Notes to Philosophy of Theater

1. Richard Wollheim presented a similar problem about painting, namely the problem of the relation between the marks of paint on the surface or support for the painting and the content represented by means of those marks. Wollheim called the problem “twofoldness,” and it consists in the claim that viewers of paintings examine a painting by being aware of those two levels of describable features of paintings. It is the problem, rather than Wollheim’s solution (“seeing-in”) that is of interest here (Wollheim 1998).

2. Reference is made in this paragraph to the choices made by theater “companies.” Nothing hangs on the idiom. Many companies are organized in such a way that directors make these decisions. Playwrights may make some of the decisions in advance. And a few companies are set up to make those decisions collectively. This paragraph sets out some of the tasks that must be undertaken in order to strive for relevant artistic achievements; and for that purpose, it does not matter how those decisions are made.

3. Whether any of the choices performers make—especially perhaps the stylistic choices—need to be made consciously or can be made non-consciously is a separate, but major issue. Judging by the current literature on styles in art, one could reasonably assume that most philosophers seem to favor the idea that the choices to which spectators react should be consciously made by performers (Walton 1979; Robinson 1981; Meskin 2013. But this is not at all the uniform view of philosophers or psychologists (Carroll 1986b; Hamilton 2007; Suhler and Churchland 2009; Aneja et al. 2017).

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James R. Hamilton <>

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