p’) is true just in case p is true in some possible world.

Notice that it is a consequence of analysis (b) that true claims asserting a possibility imply the existence of possible worlds.

On the face of it, then, the possible worlds analysis of basic modal statements just sketched appears to entail the existence of nonactual possible worlds, and hence appears directly to contradict Thesis (A). Consequently, actualists either have to try to develop a semantics for modal statements in terms that do not entail the existence of nonactual possible worlds, or at least to provide an account of possible worlds on which this consequence is rendered metaphysically innocuous.

The power of the possible worlds semantics -- and the distinct lack of any persuasive alternatives -- is very attractive to many actualists, and they are loathe to give it up (so long, of course, as they do not have to abandon actualism). Consequently, actualists typically grasp the second horn of the above dilemma and adopt some sort of actualistically acceptable, "sanitized" version of this theory on which possible worlds are conceived as theoretical abstract objects which actually exist. Many such theories of abstractly-conceived worlds have been developed, some with better success than others (see, for example, Plantinga [1974] and [1976], Chisholm [1976], Fine [1977], Adams, [1974], van Inwagen [1986], or Zalta [1983] and [1993]). Some take worlds to be maximal possible states of affairs, others take them to be maximal possible properties or propositions, still others treat them as maximal consistent sets of some sort, and yet others treat them as part of a more general theory of abstract objects. For purposes here, it will serve well enough just to assume some generic version of this view on which such abstractly conceived worlds can perform their theoretical tasks in virtue of certain actualistically unobjectionable modal properties. A detailed version of such an account, and some of its philosophical ramifications, can be found in the supplementary document on An Account of Abstract Possible Worlds.

Mere Possibilia

The second step in the actualist analysis of modality is to find a way to do without possible but nonactual individuals or, at least, a way to replace them with less objectionable entities like properties of some ilk. Possible but nonactual individuals -- also known as mere possibilia or contingently nonactual individuals -- seem to be required for the analysis of modal claims involving quantifiers such as ‘there is’ or ‘there exists’. Consider, first, a non-modal quantifier claim, such as ‘There are Aliens’. Such a claim might be regimented in first-order logic as "There exists an x such that x is an Alien", or in formal terms (in which ‘Ax’ abbreviates the predicate ‘x is an Alien’): xAx.

Now consider the modal claim ‘There could have been Aliens’. It is natural to regiment this claim as "It is possible that there exists an x such that x is an Alien", which is typically formalized as follows:

(1) xAx.
Now, if we deploy some acceptable theory of possible worlds, we know that sentence (1) is true if and only if:
(2) There exists a possible world w and there exists an individual x such that x is an Alien at w.
But, it is a fact about the logic of the quantifier ‘there exists’ that such quantifiers ‘commute’ with one another. In other words, (2) implies (3):
(3) There exists an individual x and there exists a possible world w such that x is an Alien at w.
So the truth conditions of (1) imply (3). But if (3) is true, then so is the ordinary modal claim ‘Something is possibly an Alien’, i.e.,
(4) xAx
for which (3) provides the truth conditions. Thus, given the simplest logic concerning modal and quantifier claims, (1) implies (4). In other words, the simplest quantified modal logic tells us that (5) implies (6):
(5) It is possible that there exists an x such that x is an Alien.
(6) There exists an x such that it is possible that x is an Alien.
The problem for the second step of the actualist treatment of modality may now be stated more precisely, namely, Thesis (A) is inconsistent with (6). Thesis (A) asserts that everything actually exists. But (6) seems to assert the existence of a possible Alien. There seem to be no candidates among the actually existing individuals which we might plausibly identify as a possible Alien.[2] Thus, the consequences of our ordinary modal beliefs that are valid according to the simplest quantified modal logic seems to be inconsistent with actualism.[3]

Since it seems reasonable to want to hang on to such ordinary modal beliefs as (5), there is an apparent incompatibility between the simplest quantified modal logic and actualism. This is only the tip of the iceberg, however, for the problem described in the previous paragraph resurfaces each time we ‘nest’ or ‘iterate’ modalities. Consider, for example, the following sentences:

(7) The Pope (i.e., Karol Wojtyla) could have had a son who could have become a priest.
(8) There could be a planet disturbing the orbit of Pluto and it could have a period of n years.
Such sentences seems to be representable as follows:
(9) x(Sxp & Px)
(10) x(Lx & Dxp & Pxn)
These cases pose a serious problem for any actualist metaphysics. Even if we assume that actualists can successfully develop a metaphysics and logic that explain the truth of the first occurrence of ‘could’ in (7) and (8), respectively, a serious question arises concerning the second occurrence. The simplest logic of the second occurrence of the "nested" modal operator in (9) and (10) would suggest that it describes a modal fact about a possible individual -- a possible son of the pope in (9), and a possible planet disturbing the orbit of Pluto in (10). (9) seems to assert that a possible son of the pope has the modal property of possibly becoming a priest. (10) seems to assert that the possible planet disturbing Pluto has the modal property possibly having a period of n years (for some n). These cases of ‘nested’ modalities and the problems they pose for actualism were first discussed in a forceful way in McMichael [1983]. We will return to this issue at several points below.

Where We Go From Here

As the reader who works through the remainder of this essay will discover, the simplest quantified modal logic has numerous consequences that seem incompatible in some way or another with actualism. In the next section, we will discover still other such consequences. Though we have succeeded in describing the issues surrounding actualism in more precise terms, we have only scratched the surface of the debate. Much of the debate turns on the precise characteristics of the modal logic being proposed as a logic for actualism. This debate can only be understood if one can contrast the characteristics of these proposed alternative logics with the characteristics of the simplest modal logic. Thus, we will spend the next section of this essay describing the characteristics of the simplest modal logic. Only then will we be in a position to evaluate the more complicated alternatives developed by actualists in the attempt to avoid commitment to nonactual possibles. For example, it is important to see just how Kripke’s modal logic (Kripke [1963]) employs a variety of special techniques that yield a logic consistent with Thesis (A) (these will be documented below).

The remaining sections of this essay, therefore, contain the following material. In Section §2, we describe, in a precise way, both the characteristics of the simplest quantified modal logic and its controversial theorems. (As we acquire more sophisticated logical tools, we will revisit some of the examples already discussed; the redescription of these examples in more sophisticated logical terms may prove to be instructive.) We also show why each of the controversial theorems is objectionable from the standpoint of actualism. In Section §3, we outline a modal system developed by Saul Kripke that appears to be consistent with Thesis (A). However, in Section §4, we’ll discover that Kripke’s system introduces special problems of its own. Finally, in Section §5, we discuss the various attempts actualists have made to work within a Kripke-style framework to solve these problems and to find a metaphysical theory of necessity and possibility which is consistent with Thesis (A). However, we will also examine the attempts of some actualists who have recently discovered a new interpretation of the simplest quantified modal logic which is consistent with Thesis (A).

§2: The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic

A first-order quantified modal logic is a group of logical axioms and rules of inference that systematizes the logically true sentences of a standard first-order modal language with identity (L) relative to some class of interpretations of this language. The language L is defined just like the language of the predicate calculus with identity, but with the following additional clause in the definition of a ‘formula’: whenever is a formula, so is . Thus, the language will have constants and variables for individuals, n-place predicates, atomic formulas such as ‘’ and ‘x=y’, and the usual molecular, quantified and modal formulas involving the logical notions expressed by ‘’ (the negation symbol), ‘’ (the symbol for forming conditionals), ‘’ (the universal quantifier), and ‘’ (the modal operator). The other logical connectives, such as ‘&’ (and), ‘’ (or), and ‘’ (iff), and the ‘existential’ quantifier ‘’, are all defined in the usual way. The formula is defined as . (To assert that is possibly true is to say that is not necessarily false.) From this definition, the equivalence of and also follows. For convenience, a complete specification is provided in the supplementary document A First-order, Quantified Modal Language. It would serve well to spend a moment or two examining these definitions to making sure that you understand the kinds of statements that are expressible in this language.

The simplest semantics for the language L defines a class of interpretations having two distinguishing features: (1) each interpretation I in the class has just two, mutually exclusive domains--a nonempty domain of possible worlds (which includes a distinguished "actual world" w0) and a nonempty domain of individuals, and (2) given any individuals i1,..., in in the domain and given any possible world w, each interpretation I specifies, for each n-place predicate ‘R’, whether ‘R’ applies to i1,..., in at w or not. Given that specification, the semantics then defines truth conditions for every formula of the language. The definition of truth even accomodates ‘open formulas’ (i.e., formulas with free variables) by appealing to assignment functions f which assign to each variable x some member f(x) of the domain of individuals. Moreover, given any interpretation I and assignment function f to the variables, a denotation function d relative I and f is defined for the terms (constants and variables) of the language. When is a constant, dI,f() is the individual in the domain that I assigns to . When is a variable, dI,f() is f().

The semantic notion ‘ is true (under interpretation I and assignment f) at world w’ (‘trueI,f at w’) is then defined recursively for all of the formulas of the language. The three mosts important parts of this definition for quantified modal logic are the clauses for atomic, quantified, and modal formulas. Here are examples of each:

  1. The open, atomic formula ‘Px’ is trueI,f at w just in case I specifies that ‘P’ applies to dI,f(x) at w.
  2. The quantified formula ‘xPx’ is trueI,f at w just in case, for all individuals a, ‘Px’ is trueI,f[x,a] at w, where f[x,a] is f if f(x) = a, and otherwise is just like f except that it assigns a to x instead of f(x). (A little less formally, ‘xPx’ is trueI,f at w just in case, for all individuals a, the predicate ‘P’ applies to a at w.)
  3. The open, modal formula ‘Px’ is trueI,f at w just in case for every possible world w, ‘Px’ is trueI,f at w.
A formula (which may have the variable x free) is then defined to be trueI just in case for every assignment f, is trueI,f at the actual world w0. (Note that when is a closed formula (i.e., a sentence), then if is true relative to some assignment to the variables, it is true relative to all assignments to the variables.) A formula is logically true just in case it is trueI in all interpretations I (in this class of interpretations). For convenience, we reproduce here a precise definition in the supplementary document The Simplest Semantics for a Quantified Modal Language. It would serve well to study these definitions if they are unfamiliar. (Readers with some familiarity with modal logic will recognize that we have formulated the semantics without an accessibility relation. However, no such relation is required for a correct semantics of S5, which, in order to keep things simple, we will be presupposing henceforth.)

The simplest quantified modal logic (SQML) systematizes the logically true sentences of L relative to the simplest semantics. SQML combines the logical axioms and rules of inference from classical propositional logic, classical first-order quantification theory, the logic of identity, and S5 modal logic. We presuppose here that the laws of classical first-order logic with identity are known. The system S5 (aka KT5) adds three axioms to classical first-order logic with identity--the K axiom, the T axiom, and the 5 axiom (see below)--and adds the Rule of Necessitation (RN) (which states that whenever is a theorem, so is ). Each of the logical axioms of the resulting SQML is true in every interpretation in the class described in the previous paragraph. Moreover, the rules of inference ‘preserve truth’ (and preserve logical truth). That is, the rules of inference permit one to infer only (logical) truths from any set of premises consisting solely of (logical) truths. Notice that open formulas are assertible as axioms and provable as theorems in SQML. For convenience, we reproduce these in the supplementary document The Simplest Quantified Modal Logic. Familiarity with this logic will be presupposed in what follows.

The problem that SQML poses for actualist philosophers is that whereas all of the logical axioms appear to be true, some of the logical consequences of these axioms appear to be false. Consider first the fact that the new modal axioms added by SQML to classical first-order logic, i.e., the K, T, and 5 axioms, all seem true. The K axiom asserts that if a conditional is necessary, then if the antecedent is necessary, so is the consequent:

K axiom: () ()
It is easy to see that this is true in every interpretation of the class of simplest interpretations: if a conditional is true in every possible world and the antecedent of the conditional is true in every world, then the consequent of the conditional is true in every world.

The ‘T’ axiom asserts that a formula true in every possible world is simply true:

T axiom:
Clearly, this is true in all interpretations--if a sentence is true in every possible world, it is true in the distinguished actual world.

The ‘5’ axiom asserts that if a formula is possible, then it is necessarily the case that it is possible:

5 axiom:
It is not hard to see that this is logically true. If a formula is true in some possible world, then from the point of view of every possible world, the formula is true in some possible world. That is, if a formula is true at some possible world, then at every possible world, there is some possible world where the formula is true. (The formal validity of the 5 Axiom is proved in the supplementary document The 5 Axiom is Logically True.)

Controversial Consequences of SQML

However, the controversies surrounding actualism and modal logic center on the following theorems, (the instances of) which are all logically true and provable from the axioms and rules of SQML:
BF: x x
NE: xy y=x
CBF: x x
BF, NE, and CBF are, respectively, the Barcan Formula, Necessary Existence, and the Converse Barcan Formula. It is reasonably straightforward to establish that NE and the instances of BF and CBF are all logically true and that they are all derivable from the axioms and rules of SQML. The proofs of these claims are provided in following supplementary documents:
The Barcan Formula is Logically True
The ‘Necessary Existence’ Principle is Logically True
The Converse Barcan Formula is Logically True
We also show how to use the axioms and rules of SQML in the following documents:
Proof of the Barcan Formula in S5
Proof of ‘Necessary Existence’ in S5
Proof of Converse Barcan Formula in S5
Before we turn to the discussion of why actualists find BF, NE, and CBF objectionable, there are two minor details to attend to. The first is that the Barcan Formula is often discussed in the following equivalent form (indeed, this was the formulation that played a role in our discussion in the first section of the present essay):
x x
(In the supplementary document, Proof of Barcan Formula Equivalent, we show that this statement is equivalent to BF.) Referring back to our Alien example, then, BF in this form, where is ‘Ax’, asserts that proposition (1) of the previous section implies (4), or, in terms of their ordinary language counterparts, that (5) implies (6).

Why Actualists Find These Consequences Unacceptable

With the machinery of SQML laid out before us, it is instructive to consider why its consequences BF, NE, and CBF offend the actualist. Recall that, according to actualism, everything there is, in any sense, is actual. Consider first the Barcan Formula. We have seen how BF leads to problems in the case of the Alien example, but, to drive the point home, it is perhaps worth considering yet another case that has appeared in the literature. Linsky and Zalta (1994) clearly express the problem for actualists by having the reader consider a sisterless person b; presumably, though sisterless in fact, most everyone would agree that it is at least possible that b have a sister. But given that possibility,
... BF requires that there exists something that is possibly b’s sister. Since b has no sisters, which existing object is it that is possibly b’s sister? Some actualists, notably Ruth Marcus [1986], might defend BF by pointing to an existing woman (possibly one closely related to b) and suggesting that she is the thing which both exists and which is possibly b’s sister. But the great majority of actualists don’t accept this idea, for they subscribe to certain essentialist views about the nature of objects. For example, they believe that women who aren’t b’s sister could not have been (in a metaphysical sense) b’s sister. This is a fact about their very nature, one concerning their origins. ... Since there seems to be no actually existing thing which is possibly b’s sister, they conclude BF is false. We think the essentialist intuitions leading to this conclusion are not unreasonable, and so understand why these actualists take BF to be false. Indeed, it seems that BF, in general, is incompatible with the intuition that there might have been something distinct from every actual thing. It is hard to see how that intuition could be compatible with a principle which seems to require that every possibility be grounded in something that exists. This is further evidence actualists have against the acceptability of BF. But since they still want to make sense of modal discourse in terms of possible world semantics, they reject the Barcan formula as having unacceptable consequences, and search for a modal semantics on which it is not valid.

Consider next NE. For actualists, this explicitly says that for any object x, necessarily something exists that is identical with x. Now most actualists accept the following definition of what it is for an object to exist:

x exists =df y(y = x)
Given this definition, NE says that everything necessarily exists. (hence our abbreviation ‘NE’). Prior in [1957] was especially concerned by this, pointing out that classical quantified modal logic was "haunted by the myth that whatever exists exists necessarily." Note that NE applies even to those objects not named by a constant of the language. These consequences run counter to our ordinary (modal) intuitions. They are not inconsistent with Thesis (A), but are instead inconsistent with the reasonable belief that some objects might not have existed. Actualists see this as an additional and independent reason to abandon SQML.

Another problem with NE is that it leads to an even stronger result. By applying the Rule of Generalization and then the Rule of Necessitation to NE, one obtains:

NNE: xy y=x
This asserts that it is necessary that everything necessarily exists. It follows that it is not even possible for there to be contingent individuals. To see why, note that an actualist would define ‘contingent individual’ as follows:
x is contingent =df y(y = x)
Consequently, the claim that there are contingent individuals would be formulated as:
xy(y = x)
But it now follows from NNE that it is not possible that there are contingent individuals:
xy(y = x)
(The proof is left as an exercise.) If this is a consequence of SQML, it is no wonder actualists are dissatisfied.

Finally, there is CBF. For the actualist, the main problem with CBF is that in SQML it implies NE in conjunction with the thesis known as Serious Actualism. Serious Actualism is the thesis that it is not possible for an object to have a property without existing, i.e., that if an object exemplifies a property at a world, it exists at that world. [See Plantinga [1983], [1985], Menzel [1991], Pollock [1985], and Deutsch [1993] for various discussions of Serious Actualism.] In semantic terms, this amounts to the constraint that an object in the extension of a property at a world must fall under the range of the quantifier at that world. Serious Actualism is often expressed by the following schema of the object language:

SA: [y y=x], where is atomic and contains x.
Note that SA is a theorem of SQML (the proof is a simple exercise) and seems consistent with the actualist point of view. But from SA and CBF, one can rederive NE from any (logically) necessary property in the system. (See A Derivation of NE from SA and CBF.) Thus, even if there were a way to block the direct derivation of NE, the alternative derivation of NE from CBF and SA shows that serious actualists could not accept SQML unless CBF is somehow invalidated.

As noted, Arthur Prior was the first to realize the controversial consequences of SQML. Prior himself was a staunch actualist, and dealt with the problem by developing an alternative quantified modal logic that differs significantly from SQML, and which does not have the controversial principles above as theorems. A more detailed account of Prior’s approach can be found in the supplementary document Prior’s Modal Logic.

§3: Kripke’s System

Given the above consequences of SQML, one can understand why actualists would seek a reformulation of quantified modal logic that both: (1) defines interpretations so that BF, NE, and CBF are not logically true, and (2) weakens the proof theory of SQML so that BF, NE, and CBF are not derivable as theorems of the logic. Kripke’s logic appealed to actualists and serious actualists for these very reasons. The system of Kripke [1963] invalidates BF, NE, and CBF both model-theoretically and proof-theoretically.

It is illuminating both to see exactly how Kripke was able to construct interpretations on which BF, NE, and CBF are not logically true and to see exactly how Kripke modified the logic of SQML so that these these schemata and sentences are no longer theorems. These techniques will be the subject of the next two subsections.

Kripke Models

The key insight in Kripke’s quantified modal logic is the replacement of the single domain D of individuals in the interpretation of a first-order modal language with a function dom that assigns to each world w its own distinct domain of individuals dom(w). No restrictions are placed on the domain of a world; any set of individuals, including the empty set, will do. Thus, instead of a single domain common to all worlds, domains are permitted to vary from world to world. Intuitively, of course, dom(w) represents the objects that exist in w. In particular, the domain of the actual world represents--of course--the things that are actual, the things that exist simpliciter. Interpretations like this for first-order modal languages in which each world has its own domain are known as Kripke models.

The central semantic difference between Kripke models and interpretations for SQML is that, in a Kripke model, when a quantified formula x is evaluated at a world w, the quantifier ranges only over the objects that exist in the domain of w. Thus, in particular, the sample clause in the definition of truth for quantification above must be revised for Kripke models M as follows, where, again, f is an assignment function:

The quantified formula ‘xPx’ is trueM,f at w just in case, for all individuals a in dom(w), ‘Px’ is trueM,f[x,a] at w, where f[x,a] is f if f(x) = a, and otherwise is just like f except that it assigns a to x instead of f(x).
Again, a little less formally, ‘xPx’ is trueI,f at w just in case, for all individuals a that exist in w, the predicate ‘P’ applies to a at w.

Kripke’s changes to the model theory of first-order modal languages are relatively simple. Nonetheless, unlike the model theory for SQML, Kripke’s model theory yields a set of logical truths that is fully compatible with actualism. In particular, all three of the principles with which the actualist takes issue -- BF, NE, and CBF -- turn out to be invalid in Kripke’s semantics. Consider first BF in the form

x x
For definiteness, let be the formula ‘Ax’ expressing that x is an Alien (in the sense of ‘Alien’ introduced above). As we noted, even though there are no Aliens in the actual world w0, there could have been; that is, there is a possible world w in which there are Aliens. Thus, on Kripke’s way of evaluating quantified formulas, the antecedent to BF -- ‘xAx’ -- comes out true at the actual world: ‘xAx’ is true at w0 if and only if there is some world u at which ‘xAx’ is true, and that, in turn, is true at such a u just in case some entity that exists in u is an Alien there. Assuming, as we are, that there is such a world, then, ‘xAx’ is indeed true, i.e., true at the actual world. However, as we also noted, no actually existing thing is an Alien. Thus, there is nothing in the domain of the actual world such that ‘Ax’ is true of it, that is, nothing a in the actual world and no world u are such that ‘A’ is true of a at u. So, in the case in question, the antecedent of BF is true, but the consequent is false. So BF is not valid, that is, there are models in which some of its instances are false.

It should be obvious why NE is also invalid in Kripke’s semantics: domains of worlds can be empty. Thus, let M1 be a Kripke model containing at least one actual individual (i.e., at least one object adom(w0)) and a world w that has an empty domain. Then, obviously, a does not exist in w, and hence ‘y y=x’ is false at w when ‘a’ is assigned to x. Thus, ‘y y=x’ is false at w0 when a is assigned to ‘x’, and so, because a is in the domain of the actual world w0, NE (hence also NNE, of course) is false in M1.

Finally, we note that CBF is invalid in Kripke’s semantics. First, let M2 be a Kripke model in which NE is false. (We just proved the existence of such a model in the previous paragraph, of course.) Next, let the predicate ‘P’ express a property in M2 that is universal and existence-entailing, that is, a property which is exemplified at each world w by everything that exists at w. (Such a property is said to be existence-entailing because, necessarily, anything that has it exists.  The property existence, of course, is the simplest example of such a property.)  We can represent the universal, existence-entailing character of this property in the predicate ‘P’ formally in M2 simply by stipulating that the extension of ‘P’ at any world w of M2 is dom(w), so that all and only the things that exist at each world are in the extension of P at that world. Now, note that, under these conditions, it is true in M2 (i.e., true at the actual world w0 of M2) that xPx: intuitively, everything that exists in every possible world has the property P in that world. Let a be any object in the actual world w0 that fails to exist in some world w. (Since, by hypothesis, NE fails in M2, there must be such an object in dom(w0).) Because P is existence-entailing, a is not in the extension of ‘P’ at w. So there is something in the actual world w0 that does not have the property P in every possible world, i.e., ‘xPx’ is false in M2. Hence, the instance ‘xPxxPx’ of CBF is false in M2.

Note that the invalidity of CBF opens the door back up to serious actualism (SA) in Kripke’s semantics, as it was the combination of SA with CBF that led to trouble (i.e., trouble for the actualist) in SQML. And it is easy to see formally that this is the case by constructing a Kripke model in which SA is true. Note first that the thesis of serious actualism can be expressed as the thesis that all properties are existence-entailing; there is no possible world in which something has a property but fails to exist in that world. In first-order languages, properties are represented by predicates, and having a property is represented semantically by being in the extension of a predicate. Thus, to represent a property as existence-entailing in a Kripke model, one simply ensures that, at every possible world w, the extension of the predicate representing that property consist only of things that exist in w. Hence, to represent all properties as existence entailing, and hence, to make SA true, one ensures that this is so for all the predicates of one’s language. Formally, then, let M3 be any Kripke model satisfying the condition that, for every n-place predicate F and world w, F is interpreted so that, at w, F applies only to things that exist in w; more formally, for individuals i1, ... , in of M3, F applies to i1, ... , in at w only if i1, ... , indom(w). This condition ensures that SA is true in M3.

The compatibility of SA with Kripke’s semantics is yet further evidence of its suitability as a formal semantics for the actualist. A question that remains is: What sort of logic does this semantics yield?

Kripke’s Quantified Modal Logic

A logic formulated in a given language L* is said to be sound and complete with respect to a semantics for L* if and only if all and only those formulas of L* that are valid relative to that semantics (i.e., true in every interpretation or model of the semantics) are theorems of the logic. A sound and complete logic for a semantics is a good thing, of course, as it provides a purely syntactic, proof-theoretic mechanism for demonstrating the semantic validity of formulas and arguments in the language.[4].

SQML is sound and complete relative to the semantics given for its language L above. Since BF, NE, and CBF are invalid in Kripke’s semantics, SQML is obviously not sound and complete for it; more specifically, it is not sound: some of SQML’s theorems--notably, BF, NE, and CBF--are not valid, as we saw in the previous section. Hence, Kripke must modify SQML to block their derivation without blocking the derivation of any valid formulas.

The key element to Kripke’s solution to this problem is the generality interpretation of free variables. The proof of NE in SQML relies crucially on the ability to derive theorems involving free variables, and more specifically on the application of the rule of Necessitation to such theorems. As described in the supplementary document Proof of ‘Necessary Existence’ in S5, the proof makes use of the following instances of logical axioms:

By contraposition and quantifier exchange rules, the latter axiom is equivalent to x=x y y=x. Thus, given x=x, we have y y=x. The crucial step now is the application of Necessitation to this formula -- containing, we note, the free variable x -- to yield y y=x, which in turn yields NE, by Generalization.

To repair this "flaw" in SQML, Kripke proposes no changes to SQML other than this: a formula containing free variables x1,..., xn, when asserted as a theorem (and hence, in particular, as an axiom), is taken to be an abbreviation for its universal closure x1...xn. Thus, under this proposal, the axioms used in the proof of NE noted above are no longer assertible as theorems (they cannot appear in the lines of a proof) --- they must be taken to be abbreviations of:

respectively. From the second axiom displayed above we can derive x(x=x y y=x) and, from this x x=x xy y=x (by the quantifier distribution axiom). So using the first axiom displayed above, we can now derive xy y=x by Modus Ponens, and, finally, by Necessitation we can derive only xy y=x. This latter, for Kripke, is uproblematically and uncontroversially true -- in every possible world, every individual existing in that world is identical to something (viz., itself). To derive NE from this, however, we need CBF -- in particular, the instance xy y=x xy y=x. But, as Kripke points out, the proof of CBF in SQML also depends essentially on an application of Necessitation to a theorem containing a free variable -- the same "flaw" that infects the proof of NE. (See the inference from line 1 to line 2 in the supplementary document Proof of the Converse Barcan Formula in S5.) Hence, it, too, fails under the generality interpretation of free variables. The proof of BF fails for the same reason. Hence, the SQML proofs of all three actualistically unacceptable principles fail in Kripke’s system.

The failure of those particular proofs, of course, does not mean that the principles in question cannot be proved some other way. However, Kripke guarantees their unprovability in his system by showing that the system is sound and complete relative to his semantics. Soundness, in particular, tells us that no invalid formula is provable in the system. Hence, since NE, CBF, and BF are all invalid in Kripke’s semantics, soundness guarantees that they are all unprovable in his system.

§4: Is Kripke’s System Actualist?

On the face of it, Kripke’s system provides the actualist with a powerful alternative to SQML. However, although BF, NE, and CBF are neither valid nor provable in Kripke’s system, the system is open to several serious objections.

First, Kripke regards the loss of free variables from assertible sentences as a mere inconvenience. However, much of mathematical reasoning is carried out in terms of sentences with free variables, and one should at least wonder why modal logic, as opposed to classical logic, can’t be formulated with free variables in assertible sentences. Far more serious, however, is the fact is that, as the system stands, one cannot add constants for contingent beings. For suppose we add a constant ‘c’ to Kripke’s system. As noted in the last section, x x=x xy y=x is a theorem of Kripke’s logic. Hence, by the identity axiom x x=x we have xy y=x, and so by universal instantiation it follows that y y=c. However, by necessitation it follows that y y=c, i.e., that c, whatever it may be, is a necessary being. Thus, in Kripke’s system as it stands, one cannot consistently assert, e.g., that Socrates is a contingent being, y y=s, surely a seriously undesirable feature in a logic that is intended properly to capture our modal intuitions.

Alarming as this problem might be, it is more a formal rather than a philosophical objection to Kripke’s system. Though Kripke himself might not be particularly pleased at the prospect, it seems that the proper response to these problems is simply to alter those features of classical quantification theory and/or classical propositional modal logic that give rise to invalid inferences such as the above. (Arguably, Kripke has already made a similar move in adopting the generality interpretation of free variables.) Obvious suspects here are universal instantiation and necessitation. After all, there is nothing sacrosanct about either classical quantification theory or classical modal logic. If they are inconsistent with strong modal intuitions, then their revision is required and fully warranted.

So its current inability to name contingent beings does not of itself constitute much of an objection to Kripke’s system. It is likely that it could be patched up so as to allow it this expressive capacity. Far more serious is the fact that, despite the invalidity and unprovability of the actualistically objectionable principles BF, NE, and CBF, Kripke’s system does not appear to have escaped ontological commitment to possibilia. A model theory provides a semantics for a language -- an account of how the truth value of a given sentence of the language is determined in a model by the meanings of its semantically significant component parts, notably, the meanings of its names, predicates, and quantifiers. Now, truth-in-a-model is not the same as truth simpliciter. However, truth simpliciter is usually understood simply to be truth in an intended model, a model consisting of the very things that the language is intuitively understood to be "about". So if we are to take Kripke models seriously as an account of truth for modal languages, then we must identify the intended models of those languages. And for this there seems little option but to take Kripke’s talk of possible worlds literally: the set W in an intended Kripke model is the set of all possible worlds. If so, however, it appears that Kripke is committed to possibilia. For suppose the modal operators are literally quantifiers over possible worlds. And suppose it is possible that there be objects -- Aliens, for example -- that are distinct from all actually existing objects. Letting ‘A’ express the property of being an Alien, we can represent this proposition by means of the sentence yAy & xAx’, i.e., while there could be Aliens (yAy), no actually existing thing could be an Alien (xAx). On Kripke’s semantics, the first conjunct of this sentence can be true only if there is a possible world w and an object a such that a is an Alien at w. But given the second conjunct, any such object a is distinct from all actually existing things. Hence, using Kripke’s semantics to provide us with an account of truth, we find ourselves quantifying directly over possible worlds and mere possibilia. That BF, NE, and CBF are unprovable in Kripke’s system, it seems, is metaphysically irrelevant. For it appears that, nonetheless, the semantics itself is wholly committed to possibilism.

An option for the actualist here, perhaps, is simply to deny that Kripke models have any genuine metaphysical bite. The real prize is the logic, which describes the modal facts of the matter directly. The model theory is simply a formal instrument that enables us to prove that the logic possesses certain desirable metatheoretic features, notably consistency. But this position is unsatisfying at best. Consider ordinary "Tarskian" model theory for nonmodal first-order logic. Intuitively, this model theory is more than just a formal artifact. Rather, when one constructs an intended model for a given language, it shows clearly how the semantic values of the relevant parts of a sentence of first-order logic -- the objects, properties, relations, etc. in the world those parts signify -- contribute to the actual truth value of the sentence. The semantics provides insight into the "word-world" connection that explains how it is that sentences can express truth and falsity, how they can carry good and bad information. The embarrassing question for the actualist who would adopt the proposed instrumentalist view of Kripke semantics is: what distinguishes Kripkean model theory from Tarskian? Why does the latter yield insight into the word-world connection and not the former? Distaste for the metaphysical consequences of Kripke semantics at best provides a motivation for finding an answer to these questions, but it is not itself an answer. The actualist owes us either an explanation of how Kripke’s model theory provides a semantics for modal languages that does not commit us to possibilism, or else he owes us a semantical alternative.

§5: Actualist Responses to the Possibilist Challenge

We now turn to the work of actualists who have tried to address the possibilist challenge.

Individual Essences

One of the best known responses to the possibilist challenge was developed by Alvin Plantinga [1974]. The heart of Plantinga’s approach is the notion of an individual essence. Plantinga’s precise definition of this notion is a bit complex, but the idea itself is quite simple. Consider first the venerable distinction between essential and accidental properties. Intuitively, the essential properties of an object are those properties that make the object "what it is." More exactly, they are the properties that the object couldn’t possibly have lacked. Its accidental properties, by contrast, are those that it just happens to have but might well have lacked. Thus, the property being a horse is intuitively not a property that the champion racehorse Secretariat could have lacked; he couldn’t have been a rabbit, say, or a stone. The property being a horse is thus essential to Secretariat. By contrast, Secretariat could easily have lacked the property being a racehorse. Under different circumstaces -- if, say, he’d injured a leg as a colt -- he might have spent his days frolicking in the fields. That property is therefore accidental to Secretariat. So the first part of the definition of an individual essence -- the "essence" part -- is that an individual essence is an essential property of anything that has it. And the "individual" part of the definition is simply that if something has a given individual essence, then nothing else could possibly have that same individual essence. (We provide the definition Plantinga actually uses in the document Plantinga’s Definition of an Individual Essence.)

Examples of individual essences are a little harder to come by than examples of essential properties. There are fairly strong intuitive grounds for the thesis that having arisen from the exact sperm and egg that one has is an individual essence of every human person, or at least of every human body. A different sperm and the same egg, say, would have resulted in a perhaps similar but numerically distinct person. Less controversial from a purely logical standpoint are what Plantinga calls haecceities, i.e., properties like being Plantinga, or perhaps, being identical with Plantinga, that are "directly about" some particular object. Pretty clearly, Plantinga has the property being Plantinga essentially -- he could not exist and lack it; any world in which he exists is, ex hypothesi, a world in which he is Plantinga, and hence a world in which he exhibits the property in question. Moreover, nothing but the individual Plantinga could have had that property; necessarily, anything that has it is identical to Plantinga. Hence, being Plantinga is an individual essence. Importantly, Plantinga takes individual essences, like all properties, to exist necessarily, even if they are not exemplified. (Interested readers may wish to read the supplementary document Background Assumptions for Plantinga’s Account.)

Briefly put, Plantinga’s solution to the possibilist challenge is to replace the possibilia of Kripke’s semantics with individual essences. We follow the development of this solution found in Jager [1982]. Specifically, an interpretation I of the first-order modal language L, consists again of two mutually disjoint nonempty sets: the set of possible worlds and the set of individual essences. And, as with Kripke, there is a function dom that assigns to each possible world w its own distinct domain dom(w). However, instead of the possible individuals that exist in w, this domain consists of those individual essences that are exemplified in w, or, more exactly, that would have been exemplified if w had been actual.

But how, exactly, does I assign values to predicates? After all, it is not individual essences to which predicates apply at worlds, it is the things that exemplify them; being an Alien, if it were exemplified, would not be a property of essences, but of individuals. Plantinga’s trick is to talk, not about exemplification, but coexemplification. Properties P and Q are coexemplified just in case some individual has both P and Q. And for any world w, P and Q are coexemplified in w just in case, if w were actual, P and Q would be coexemplified. So, for example, given that there are men who are philosophers, the properties being a man and being a philosopher are coexemplified in the actual world. Again, any world in which the pope (i.e., Wojtyla) has a child is a world in which the property being a child of Wojtyla is coexemplified with an individual essence E; any such essence E, of course, is unexemplified in the actual world (assuming the lifelong chastity of the pope).

A relation R is coexemplified with properties P1,..., Pn (in that order) just in case (i) there are individuals i1,..., in that exemplify P1,..., Pn, respectively, and (ii) i1,..., in stand in the relation R. And for any world w, R is coexemplified with properties P1,..., Pn in w just in case, if w were actual, R would be coexemplified with P1,..., Pn. In Plantinga’s system, then, a 1-place predicate P applies to a given individual essence e at a world w just in case the property expressed by P is coexemplified with the e at w. And an n-place predicate R applies to essences e1,..., en at w just in case the relation expressed by R is coexemplified with e1,..., en at w. For any individual essences e1,..., en and possible world w in our interpretation I, then, I specifies, for each n-place predicate R, whether or not R applies to e1,..., en at w.

The denotation function f for I works just as in SQML and Kripke semantics, only now, of course, it assigns essences to variables instead of possibilia. Given this, we can now illustrate the definition of truth for this model theory by means of several instances of its most important clauses:

  1. The open, atomic formula ‘Px’ is trueI,f at w just in case I specifies that ‘P’ applies to dI,f(x) at w.
  2. The quantified formula ‘xPx’ is trueI,f at w just in case, for all individual essences e in dom(w), ‘Px’ is trueI,f[x,e] at w, where f[x,e] is f if f(x) = e, and otherwise is just like f except that it assigns e to x instead of f(x). (A little less formally, ‘xPx’ is trueI,f at w just in case, for all individual essences e, the predicate ‘P’ applies to e at w.)
  3. The open, modal formula ‘’ (‘’) is trueI,f at w just in case for every (some) possible world w, ‘’ is trueI,f at w.
Referring back to our Alien example, then, the proposition that it is possible that there are Aliens, xAx, is true on this account if and only if there is a possible world w and a haecceity e such that ‘A’ applies to e at w, i.e., if and only if the property being an Alien and e are coexemplified in w.

Notice that Plantinga’s account also has no problem dealing with iterated modalities. The problem, recall, was that sentences like

(9) x(Sxp & Px)
appear to require mere possibilia to serve as the values of the quantifier, since no actually existing thing could be a son of the current pope. For Plantinga, the solution is simply that quantifiers range over haecceities, and that, in particular, (9) is true in virtue of their being an unexemplified haecceity which, in some possible world is coexemplified with the property being a son of Wojtyla, and in another world, that very same haecceity is coexemplified with being a priest.

In sum, then, in Plantinga’s account there is an individual essence for every possibile in Kripke’s. And for every property that every possibile enjoys at any given world w in Kripke’s account, there is an individual essence that is coexemplified with that property in (the Plantingian counterpart of) w. Plantinga’s semantics would thus appear to generate precisely the same truth values for the sentences of a modal language as Kripke’s. Hence, it would appear that Plantinga has indeed successfully developed a semantics for modal languages that comports with actualist scruples.

Problems with this Account

Objections to Plantinga’s account of actualism are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

World Stories

Many propositions are singular in form. That is, as opposed to general propositions like All men are animals and There are Aliens, some propositions are, in the words of Arthur Prior, "directly about" specific individuals -- for example, the proposition Winston Churchill was a German citizen. Such propositions are typically expressed by means of sentences involving names, pronouns, indexicals, or other devices of direct reference. As we’ve seen, possibilists believe that there are singular possibilities (i.e., singular propositions that are possibly true) about things that don’t actually exist, possibilities involving mere possibilia. Similarly, haecceitists also believe that there are singular possibilities that are, in a certain clear sense, directly about things that don’t exist, viz., possibilities that, were they actual, would involve the exemplification of haecceities that are in fact actually unexemplified. Say that a strong actualist is someone who rejects both nonactual possiblia and unexemplified haecceities. For the strong actualist, then, there are no singular propositions directly about things that do not actually exist. Since this is a necessary truth for the strong actualist, it also follows that, had some actually existing individual failed to exist, there have been no singular propositions about that individual. Singular propositions about contingent beings are thus themselves likewise contingent for the strong actualist. A strong actualist, then, as we might put it, believes that all possibilities are either wholly general, or at most are directly about actually existing individuals only.

Several philosophers -- notably, Robert Adams and, building on work of Prior [1977], Kit Fine -- have developed possible world semantics that are strongly actualist. The approach in Adams [1974] centers around Adams’ notion of a possible world, or "world story". For Adams, a world story is a maximally possible set of propositions, that is, a set s of propositions such that (i) for any proposition p, s contains either p or its negation p, and (ii) it is possible that all the memebers of s be true together.[5]. A proposition p is true in a world story w, then, just in case p is a member of w. Thus, Adams takes a proposition to be possible just in case it is true in some world story. In particular, then, the semantics of our paradigmatic proposition Possibly, there are Aliens, i.e., formally,

(1) xAx,
is straightforward and, on the face of it, innocuous from a strongly actualist perspective: (1) is true if and only if (the proposition expressed by)
(14) xAx’ (i.e., the proposition There are Aliens) is true at some world.

Problems with this Account

Objections to world stories are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

World Propositions

Inspired by the work of Arthur Prior, Kit Fine [1977] has developed an approach similar to Adams’ which takes account of the contingency of singular propositions. For Adams, a possible world is a certain set of propositions. Fine, by contrast, drawing on an idea of Prior’s, identifies a world with a certain type of proposition --- what he calls a world proposition. Roughly speaking, a world proposition might be thought of as the infinite conjunction of all of the proposition in one of Adams’ world stories. More specifically, a world proposition is a proposition q such that it is possible both that q be true and that it entail all true propositions. A proposition p is then said to be true in a possible world, i.e., world proposition, q just in case q entails p, i.e., formally, just in case (q p).

Now, if Fine’s account were to parallel Adams’, then Fine would now say that, for a proposition to be possible is for it to be true in some possible world, i.e., to be entailed by some world proposition. But Fine is more mindful of the problems that contingent propositions raise for actualism. Consequently, he suggests alternative truth conditions for propositions of the form Possibly p, namely, that it is possible that p be true in some possible world. Thus, for Fine, the full analysis of the iterated modal proposition (9) -- x(Sxp & Px) -- is as follows: (9) is true if and only if

(18) It is possible that ‘x(Sxp & Px)’ (i.e., the proposition Wojtyla has a son who could have become a priest) is true at some world w.
(18), in turn, is true if and only if
(19) It is possible that, for some some individual x, ‘Sxp & Px’ (i.e., the proposition x is a son of Wojtyla and x could have become a priest) is true at some world w,
which, in turn, is true if and only if
(20) It is possible that, for some some individual x, ‘Sxp’ (i.e., the proposition x is a son of Wojtyla) is true at some world w and, it is possible that, for some world u, ‘Px’ (i.e., the proposition x is a priest) is true at u.
Thus, all that Fine’s account requires in its analyses of (9) is the possibility that certain propositions exist -- notably, singular propositions (and, in particular, world propositions) that don’t exist in fact but would exist if certain individuals did, as would be the case, e.g., if the pope were to have a son. Unlike Adams account, then, Fine’s wears its fully intensional character on its sleeve. It abandons the idea that ordinary modal operators such as "possibly" and "necessarily" can, in general, be analyzed as extensional quantifiers over possible worlds. For some occurrences of those operators -- those in (9), for instance -- are ineliminable.

Problems with this Account

Objections to world propositions are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.


McMichael [1983a] has proposed an actualist semantics that avoids the objections to haecceities raised against Plantinga and both the loss of compositionality objection and the iterated modalities objection raised against Adams. Like Adams, McMichael rejects haecceities. However, like Plantinga, McMichael introduces a class of actualist surrogates for possibilia, which he calls roles. McMichael’s account builds on a very rich and elaborate theory of relations, and it is necessary to lay out at least some of its basic concepts in order to understand the account.

For McMichael, a primitive logical relation of inclusion can hold between properties and relations. Because it is a primitive, it cannot be defined, but, intuitively, in the case of properties, the idea is that one property P includes another Q just in case, necessarily, anything that has P has Q. Thus, the property being red includes the property being colored. Again, intutively once again, one binary relation R includes another R just in case, necessarily, for any objects x and y, if x bears R to y, then x bears R to y. So, for example,the conjunctive relation being both a child and an heir of includes the relation being a child of.

Inclusion can also hold between an n+1-place relation and an n-place relation, relative to one of the argument places of the former.[6] Thus, in particular, a 2-place relation Q can include a property P, relative to one of its two argument places: intuitively, Q includes P, relative to its first argument place, if and only if, necessarily, whenever two things a and b stand in the relation Q, a exemplifies P. And if the inclusion were with respect to the second argument place, of course, it would be b that exemplifies P. So, for example, the child-of relation, relative to its first argument place, includes the property being a child of something; whenever any object a bears the child-of relation to some object b, a has the existentially quantified property being a child of something. Similarly, child-of includes the property being a parent of something relative to its second argument place.

A (unary) role is just a "purely qualitative" property of a certain sort, where (as described in more detail in the supplementary document on Qualitative Essences) a purely qualitative property is a property that "involves" no particular individuals. Thus, such properties as being a philosopher and being someone’s mother or maternal aunt are purely qualitative, while being a student of Quine and being Johnson’s mother or a friend of Boswell are not. Given this, McMichael defines a property P to be a unary role if (i) it is exemplifiable, (ii) it is purely qualitative, and (iii) for any purely qualitative property Q, either P includes Q or P includes the complement -Q of Q. A role is thus a complete (nonmodal) "characterization" of the way something could be, qualitatively. Intuitively, then, the role of a given object is a "conjunction" of all of the purely qualitative, nonconjunctive properties the object exemplifies. Thus, for example, Socrates’ role includes the properties being a philosopher, being snub-nosed, being the most famous teacher of a famous philosopher, being condemned to death and so on.[7] The notion of role generalizes in a natural way to all n-place relations, including, notably, propositions (i.e., 0-place relations) and binary (i.e., 2-place) relations. Thus, the binary role that Boswell bears to Johnson is, intuitively, a conjunction of all of the purely qualitative, nonconjunctive binary relations that Boswell bears to Johnson.[8] As one might suspect, it can be shown on McMichael’s theory that a binary role includes a unique unary role with respect to each of its argument places. In particular, the binary role that Boswell bears to Johnson includes Boswell’s unary role relative to its first argument place and Johnson’s relative to its second.

Now (as also explained in the supplementary document on Qualitative Essences), Adams [1979] has argued persuasively that no purely qualitative property, no matter how complex, can serve as an individual essence for a contingent being. Hence, in general, roles -- being purely qualitative -- are not individual essences. Rather, they are general properties that are (in general) exemplifiable by different things (though not necessarily things in the same possible world). Because of this, none of the objections to Plantinga’s haecceities is relevant to roles, as the fact that haecceities are individual essences lies at the heart of those objections. At the same time, McMichael is able to provide a semantics for (9) that does not run afoul of the iterated modalities objection. The basic trick is to

...alter the criterion for deciding what an individual might have done. Instead of saying that what an individual might have done is what he does in some possible world, let us say that what an individual might have done is what any such individual does in some possible world....To determine what Socrates might have done, we don’t look for worlds in which he appears, but instead we look for roles in possible worlds which are accessible to Socrates’ actual role. If one of these roles includes a certain property, then that property is one Socrates could have had; otherwise, it is not [ibid, 73].
Thus, a little more formally, where F is the property being foolish, and s is Socrates, a simple modal sentence such as
(21) Possibly, Socrates is foolish (Fs)
is true just in case some unary role accessible to the actual role of Socrates includes the property of being foolish.

Similar to Plantinga’s semantics, then, quantifiers do not range over individuals, but over roles. This enables McMichael to avoid the iterated modalities objection and provide a compositional semantics for our iterative paradigm (9). Specifically, (9) is true if and only if

(22) Some role R accessible to Wojtyla’s actual role Rk includes the property being a parent of someone (i.e., the property [y xCxy] expressed by the open formula ‘xCxy’).
(22) captures the idea that an individual such as Wojtyla could have been a parent. Adams, of course, got this far in his account of (9). But, unlike Adams, with roles at his disposal, McMichael can continue his analysis of (9) and unpack the existentially quantified formula ‘xCxy’. Specifically, (22) holds if and only if
(23) Some binary role S that includes the child-of relation (i.e., the relation expressed by the atomic formula ‘Cxy’) also includes, relative to its second argument place, the role R (a role accessible to Wojtyla’s actual role Rk).
That is, in accordance with McMichael’s recursive definition of truth, (23) unpacks the quantified formula ‘xCxy’ in terms of the child-of relation that is expressed by the embedded atomic formula ‘Cxy’. Specifically, the truth of (9) consists in the existence of a binary role S that includes the child-of relation and, relative to its second argument place, a role accessible to Wojtyla’s role Rk. Note that, being a binary role, S also includes a unique role relative to its first argument place. And because it includes the child-of relation and, relative to its second argument place, a role R accessible to Wojtyla’s role Rk, S will include, relative to its first argument place, a role R that can only be exemplified by a child of whatever exemplifies R, i.e., a child of such an object as Wojtyla.

To capture the intuition that no such child could be identical to any actually existing thing, then, McMichael can simply deny that the role R that would be exemplified by such a child is accessible to the role of any actually existing thing.

Problems with this Account

Objections to McMichael’s role theory are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

Dispensing with Worlds

A rather different approach to the possibilist challenge is broached by Menzel [1990]. This approach is clarified and refined by Ray [1995], and a very similar approach is elaborated in great formal and philosophical detail by Chihara [1998]. For ease of reference, call this the "no-worlds" approach.

All non-skeptical approaches to modality agree that Kripke models provide key insights into the meaning of our modal discourse and the nature of modal reality. However, as we have seen, the naive "intended" model of Kripke semantics leads to possibilism. The standard actualist response -- following David Lewis, "ersatzism" -- has been to define actualistically acceptable notions of possible worlds and possible individuals to serve as replacements for the elements of W and D in the naive intended model, thereby (or so it is argued) preserving the semantical and metaphysical benefits of Kripke models while avoiding ontological commitment to possibilia. As just seen above, however, ersatzism is still problematic. By contrast, the no-worlds account does not attempt to identify worlds as acceptable abstract entities of some sort. Rather, the notion of a possible world is abandoned altogether.

To get at the idea, note first that the notion of an intended Tarski model makes perfectly good sense for a formalization of nonmodal discourse about the actual world. To illustrate, suppose we have a given a piece of nonmodal discourse about a certain event, a baseball game, say. Suppose now we formalize that discourse in a nonmodal language L; that is, for each referring expression in the disourse (e.g., ‘Mark McGwire’, ‘second inning’, etc.), there is a unique constant of L, and for every simple verb phrase in the discourse (‘is a home run’, ‘is out’, ‘relieves’, etc.) there is a unique predicate of L. Then we can form a Tarski model ML for L whose domain consists of the actual objects that the speakers are talking about in the discourse (fans, players, equipment, etc.) and which interprets the predicates of L so that they are true of exactly those (n-tuples of objects in the domain that are in the extension of the corresponding verb phrases of the discourse. In this way we form the intended model of L, the piece of the world that it is intended to be about.

According to proponents of the no-worlds account, the fallacy of both ersatzism and possibilism is the inference that things must work in largely the same way with regard to Kripke models. A Kripke model is basically an indexed collection of Tarski models. Just as there is an intended Tarski model for a nonmodal language L constructed from the actual world, the accounts above infer that, for a given formalization L of modal discourse, there must be an intended Kripke model constructed from all possible worlds. And, depending on one’s tolerance for possibilia, this leads either to possibilism or one of its ersatz variations.

For no-worlders, the modal upshot of a Kripke model lies in its structure rather than its content. The specific elements of a Kripke model are irrelevant. Rather, under appropriate conditions, it is the form of a Kripke model alone that tells us something about modal reality. Specifically, the model theory of Kripke semantics is retained in the no-world account. The elements of a model are irrelevant; it is easiest just to take them to be pure sets, or ordinal numbers, or some other type of familiar mathematical object. Consequently, there can be no notion of a single intended model, because, for every model, there are infinitely many others that are structurally isomorphic to it, and structure is all that matters on the no-worlds account. In place of intended models, the no-worlds account offers the notion of an intended* model. To get at the idea, suppose one has an intended Tarski model M of the actual world, a model that actually contains entities in the world and assigns extensions to predicates that reflect the actual meanings of the adjectives and verb phrases those predicates formalize. Now replace the objects in that model with abstract objects of some ilk to obtain a new model M that is structurally isomorphic to M. Then M also models the world under a mapping, or embedding, that takes each element e of M to the element e that it replaced in M. We can thus justifiably think of M as a sort of intended model because, even though it doesn’t necessary contain anything but pure sets (or some other type of mathematical object), under an appropriate embedding it models the actual world no less than M. To distinguish models like M that require a nontrivial embedding into the world from models like M, we call the former intended* models.

For no-worlders, the notion of an intended* Tarski model is all that is needed for modeling the modal facts. From these a notion of an intended* Kripke model can be defined. Assume that L is a model language that formalizes some range of modal discourse about the world. Roughly, then, an intended* Kripke model M is simply a Kripke model such that (i) the Tarski model indexed by the distinguished index w0 is an intended* Tarski model of the actual world, (ii) every Tarski model M in M could have been an intended* model of the world, that is, the world could have been as M represents it, and (iii) necessarily, some Tarski model in M is an intended* model of the world, i.e., no matter how the world had been, there would have been an intended* Tarski model of it in M.[9]

Truth in a model on the the no-worlds account is defined as usual as truth at the distinguish index w0 of the model, hence, a sentence is true simpliciter if and only if it is true at the distinguished index of some (hence, any) intended* Kripke model. Given the definition of an intended* model, it follows that a modal formula ‘’ is true if and only if, for some intended* Kripke-model M, is true in some Tarski-model M in M, that is, in some Tarski-model M in M that could have been an intended* model of the world. Thus, in particular, (1) is true if and only if

(20) For some intended* Kripke model M, there is a Tarski model M in M in which ‘xAx’ is true,
that is, given the definition of an intended* Kripke model, if and only if there is a Tarski model M that could have been an intended* Tarski model and such that, if it had been, there would have been Aliens.

For the no-worlder, then, intended* Kripke models adequately represent the modal structure of the world simply by virtue of their own modal properties. Since Kripke models are constructed entirely out of existing objects, the semantics for modal logic requires no distinction between what is actual and what is possible. It therefore conforms with the thesis of actualism, but does so without the elaborate metaphysical apparatus of the ersatzers.

Problems with this Account

Objections to the no-world account are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.

An Actualist Interpretation of the Simplest QML

Finally, we consider to a new form of actualism that has been proposed recently. This form of actualism refocuses our attention on the Simplest Quantified Modal Logic (SQML) and offers a way to reinterpret this formalism to eliminate its apparent commitment to possibilia. On this form of actualism, the truth conditions for the modal claim "There might have been Aliens" are just what they appear to be, namely, that in some possible world, there is an object that is an Alien at that world. However, these truth conditions do not commit us to possibilia. Instead, the new form of actualism is based on the idea that these truth conditions are committed only to the existence of nonconcrete objects which might have been Aliens. This theory has been recently put forward by Linsky and Zalta ([1994] and [1996]) and Williamson ([1998] and [1999]), though Williamson simply eschews the word ‘actual’ in his formulation of the theory. These philosophers claim that the nonconcrete objects in question are not Aliens, but instead have the modal property of possibly being an Alien. In other words, modal claims such as "There might have been Aliens" (formalized, once again, as (1)) can be interpreted to be true in virtue of the actual existence of objects that are nonconcrete (and hence which are not Aliens) at our world, but which are Aliens (and hence concrete) at some other possible world. Thus, the nonconcrete objects involved in the truth conditions of such modal claims do exist and are actual. To say this is to use a sense of "existence" and "actual" similar to that used by Platonists when they claim that mathematical objects exist and are actual. However, unlike mathematical objects, which are nonconcrete at every possible world, the actual objects required by the truth of modal claims are only contingently nonconcrete -- they are nonconcrete at our world but concrete at other possible worlds. Similarly, ordinary concrete objects (like the rocks, tables, planets, etc., of our world) are assumed to be contingently concrete--they are concrete at some worlds (including ours) and not at other worlds.

With this basic idea in hand, the ‘new actualists’ point out that our ordinary modal claims can be given a straightforward analysis by: (1) regimenting ordinary modal discourse in the simplest possible way using the language and logic of the simplest quantified modal logic (SQML) and (2) semantically interpreting SQML by appealing to contingently concrete objects and contingently nonconcrete objects (both of which are assumed to actually exist). This interpretation, the new actualist argues, reveals that the problematic theorems of SQML -- most notably, the Barcan Formula (BF), the Converse Barcan Formula (CBF), and the Necessary Existence (NE) theorems -- do not contradict our modal intuitions, once those intuitions are understood in terms of a more subtle conception of the abstract/concrete distinction.

To see why, reconsider the definition and discussion of SQML and reexamine BF. From the fact that there might have been aliens (xAx), BF requires only that there exist something that could have been an Alien (xAx). But, it was asked, doesn’t this contradict the intuition (described at the very outset) that nothing could have been an Alien? Here, the new actualist argues that this intuition is true only when it is properly understood as the intuition that no concrete object could have been an Alien. Recall our thought experiment at the outset, which asked us to "imagine a race of beings that is very different from any life-form that actually exists anywhere in the universe; different enough, in fact, that no actually existing thing could have been an Alien, any more than a given gorilla could have been a fruitfly." The relevant intuition, that nothing could have been an Alien, is grounded in the fact that when we look around us and examine all the concrete objects that there are, we note that none of those objects could have been an Alien (just as no gorilla could have been a fruitfly). However, this leaves room to claim that there exist (contingently) nonconcrete objects which could have been Aliens. According to the new actualist, these contingently nonconcrete objects have been overlooked because (1) no one has correctly drawn the proper distinction between contingently nonconcrete and necessarily nonconcrete objects, and (2) everyone has assumed that concreteness was an essential property of concrete objects (see below).

Thus, according to the new actualist, whenever there is a true claim of the form "There might have been something which is F", BF doesn’t imply anything that is incompatible with our modal intuitions. For the conclusion that it forces, namely, that "There exists something that might have been an F", does not require us to suppose that there is some concrete object which might have been F. BF need only require the existence of contingently nonconcrete objects which might have been F. Similar reasoning is developed in the supplementary document Why CBF and NE Are Harmless Consequences of SQML.

Once it is seen that BF requires only contingently nonconcrete objects and not possibilia, it is natural to reconceive the nature of concrete objects. According to new actualism, ordinary concrete objects are concrete at some worlds and not at others. This is the sense in which they are contingent objects. Traditional actualists have described worlds where these objects are not concrete as worlds where these objects don’t exist or have any kind of being. By contrast, the new actualist just rests with their nonconcreteness at the world in question, and argues that that should suffice to account for our intuition that such objects "are not to be found" in such a world. Moreover, new actualists reconceive the idea of an "essential" property of a concrete object. Instead of saying that Socrates is essentially a person because he is a person in every possible world where he exists, new actualists say that he is essentially a person because he is a person in every world where he is concrete.

So by recognizing the existence of contingently nonconcrete objects and by reconceiving both the contingency of concrete objects and the notion of an essential property in what seem to be harmless ways, there appears to be a way to interpret SQML so that it is consistent with actualism. Specifically, in the "intended" new actualist model, everything in the one domain D both exists and is actual. D includes: (1) (contingently) concrete objects, (2) necessarily concrete objects (if there are such), (3) contingently nonconcrete objects, and (4) necessarily nonconcrete objects (if there are such). All of these objects in D are said to actually exist.

New actualism appears to lack the awkward features that plague other forms of actualism. In contrast to Kripke’s System, the metalanguage does not quantify over possibilia and object language quantifiers can range over everything the metalanguage quantifiers range over. In contrast to Prior’s approach, no distinction between two kinds of necessity is needed. In contrast to Plantinga’s haecceitism, there is an objectual interpretation of quantified modal logic which is expressible in terms of the basic notion of an individual exemplifying properties (rather than in the less basic terminology of coexemplification). In contrast to Adams’ world story approach, there is no puzzle arising from propositions which do not exist at worlds where their constituents do not exist--propositions and their constituents exist necessarily, though the contingent constituents of propositions fail to be concrete at some worlds. In particular, all objects exist necessarily for the new actualist, and hence can be quantified over relative to any possible world, it should be clear that the new actualist has no trouble with the semantics of iterated modalities. (Details are provided in the supplementary document New Actualism and Iterated Modalities for the interested reader.) In contrast to Fine’s world propositions approach, object language modal operators are fully interpreted in terms of worlds alone, and hence can be thought of as providing a genuine semantical analysis of the modal operators -- although, admittedly, this will depend on a conception of worlds that does not itself involve a primitive notion of propositional possibility. At the least, the account provides as much explanatory power as Fine’s in a manner that is both ontologically simpler and more direct. In contrast to McMichael’s role theory, modal truths such as "Socrates might have been a carpenter" are genuinely about Socrates. In contrast to the no-worlders, the idea that necessary truth is truth in all possible worlds is preserved. The intended interpretation has in its domain all of the objects that actually exist and extensions can be distributed to properties at the various worlds in just the way that is required by the modal facts. Modal discourse, then, is directly about an independent reality free of possibilia, and the relationship between the formal language and the intended model exactly mirrors the relationship between ordinary modal language and the reality that grounds modal truth.

Problems with this Account

Objections to new actualism are addressed in the document Problems with the Actualist Accounts.


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Related Entries

logic: classical | logic: free | logic: modal | possible objects | possible worlds | Prior, Arthur | state of affairs

Copyright © 2000 by
Christopher Menzel

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First published: June 16, 2000
Content last modified: June 16, 2000