Before the terrorist attacks in the United States on 11 September 2001, the subject of terrorism did not loom large in philosophical discussion. Philosophical literature in English amounted to a few monographs and a single collection of papers devoted solely, or largely, to questions to do with terrorism. Articles on the subject in philosophy journals were few and far between; neither of the two major philosophy encyclopedias had an entry. The attacks of September 11 and their aftermath put terrorism on the philosophical agenda: it is now the topic of numerous books, journal articles, special journal issues, and conferences.
While social sciences study the causes, main varieties, and consequences of terrorism and history traces and attempts to explain the way terrorism has evolved over time, philosophy focuses on two fundamental—and related—questions. The first is conceptual: What is terrorism? The second is moral: Can terrorism ever be morally justified?
Philosophers have offered a range of positions on both questions. With regard to the problem of defining terrorism, the dominant approach seeks to acknowledge the core meaning “terrorism” has in common use. Terrorism is understood as a type of violence. Many definitions highlight the experience of terror or fear as the proximate aim of that violence. Neither violence nor terror is inflicted for its own sake, but rather for the sake of a further aim such as coercion, or some more specific political objective. But there are also definitions that sever the conceptual connection of terrorism with violence or with terror. With regard to the moral standing of terrorism, philosophers differ both on how that is to be determined and what the determination is. Consequentialists propose to judge terrorism, like everything else, in light of its consequences. Nonconsequentialists argue that its moral status is not simply a matter of what consequences, on balance, terrorism has, but is rather determined, whether solely or largely, by what it is. Positions on the morality of terrorism range from justification when its consequences on balance are good, or when some deontological moral requirements are satisfied, to its absolute, or almost absolute, rejection.
Philosophers working in applied philosophy have also sought to complement the discussions of terrorism in general with case studies—studies of the role and rights and wrongs of terrorism in particular conflicts, such as “the Troubles” in Northern Ireland (George 2000; Simpson 2004; Shanahan 2009), the Israeli-Palestinian conflict (Gordon and Lopez 2000; Primoratz 2006; Kapitan 2008; Law (ed.) 2008), and the bombing of German cities in World War II (Grayling 2006, Primoratz 2010).
- 1. The conceptual issue
- 1.1 “Terrorism” from the French Revolution to the early 21st century
- 1.2 Two core traits of terrorism and two types of definition
- 2. The moral issue
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The history of terrorism is probably coextensive with the history of political violence. The term “terrorism”, however, is relatively recent: it has been in use since late 18th century. Its use has repeatedly shifted in some significant respects. Moreover, in contemporary political discourse the word is often employed as a polemical term whose strong emotional charge occludes its somewhat vague descriptive meaning. All this tends to get in the way of sustained rational discussion of the nature and moral standing of terrorism and the best ways of coping with it.
When it first entered public discourse in the West, the word “terrorism” meant the reign of terror the Jacobins imposed in France from the fall of 1793 to the summer of 1794. Its ultimate aim was the reshaping of both society and human nature. That was to be achieved by destroying the old regime, suppressing all enemies of the revolutionary government, and inculcating and enforcing civic virtue. A central role in attaining these objectives was accorded to revolutionary tribunals which had wide authority, were constrained by very few rules of procedure, and saw their task as carrying out revolutionary policy rather than meting out legal justice of the more conventional sort. They went after “enemies of the people”, actual or potential, proven or suspected; the law on the basis of which they were operating “enumerated just who the enemies of the people might be in terms so ambiguous as to exclude no one” (Carter 1989: 142). The standard punishment was death. Trials and executions were meant to strike terror in the hearts of all who lacked civic virtue; the Jacobins believed that was a necessary means of consolidating the new regime. This necessity provided both the rationale of the reign of terror and its moral justification. As Robespierre put it, terror was but “an emanation of virtue”; without it, virtue remained impotent. Accordingly, the Jacobins applied the term to their own actions and policies quite unabashedly, without any negative connotations.
Yet the term “terrorism” and its cognates soon took on very strong negative connotations. Critics of the excesses of the French Revolution had watched its reign with horror from the start. Terrorism came to be associated with drastic abuse of power and related to the notion of tyranny as rule based on fear, a recurring theme in political philosophy.
In the second half of the 19th century, there was a shift in both descriptive and evaluative meaning of the term. Disillusioned with other methods of political struggle, some anarchist and other revolutionary organizations, and subsequently some nationalist groups too, took to political violence. They had come to the conclusion that words were not enough, and what was called for were deeds: extreme, dramatic deeds that would strike at the heart of the unjust, oppressive social and political order, generate fear and despair among its supporters, demonstrate its vulnerability to the oppressed, and ultimately force political and social change. This was “propaganda by the deed”, and the deed was for the most part assassination of royalty or highly placed government officials. Unlike the Jacobins’ reign of terror, which operated in a virtually indiscriminate way, this type of terrorism—as both advocates and critics called it—was largely employed in a highly discriminate manner. This was especially true of Russian revolutionary organizations such as People’s Will or Socialist Revolutionary Party (SR): they held that it was morally justified to assassinate a government official only if his complicity in the oppressive regime was significant enough for him to deserve to die, and the assassination would make an important contribution to the struggle. Their violence steered clear of other, uninvolved or insufficiently involved persons. Some instances of “propaganda by the deed” carried out by French and Spanish anarchists in the 1880s and 1890s were indiscriminate killings of common citizens; but that was an exception, rather than the rule. The perpetrators and some of those sympathetic to their cause claimed those acts were nevertheless morally legitimate, whether as retribution (exacted on the assumption that no member of the ruling class was innocent) or as a means necessary for the overthrow of the unjust order. Accordingly, in their parlance, too, the term “terrorism” implied no censure. When used by others, it conveyed a strong condemnation of the practice.
The terrorism employed by both sides in the Russian Revolution and Civil War was in important respects a throwback to that of the Jacobins. The government set up in Russia by the victorious Bolsheviks was totalitarian. So was the Nazi rule in Germany. Both sought to impose total political control on society. Such a radical aim could only be pursued by a similarly radical method: by terrorism directed by an extremely powerful political police at an atomized and defenseless population. Its success was due largely to its arbitrary character—to the unpredictability of its choice of victims. In both countries, the regime first suppressed all opposition; when it no longer had any opposition to speak of, political police took to persecuting “potential” and “objective opponents”. In the Soviet Union, it was eventually unleashed on victims chosen at random. Totalitarian terrorism is the most extreme and sustained type of state terrorism. As Hannah Arendt put it, “terror is the essence of totalitarian domination”, and the concentration camp is “the true central institution of totalitarian organizational power” (Arendt 1958: 464, 438). While students of totalitarianism talked of terrorism as its method of rule, representatives of totalitarian regimes, sensitive to the pejorative connotation of the word, portrayed the practice as defense of the state from internal enemies.
However, state terrorism is not the preserve of totalitarian regimes. Some non-totalitarian states have resorted to terrorism against enemy civilians as a method of warfare, most notably when the RAF and USAAF bombed German and Japanese cities in World War II (see Lackey 2004). Those who designed and oversaw these campaigns never publicly described them as “terror bombing”, but that was how they often referred to them in internal communications.
After the heyday of totalitarian terrorism in the 1930s and 1940s, internal state terrorism continued to be practiced by military dictatorships in many parts of the world, albeit in a less sustained and pervasive way. But the type of terrorism that came to the fore in the second half of the 20th century and in early 21st century is that employed by insurgent organizations. Many movements for national liberation from colonial rule resorted to it, either as the main method of struggle or as a tactic complementing guerrilla warfare. So did some separatist movements. Some organizations driven by extreme ideologies, in particular on the left, took to terrorism as the way of trying to destroy what they considered an unjust, oppressive economic, social and political system. This type of terrorism is, by and large, indiscriminate in its choice of target: it attacks men and women of whatever political (or apolitical) views, social class, and walk of life; young and old, adults and children. It shoots at people, or blows them up by planting bombs, in office buildings, markets, cafes, cinemas, places of religious worship, on buses or planes, or in other vulnerable public places. It also takes people hostage, by hijacking planes and in other ways.
As “terrorism” has by now acquired a very strong pejorative meaning, no-one applies the word to their own actions or to actions and campaigns of those they sympathize with. Insurgents practicing terrorism portray their actions as struggle for liberation and seek to be considered and treated as soldiers rather than terrorists or criminals. They often depict their enemy—the alien government, or the agencies of the social, political and economic system—as the “true terrorists”. For them, the test of terrorism is not what is done, but rather what the ultimate aim of doing it is. If the ultimate aim is liberation or justice, the violence used in order to attain it is not terrorism, whereas the violence aiming at maintaining oppression or injustice, or some of the “structural violence” embodying it, is. On the other hand, governments tend to paint all insurgent violence with the brush of “terrorism”. Government spokespersons and pro-government media typically assume that terrorism is by definition something done by non-state agents, and that a state can never be guilty of terrorism (although it can sponsor terrorist organizations). For them, the test of terrorism is not what is done, but who does it. When a state agency uses violence, it is an act of war, or reprisal, or defense of the security of the state and its citizens; when an insurgent group does the same, it is terrorism. Under these circumstances, one person’s terrorist is indeed another’s freedom fighter, and public debate about terrorism is largely conducted at cross purposes and to little effect. Attempts of the United Nations to propose a definition of “terrorism” that could be accepted by all states and embedded in international law so far have been frustrated by the same sort of relativism. Islamic countries would accept no definition that allowed national liberation movements in the Middle East and Kashmir to be portrayed as terrorist, whereas Western countries would accept no definition that allowed for state agencies to be guilty of terrorism.
The evaluative meaning of “terrorism” has shifted considerably more than once. So has its descriptive meaning, but to a lesser degree. Whatever else the word may have meant, its ordinary use over more than two centuries has typically indicated two things: violence and intimidation (the causing of great fear or terror, terrorizing). The dominant approach to the conceptual question in philosophical literature reflects this. Terrorism is usually understood as a type of violence. This violence is not blind or sadistic, but rather aims at intimidation and at some further political, social, or religious goal or, more broadly, at coercion.
That is how (political) “terrorism” is defined by Per Bauhn in the first philosophical book-length study in English:
The performance of violent acts, directed against one or more persons, intended by the performing agent to intimidate one or more persons and thereby to bring about one or more of the agent’s political goals (Bauhn 1989: 28).
Another good example of a mainstream definition is provided in C.A.J. Coady’s article on terrorism in the Encyclopedia of Ethics:
The tactic of intentionally targeting non-combatants [or non-combatant property, when significantly related to life and security] with lethal or severe violence … meant to produce political results via the creation of fear (Coady 2001: 1697).
Yet another example is the definition proposed by Igor Primoratz:
The deliberate use of violence, or threat of its use, against innocent people, with the aim of intimidating some other people into a course of action they otherwise would not take (Primoratz 2013: 24).
These definitions put aside both the question of who the actor is and the question of what their ultimate objectives are, and focus on what is done and what the proximate aim of doing it is. They present terrorism as a way of acting that could be adopted by different agents and serve various ultimate objectives (most, but perhaps not all of them, political). It can be employed by states or by non-state agents, and may promote national liberation or oppression, revolutionary or conservative causes (and possibly pursue some nonpolitical aims as well). One can be a terrorist and a freedom fighter; terrorism is not the monopoly of enemies of freedom. One can hold high government or military office and design or implement a terrorist campaign; terrorism is not the preserve of insurgents. In this way much of the relativism concerning who is and who is not a terrorist that has plagued contemporary public debate (see 1.1.4 above) can be overcome.
Beyond concurring that violence and intimidation constitute the core of terrorism, the definitions quoted above differ in several respects. Does only actual violence count, or do threats of violence also qualify? Must terrorist violence be directed against life and limb, or does violence against (some) property also count? Does terrorism always seek to attain some political goal, or can there be non-political (e.g. criminal) terrorism? All these points are minor. There is also one major difference: while Coady and Primoratz define terrorism as violence against non-combatants or innocent people, respectively, Bauhn’s definition includes no such restriction. Definitions of the former type can be termed “narrow”, and those of the latter sort “wide”. Philosophical literature on terrorism abounds in instances of both types.
Should we adopt a wide or a narrow definition? A wide definition encompasses the entire history of “terrorism” from the Jacobins to the present, and is more in accord with current ordinary use. A narrow definition departs from much ordinary use by restricting terrorist violence to that directed at non-combatants or innocent persons. Thus it leaves out most of 19th century “propaganda by the deed” and political violence perpetrated by Russian revolutionaries which they themselves and the public called terrorist.
For these reasons, historians of terrorism normally work with a wide definition, and social scientists do so much of the time. But philosophers may well prefer a narrow definition. They focus on the moral standing of terrorism and need a definition that is particularly helpful in moral discourse. Morally speaking, surely there is a difference—for some, a world of difference—between planting a bomb in a government building and killing a number of highly placed officials of (what one considers) an unjust and oppressive government, and planting a bomb in a tea shop and killing a random collection of common citizens, including children. While both acts raise serious moral issues, these issues are not identical, and running them together under the same heading of “terrorism” will likely hamper, rather than help, discerning moral assessment.
Narrow definitions are revisionary, but (unlike those discussed in the next section) not implausibly so. They focus on the traits of terrorism that cause most of us to view the practice with deep moral repugnance: (i) violence (ii) against non-combatants (or, alternatively, against innocent people) for the sake of (iii) intimidation (and, on some definitions, (iv) coercion). In highlighting (ii), they relate the issue of terrorism to the ethics of war and one of the fundamental principles of just war theory, that of non-combatant immunity. They help distinguish terrorism from acts of war proper and political assassination, which do not target non-combatants or common citizens. It does not matter very much whether the victims of terrorism are described as “non-combatants” or “innocent people”, as each term is used in a technical sense, and both refer to those who have not lost their immunity against lethal or other extreme violence by being directly involved in, or highly responsible for, (what terrorists consider) insufferable injustice or oppression. In war, these are innocent civilians; in a violent conflict that falls short of war, these are common citizens.
Talk of involvement of individuals and groups in injustice or oppression raises the question: is the injustice or oppression at issue, and thus the standing of those implicated in it, to be determined by some objective criteria, or from the point of view of those who resort to violence? Coady chooses the former option. He approaches terrorism from the standpoint of just war theory and its principle of noncombatant immunity. “Combatants” is a technical term designating agents of aggression or, more broadly, “dangerous wrongdoers” or “agents of harm”; they are legitimate targets of potentially lethal violence. All others are noncombatants, and enjoy immunity from such violence (Coady 2004). This approach may not be difficult to apply in war, where the wrong or harm at issue is either aggression that needs to be repelled, or systematic and large-scale violations of human rights that provide the ground for humanitarian intervention. Issues of injustice or oppression that arise in an internal conflict that falls short of war, however, tend to be highly contentious: what some consider an imperfect, but basically morally legitimate political and social order, others may see as the epitome of injustice and oppression that must be overthrown, if need be by violence. Under such circumstances, when a highly placed political official is killed by insurgents, that may be characterized (and condemned) by many as an act of terrorism, while the insurgents and those sympathetic to their struggle may reject this characterization and portray (and justify) the killing as political assassination.
In order to avoid this kind of relativism, Primoratz puts forward a view that in one important respect takes on board the standpoint of the terrorist. The direct victims of terrorism are innocent in the sense of not being responsible, on any credible understanding of responsibility and liability, for the injustice or oppression the terrorists fight against—not responsible at all, or at least not responsible to the degree that makes them liable to be killed or maimed on that account. The injustice or oppression at issue need not be real; it may be merely alleged (by the terrorists). Being responsible for a merely alleged great injustice or oppression is enough for losing one’s immunity against violence, as far as the type of immunity and innocence relevant to defining terrorism is concerned. According to the traditional version of just war theory one does not lose immunity against acts of war only by fighting in an unjust war, but by fighting in any war. Similarly, one does not lose immunity against political violence only by holding office in or implementing policies of a gravely unjust government, but by holding office in or implementing policies of any government: as King Umberto I of Italy said after surviving an assassination attempt, such risk comes with the job. Members of these two classes are not considered innocent and morally protected against violence by those attacking them; the latter view their acts as acts of war proper or of political assassination, respectively. If the terrorists subscribe to a credible view of responsibility and liability, then, when they attack common citizens, they attack people innocent from their own point of view, i.e., innocent even if we grant the terrorists their assessment of the policies at issue. (This is not to say that those who consider a government to be gravely unjust have a moral license to kill its officials, but only that if they do so, that will not be terrorism, but rather political assassination. We can still condemn their actions if we reject their judgment of the policies at issue, or if we accept that judgment, but believe that they should have opposed those policies by nonviolent means. But we will not be condemning their actions qua terrorism.)
On this account, not only real, but also merely alleged injustice or oppression counts in determining the innocence of the victims and deciding which acts are acts of terrorism; thus such decisions are not hostage to endless debates about the moral status of contested policies. Nevertheless, a residue of relativity remains. The account presupposes a certain understanding of responsibility and liability: a person is responsible for a state of affairs only by virtue of that person’s voluntary, i.e., informed and free, act or omission that has a sufficiently strong connection with that state of affairs, and thereby becomes liable to some proportionately unfavorable response. Provided the terrorists accept some such understanding of responsibility and liability, they kill and maim people they themselves must admit to be innocent. To be sure, some militant organizations resort to violence which we perceive as terrorist, yet object to the label. They profess a view of responsibility and liability based on extremely far-fetched connections between states of affairs and human choices and actions, and argue that entire social classes or nations are responsible for certain policies and practices and all their members are liable to be attacked by deadly violence (for more on this, see 2.1 below). Such arguments can only be regarded as preposterous. We should insist on viewing their actions as terrorist, although they reject this description. It is not clear how this residue of relativity could be removed (Primoratz 2013: 16–21).
Some object to defining “terrorism” as violence against non-combatants or innocent persons. They argue that doing so runs together the question of the nature of terrorism and that of its moral status, and begs the moral issue by making terrorism unjustified by definition. We should rather keep these questions separate, and take care not to prejudge the latter by giving a wrong answer to the former. What is needed is a morally neutral definition of terrorism, and that means a wide one (Corlett 2003: 114–20, 134–35; Young 2004: 57). But it is doubtful that “terrorism” can be defined in some morally untainted way. The wide definitions these philosophers adopt contain the word “violence”, which is itself morally loaded. A narrow definition is not completely morally neutral, as violence against the innocent is clearly morally wrong. But what is clear is that such violence is prima facie wrong. The definition implies a general presumption against terrorism, not its sweeping moral condemnation in each and every instance, whatever the circumstances and whatever the consequences of desisting from it. The definition does not rule out that in certain circumstances it might not be wrong, all things considered. Ethical investigation is not preempted: a particular case of terrorism still needs to be judged on its merits.
Another way of settling the issue of wide vs. narrow definition is offered by Georg Meggle. He adopts a wide definition of terrorism, and goes on to distinguish two different types: terrorism in the strong sense, which deliberately, recklessly, or negligently harms innocent people, and terrorism in the weak sense, which does not. Obviously, the moral assessment of the two types of terrorism is going to be significantly different (Meggle 2005).
The vast majority of cases almost anyone without an ax to grind would want to classify as “terrorism” exhibit the two traits implied in ordinary use and highlighted by mainstream philosophical definitions such as those quoted above: violence and intimidation. But philosophical literature also offers definitions that leave out one or the other core component.
Some seek to sever the connection between terrorism and violence. Carl Wellman defines terrorism as “the use or attempted use of terror as a means of coercion”. Terrorism is often associated with violence, but that is because violence is a very effective means of intimidation. Yet “violence is not essential to terrorism and, in fact, most acts of terrorism are nonviolent” (Wellman 1979: 250–51). The last claim seems false on any non-circular interpretation. There may be many acts generally considered terrorist that do not involve actual violence, but are meant to intimidate by threatening it; but that is not enough to support the notion of “non-violent terrorism”, which seems odd. So does Wellman’s example of “classroom terrorism”: a professor threatens to fail students who submit their essays after the due date, causes panic in class, and thereby engages in terrorism.
Robert E. Goodin offers a similar account, emphasizing the political role of terrorism: terrorism is “a political tactic, involving the deliberate frightening of people for political advantage” (Goodin 2006: 49). This, he claims, is the distinctive wrong terrorists commit. Whereas on Wellman’s account one can commit an act of terrorism without either engaging in or threatening violence, merely by making a threat in order to intimidate, on Goodin’s account one need not even make a threat: one acts as a terrorist by merely issuing a warning about the acts of others that is meant to intimidate. This, too, seems arbitrary, although it makes sense as a step in an argument meant to show that “if (or insofar as) Western political leaders are intending to frighten people for their own political advantage, then (to that extent) they are committing the same core wrong that is distinctively associated with terrorism” (Goodin 2006: 2).
It has also been suggested that terrorism need not be understood as inducing terror or fear. According to Ted Honderich, terrorism is best defined as “violence, short of war, political, illegal and prima facie wrong” (Honderich 2006: 88). This definition might be thought problematic on several counts, but the idea of “terrorism” without “terror” seems especially odd. The two are connected etymologically and historically, and this connection is deeply entrenched in current ordinary use. Intimidation is not the morally salient trait of terrorism (pace Goodin), but it is one of its core traits that cause most of us to condemn the practice. We might consider severing the connection if Honderich offered a good reason for doing so. But he supports his highly revisionary definition by the puzzling claim that to define terrorism as violence meant to intimidate is to imply that terrorism is particularly abhorrent and thereby “in effect … invite a kind of prima facie approval or tolerance of war” (Honderich 2006: 93).
Can terrorism be morally justified? There is no single answer to this question, as there is no single conception of what terrorism is. If we put aside definitions that depart too much, and for no compelling reason, from the core meaning of “terrorism” (such as those cited in 1.2.3), we still need to decide whether the question assumes a wide or a narrow understanding of terrorism. A narrow conception of terrorism seems to be better suited to ethical investigation (1.2.2). Moreover, philosophers who work with a wide definition typically hold that terrorism that targets non-combatants or innocent persons is much more difficult to justify than “selective” terrorism which attacks only those who cannot plausibly claim innocence of the injustice or oppression at issue (and which accordingly does not count as “terrorism” on a narrow definition of the term). The present discussion therefore focuses on terrorism understood as violence against innocent civilians or common citizens, intended to intimidate and thereby to achieve some further (political) objective or, more broadly, to coerce.
One might try to justify some acts or campaigns of violence of this kind in two ways. One could argue that the victims may be non-combatants or common citizens, but nevertheless are not innocent of the wrongs the terrorists are fighting against. Alternatively, one could concede the innocence of the victims and argue that attacks on them are nevertheless justified, either by their consequences on balance, or by some deontological considerations.
If the former line of argument is successful, will it prove too much? In showing that an instance of violence was justified because those targeted were not really innocent, we will have shown that the act or campaign of violence at issue was actually not a case of terrorism. This may be merely a matter of semantics. There is a much more damaging objection. A terrorist act is characteristically the killing or injuring of a random collection of people who happen to be in a certain place at a certain time. Arguments to the effect that those people are not innocent of the wrongs the terrorist fights against will therefore have a very wide reach, and accordingly will be based on some simplistic conception of collective responsibility. These arguments will be of the sort offered, for example, by the 19th century anarchist Emile Henry. He planted a bomb at the office of a mining company which, if it had exploded, would have killed or injured a number of people who did not work for the company, but lived in the same building. He also planted a bomb in a café that did go off, injuring twenty people, one of whom later died of his injuries. At his trial, Henry explained: “What about the innocent victims? […] The building where the Carmeaux Company had its offices was inhabited only by the bourgeois; hence there would be no innocent victims. The whole of the bourgeoisie lives by the exploitation of the unfortunate, and should expiate its crimes together” (Henry 1977: 193). When commenting on the second attack, he said:
Those good bourgeois who hold no office but who reap their dividends and live idly on the profits of the workers’ toil, they also must take their share in the reprisals. And not only they, but all those who are satisfied with the existing order, who applaud the acts of the government and so become its accomplices … in other words, the daily clientele of Terminus and other great cafés! (Henry 1977: 195)
This is an utterly implausible view of responsibility and liability. It claims that all members of a social class—men and women, young and old, adults and children—are liable to be killed or maimed: some for operating the system of exploitation, others for supporting it, and still others for benefiting from it. Even if, for the sake of argument, we grant the anarchist’s harsh moral condemnation of capitalist society, not every type and degree of involvement with it can justify the use of extreme violence. Giving the system political support, or benefiting from it, may be morally objectionable, but is surely not enough to make one liable to be blown to pieces.
Another, more recent example, is provided by Osama Bin Laden. In an interview in the aftermath of the attacks on September 11, 2001 he said:
The American people should remember that they pay taxes to their government and that they voted for their president. Their government makes weapons and provides them to Israel, which they use to kill Palestinian Muslims. Given that the American Congress is a committee that represents the people, the fact that it agrees with the actions of the American government proves that America in its entirety is responsible for the atrocities that it is committing against Muslims (Bin Laden 2005: 140–141).
This, too, is a preposterous understanding of responsibility and liability. For it claims that all Americans are eligible to be killed or maimed: some for devising and implementing America’s policies, others for participating in the political process, still others for paying taxes. Even if, for the sake of argument, we grant Bin Laden’s severe condemnation of those policies, not every type and degree of involvement with them can justify the use of lethal violence. Surely voting in elections or paying taxes is not enough to make one fair game.
Attempts at justification of terrorism that concede that its victims are innocent seem more promising. They fall into two groups, depending on the type of ethical theory on which they are based.
Adherents of consequentialism judge terrorism, like every other practice, solely by its consequences. Terrorism is not considered wrong in itself, but only if it has bad consequences on balance. The innocence of the victims does not change that. This is an instance of a general trait of consequentialism often highlighted by its critics, for example in the debate about the moral justification of legal punishment. A standard objection to the consequentialist approach to punishment has been that it implies that punishment of the innocent is justified, when its consequences are good on balance. This objection can only get off the ground because consequentialism denies that in such matters a person’s innocence is morally significant in itself.
Those who consider terrorism from a consequentialist point of view differ in their assessment of its morality. Their judgment on terrorism depends on their view of the good to be promoted by its use and on their assessment of the utility of terrorism as a means of promoting it. There is room for disagreement on both issues.
Kai Nielsen approaches questions to do with political violence in general and terrorism in particular as a consequentialist in ethics and a socialist in politics. The use of neither can be ruled out categorically; it all depends on their utility as a method for attaining morally and politically worthwhile objectives such as “a truly socialist society” or liberation from colonial rule. “When and where [either] should be employed is a tactical question that must be decided … on a case-by-case basis … like the choice of weapon in a war” (Nielsen 1981: 435). Nielsen has a wide definition of terrorism, but his examples show that the innocence of the victims of terrorism makes no difference to its justification—that is, that his conclusions apply to terrorism in both the wide and narrow sense. In his view,
terrorist acts must be justified by their political effects and their moral consequences. They are justified (1) when they are politically effective weapons in the revolutionary struggle and (2) when, everything considered, there are sound reasons for believing that, by the use of that type of violence rather than no violence at all or violence of some other type, there will be less injustice, suffering and degradation in the world than would otherwise have been the case (Nielsen 1981: 446).
Historical experience, in Nielsen’s view, tells us that terrorism on a small scale, used as the sole method of struggle in order to provoke the masses into revolutionary action, is ineffective and often counterproductive. On the other hand, terrorism employed in conjunction with guerrilla warfare in a protracted war of liberation may well prove useful and therefore also justified, as it did in Algeria and South Vietnam. (For an earlier statement of the same view, see Trotsky 1961: 48–59, 62–65.)
Nicholas Fotion also uses a wide definition of terrorism. He, too, is a consequentialist (although some of his remarks concerning the innocence of many victims of terrorism might be more at home in nonconsequentialist ethics). But he finds standard consequentialist assessments of terrorism such as Nielsen’s too permissive. If some types of terrorism are justifiable under certain circumstances, such circumstances will be extremely rare. Terrorists and their apologists do not perform the requisite calculations properly. One problem is the “higher good” to be promoted by terrorism: more often than not, it is defined in ideological terms, rather than derived from settled preferences or interests of actual people. But for the most part Fotion discusses the issue of means. If a terrorist act or campaign is to be justified instrumentally, it must be shown (1) that the end sought is good enough to justify the means, (2) that the end will indeed be achieved by means of terrorism, and (3) that the end cannot be achieved in any other way that is morally and otherwise less costly. Terrorists not only, as a matter of fact, fail to discharge this burden; Fotion argues that, with regard to terrorism that victimizes innocent people, it cannot be discharged. All direct victims of terrorism are treated as objects to be used—indeed, used up—by the terrorist. But
in being treated as an object, the innocent victim is worse off than the (alleged) guilty victim. Insofar as the latter is judged to have done a wrong, he is thought of as a human. […] For the terrorist the innocent victim is neither a human in this judgmental sense nor a human in the sense of simply having value as a human being. Of course the terrorist needs to pick a human being as a victim … because [that] brings about more terror … But this does not involve treating them as humans. Rather, they are victimized and thereby treated as objects because they are humans (Fotion 1981: 464).
In reply, terrorists can claim that they advisedly sacrifice valued human beings for a higher good. But for this claim to carry any conviction, they would have to show that they have no alternative. Yet, Fotion argues, they always have the alternative of taking on the opponent’s military establishment, and often also have the option of going after government officials responsible for the wrongs they object to, instead of attacking innocent persons. That kind of terrorism may sometimes be justified, whereas terrorism that targets innocent people never is.
Within a nonconsequentialist approach to morality, terrorism is considered wrong in itself, because of what it is, rather than only because (and insofar as) its consequences are bad on balance. But this is not to say that this approach leaves no room whatever for morally justifying certain acts or campaigns of terrorism. Indeed, nonconsequentialist discussions of terrorism also present a range of positions and arguments.
A nonconsequentialist might try to justify an act or campaign of terrorism in one of two ways. One might invoke some deontological considerations, such as justice or rights, in favor of resorting to terrorism under certain circumstances. Alternatively, one might argue that the obvious, and obviously very weighty, considerations of rights (of the victims of terrorism) and justice (which demands respect for those rights) may sometimes be overridden by extremely weighty considerations of consequences—an extremely high price that would be paid for not resorting to terrorism. For the rejection of consequentialism is of course not tantamount to denying that consequences of our actions, policies, and practices matter in their moral assessment; what is denied is the consequentialists’ claim that only consequences matter.
Virginia Held operates with a broad notion of terrorism, but her justification of terrorism is meant to apply to terrorism that targets common citizens. Her discussion of the subject focuses on the issue of rights. When rights of a person or group are not respected, what may we do in order to ensure that they are? On one view, known as consequentialism of rights, if the only way to ensure respect of a certain right of A and B is to infringe the same right of C, we shall be justified in doing so. Held does not hold that such trade-offs in rights with the aim of maximizing their respect in a society are appropriate. Yet rights sometimes come into conflict, whether directly or indirectly (as in the above example). When that happens, there is no way we can avoid comparing the rights involved as more or less stringent and making certain choices between them. That applies to the case of terrorism too. Terrorism obviously violates some human rights of its victims. But its advocates claim that in some circumstances a limited use of terrorism is the only way of bringing about a society where human rights of all will be respected.
Even when this claim is true, that is not enough to make resort to terrorism justified. But it will be justified if an additional condition is met: that of distributive justice. If there is a society where the human rights of a part of the population are respected, while the same rights of another part of the population are being violated; if the only way of changing that and ensuring that human rights of all are respected is a limited use of terrorism; finally, if terrorism is directed against members of the first group, which up to now has been privileged as far as respect of human rights is concerned—then terrorism will be morally justified. This is a justification in terms of distributive justice, applied to the problem of violations of human rights. It is more just to equalize the violations of human rights in a stage of transition to a society where the rights of all are respected, than to allow that the group which has already suffered large-scale violations of human rights suffer even more such violations (assuming that in both cases we are dealing with violations of the same, or equally stringent, human rights). The human rights of many are going to be violated in any case; it is more just, and therefore morally preferable, that their violations should be distributed in a more equitable way (Held 2008).
It might be objected that in calling for sacrificing such basic human rights as the right to life and to bodily security of individual victims of terrorism for the sake of a more just distribution of violations of the same rights within a group in the course of transition to a stage where these rights will be respected throughout that group, Held offends against the principles of separateness of persons and respect for persons (Primoratz 1997: 230–31). In response, Held argues that
to fail to achieve a more just distribution of violations of rights (through the use of terrorism if that is the only means available) is to fail to recognize that those whose rights are already not fairly respected are individuals in their own right, not merely members of a group … whose rights can be ignored.
An argument for achieving a just distribution of rights violations is not necessarily about groups; it can be an argument about the rights of individuals to fairness (Held 2008: 89–90). (For further objections to Held’s argument, see Steinhoff 2007: 125–30; Nath 2011.)
In Held’s justification of terrorism, it is justice that requires that inescapable violations of human rights be more evenly distributed. There is a different way of allowing for the use of terrorism under certain circumstances within a nonconsequentialist approach to the ethics of violence. It could be argued that, as far as justice and rights are concerned, terrorism (or, in Held’s terminology, the kind of terrorism that targets the innocent) is never justified. Furthermore, considerations of justice and rights carry much greater weight than considerations of good and bad consequences, and therefore normally trump the latter in cases of conflict. However, in exceptional circumstances considerations concerning consequences—the price of not resorting to terrorism—may be so extremely weighty as to override those of justice and rights.
Michael Walzer offers an argument along these lines in his discussion of “terror bombing” of German cities in World War II. In early 1942, it seemed that Britain would be defeated by Germany and that its military could not prevail while fighting in accordance with the rules of war. Britain was the only remaining obstacle to the subjugation of most of Europe by the Nazis. That was “an ultimate threat to everything decent in our lives, an ideology and a practice of domination so murderous, so degrading even to those who might survive, that the consequences of its final victory were literally beyond calculation, immeasurably awful” (Walzer 2000: 253). Thus Britain was facing a “supreme emergency”: an (a) imminent threat of (b) something utterly unthinkable from a moral point of view. In such an emergency—a case of the “dirty hands” predicament that so often plagues political action (see Walzer 1973)—one may breach a basic and weighty moral principle such as civilian immunity, if that is the only hope of fending off the threat. So for more than three years, the RAF, later joined by the USAAF, deliberately devastated many German cities, killed about 600,000 civilians and seriously injured another 800,000 in an attempt to terrorize the German people into forcing their leadership to halt the war and surrender unconditionally. By early 1943 it was clear that Germany was not going to win the war, and all subsequent terror bombing lacked moral justification. But in its first year, in Walzer’s view, the terror bombing of Germany was morally justified as a response to the supreme emergency Britain was facing. Walzer then expands the notion of supreme emergency to apply to a single political community facing the threat of extermination or enslavement, and eventually to a single political community whose “survival and freedom” are at stake. For “the survival and freedom of political communities—whose members share a way of life, developed by their ancestors, to be passed on to their children—are the highest values of international society” (Walzer 2000: 254).
Here we have two different conceptions of supreme emergency. The threat is imminent in both, but the nature of the threat differs: it is one thing to suffer the fate the Nazis had in store for peoples they considered racially inferior, and another to have one’s polity dismantled. By moving back and forth between these two types of supreme emergency under the ambiguous heading of threat to “the survival and freedom of a political community”, Walzer seeks to extend to the latter the moral response that might be appropriate to the former. Yet whereas genocide, expulsion, or enslavement of an entire people might be thought a moral disaster that may be fended off by any means, its loss of political independence is, at most, a political disaster. If a polity to be dismantled lacks moral legitimacy, its demise may well be a moral improvement. But even if a polity does have moral legitimacy, a threat to its “survival and freedom” falls short of “an ultimate threat to everything decent in our lives”. If so, its military cannot be justified in waging war on enemy civilians in order to defend it. (On supreme emergencies generally see, for instance, Statman 2006.)
There is another, less permissive position constructed along similar lines, but based on a more austere view of what counts as a moral disaster that might justify resort to terrorism. Contrary to what many fighters against social or economic oppression, colonial rule, or foreign occupation believe, evils of such magnitude that they can justify indiscriminate killing and maiming of innocent people are extremely rare. Not every case of oppression, foreign rule, or occupation, however morally indefensible, amounts to a moral disaster in the relevant sense. Nor does every imminent threat to “the survival and freedom of a political community” qualify, contrary to what Walzer has argued. However, if an entire people is subjected to extermination, or to an attempt at “ethnically cleansing” it from its land, then it is facing a true moral disaster and may properly consider terrorism as a method of struggle against such a fate. In view of their enormity and finality, extermination and “ethnic cleansing” of an entire people constitute a category apart. To be sure, resorting to terrorism in such a case will be morally justified only if there are very good grounds for believing that terrorism will succeed where nothing else will: in preventing imminent extermination or “ethnic cleansing”, or stopping it if it is already under way. Cases where both conditions are met will be extremely rare. Indeed, history may not offer a single example. But that does not mean that that no act or campaign of terrorism could ever satisfy these conditions and thus turn out to be justified. Accordingly, terrorism is almost absolutely wrong (Primoratz 2013: chapter 6).
Both the “supreme emergency” and the “moral disaster” view will justify a resort to terrorism only when that is the only way to deal with the emergency, or to prevent the disaster, respectively. Just how certain must we be that terrorism will indeed achieve the goal, while no other method will? One might argue that when in extremis, we cannot apply stringent epistemic standards in deciding how to cope—indeed, if we cannot really know what will work, we must take our chances with what might. This is Walzer’s view: in such a predicament, we must “wager” the crime of terrorism against the evil that is otherwise in store for us. “There is no option; the risk otherwise is too great” (Walzer 2000: 259–260). It may be objected that this position highlights the enormity of the threat, while failing to give due weight to the enormity of the means proposed for fending off the threat—the enormity of terrorism, of deliberately killing and maiming innocent people. When that is taken into account, the conclusion may rather be that even in extremis, if terrorism is to be justified, the reasons for believing that it will work and that nothing else will must be very strong indeed.
Some hold that terrorism is absolutely wrong. This position, too, comes in different versions. Some philosophers work with a wide definition of terrorism, and argue that under certain circumstances “selective” terrorism that targets only those seriously implicated in the wrongs at issue may be justified (Corlett 2003, Young 2004). This seems to suggest that terrorism which is not selective in this way—that is, terrorism in the narrow sense—is never justified. Yet this does not follow: there is still room for arguing that terrorism of the latter type can be justified by further considerations, such as those of “supreme emergency” or “moral disaster”.
Per Bauhn does not leave it at that. He attempts to show that terrorism that targets non-combatants or common citizens can never be justified by deploying a slightly amended version of Alan Gewirth’s ethical theory. Freedom and safety are fundamental prerequisites of action and therefore must be accorded paramount weight. The need to protect them generates a range of rights; the right pertinent here is “an absolute right not to be made the intended victims of a homicidal project” all innocent persons have (Gewirth 1981: 16). When the absolute status of this right is challenged by invoking supreme emergency or moral disaster, Bauhn argues that there is a moral difference between what we are positively and directly causally responsible for, and what we are causally responsible for only indirectly, by failing to prevent other persons from intentionally bringing it about. We are morally responsible for the former, but (except in certain special circumstances) not for the latter. If we refuse to resort to terrorism in order not to target innocent persons, and thus fail to prevent some other persons from perpetrating atrocities, it is only the perpetrators who will be morally responsible for those atrocities. Therefore we must refuse (Bauhn 1989: chapter 5).
Stephen Nathanson seeks to ground the absolute immunity of civilians or common citizens and the absolute prohibition of terrorism which it entails in a rule-consequentialist ethical theory (Nathanson 2010: 191–208). Adopting civilian immunity, rather than adopting any other rule regulating the matter or having no rule at all, is the best way to reduce the killing and destruction in armed conflict. Moreover, the best consequences will be achieved by adopting it as an absolute rule, rather than as a rule allowing for exceptions in supreme emergencies. The idea of supreme emergency is vague. The criteria for proffering supreme emergency exemptions are liable to be applied in arbitrary and subjective ways. Finally, there is the slippery slope argument: “permitting [departures from the rule of civilian immunity, including terrorism] even under the direst circumstances will lower the bar for justifying such acts … broadcast the message that such behavior may sometimes be justified and … thus lend its weight to increasing the use of such methods” (Nathanson 2010: 207).
However, one can adopt rule-consequentialism as one’s ethical theory and yet view the immunity of civilians or common citizens and the attendant prohibition of terrorism as very stringent, but not absolute moral rules. Thus Richard B. Brandt and Brad Hooker do not view this immunity as absolute. They argue that a set of moral rules selected because of the good consequences of their adoption should include a rule that allows and indeed requires one to prevent disaster even if that means breaking some other moral rule. Even such a stringent moral rule as the prohibition of deliberate use of violence against innocent people may be overridden, if the disaster that cannot be prevented in any other way is grave enough. (See Brandt 1992: 87–88, 150–51, 156–57; Hooker 2000: 98–99, 127–36). There is thus some convergence at the level of practical conclusions between their understanding of the immunity of civilians or common citizens and the “moral disaster” position outlined above (2.3.2).
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Thanks to Andrew Alexandra, Tony Coady, and Thomas Pogge for helpful comments on a draft of this article.