Notes to Herbert Spencer

1. J. B. Schneewind once told me that he had recently purchased “yards” of Spencer, underscoring how much Spencer wrote on so many diverse topics.

2. Spencer seems to owe to F. W. J. Schelling the notion that all species were subject to increasing individuation and to Karl Ernst Von Baer the idea that homogeneity invariably gives way to heterogeneity. See Michael Taylor’s Men Versus the State: Herbert Spencer and Late Victorian Individualism (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992) for a more thorough discussion of the continuities between Spencer’s theories of inorganic, organic and social evolution.

3. Prior to commencing The Principles of Sociology, Spencer published The Study of Sociology in 1873 much of which explores the various biases, such as class and religious, that typically taint all sociological investigation. He also issued the first volume of his Descriptive Sociology the same year which ran 15 volumes and was completed by later editors in 1934 long after Spencer died. The Descriptive Sociology is a massive catalogue of ethnological data, categorically systematized, from historically and geographically diverse societies. In The Division of Labor in Society, Emile Durkheim criticized Spencer for selecting random facts in defense of his sociological claims. See Herbert Spencer, An Autobiography (London: Williams and Norgate, 1904), vol. II, 374.

4. See Herbert Spencer, An Autobiography (London: Williams and Norgate, 1904), vol. II, 374, where Spencer says that his “whole system was at the outset, and has ever continued to be, a basis for a right rule of life…”

5. Durkheim also took Spencer to task for thinking that waning, narrow self-interest would someday make government unnecessary. In effect for Durkheim, stateless societies would be self-destructive prisoner dilemmas.

6. See J. D. Y. Peel, Herbert Spencer: The Evolution of a Sociologist (London: Heinemann, 1971), 84; Jonathan H. Turner, Herbert Spencer (Beverly Hills: Sage, 1985), 83 and Robert Carneiro and Robert Perrin, “Herbert Spencer’s Principles of Sociology: A Centennial Retrospective and Appraisal,” Annals of Science, 59 (2002), 233. Carneiro and Perrin, though, also say that Peel may “overstate” his case for contending that Spencer’s sociology and moral philosophy can be read independently of each other. (235).

7. Mark Francis, “Introduction” in Mark Francis and Michael W. Taylor (eds.), Herbert Spencer: Legacies (New York: Routledge, 2014), 13.

8. Peter J. Bower, “Herbert Spencer and Lamarckism” in Francis and Taylor, especially 204.

9. The latter essay was part of his exchange with Weismann.

10. James G. Kennedy, Herbert Spencer (Boston: Twayne Publishers, 1978), 101. Whether or not Spencer believed that societies were social organisms much like biological organisms has been a matter of controversy. In his late “The Relations of Biology, Psychology and Sociology,” Popular Science Monthly, 50 (1896), 169–70, he emphasizes that the analogy is not to be “taken as the basis for sociological interpretations” and that, as he had previously insisted in The Principles of Sociology, it was intended simply to underscore the “parallelism” of mutually dependent parts in both organisms and societies.

11. In his earlier, pre-evolutionary Social Statics (1851), Spencer explained ethical development, combining moral sense psychology and phrenology. See Weinstein, 1998: Ch. 2. Also see Young, 1970. For Lamarckism, see the entry on Lamarck on the The Victorian Web pages: Jean-Baptiste Lamarck. For phrenology, John van Wyhe, The History of Phrenology on the Web.

12. See, in particular, Hofstadter, 1955: 40–1, for an egregious misinterpretation of Spencer that runs together interpreting him as a social Darwinist and a proponent of traditional natural rights. For a more recent example that wrong-headedly attributes natural rights to Spencer, see Offer, (ed.), 1994: xxv–vi. Also see Spencer, vol. II, 1978: 195, for Spencer’s account of basic moral rights as emergent, indefeasible conventions. For an example of crude Darwinism in The Man Versus the State, see 113–4 where Spencer condemns poor law reform for compelling “diligent and provident” citizens “to pay that the good-for-nothings might not suffer.” Moreover, those “who are so sympathetic that they cannot let the struggle for existence bring on the unworthy the sufferings consequent on their incapacity or misconduct, are so unsympathetic that they can, deliberately, make the struggle for existence harder for the worthy, and inflict on them and their children artificial evils in addition to the natural evils they have to bear!” And for an example of more of the same in The Principles of Ethics, see vol. II: 409.

13. Spencer considered his letter of clarification to Mill important because he reprinted it partially in The Principles of Ethics and fully in An Autobiography (1904). In The Principles of Ethics, he adds that traditional utilitarians follow Bentham in wrongly failing to deduce from “fundamental principles, what conduct must be detrimental and what conduct must be beneficial” (vol. I: 92).

14. Also see the second footnote that Mill appended to the last chapter of Utilitarianism in response to Spencer’s letter of complaint where Mill says: “With the exception of the word ‘necessarily,’ I have no dissent to express from this [Spencer’s] doctrine; and (omitting that word) I am not aware that any modern advocate of utilitarianism is of a different opinion” (Mill, 1969: 258).

15. For Huxley’s accusation that Spencer’s moral reasoning is fallacious because it commends the “gladiatorial theory of existence,” see his controversial 1893 Romanes Lecture, “Evolutionary Ethics” in Huxley, 1929: 80–2. Also see Spencer’s “M. De Laveleye’s Error” in Spencer, 1898: 116.

16. Also see Sidgwick, 1880 and Sidgwick, 1902 for more of Sidgwick’s assessment of Spencer. For Spencer’s response to Sidgwick, see, for instance, Spencer, 1881 reprinted as “Appendix E” in Spencer, vol. II, 1978. Also see Weinstein, 2000 for Spencer’s undervalued role in Sidgwick’s thinking.

17. See especially, Sidgwick, 1907: 467ff.

18. For Sidgwick’s moral theory, see Schneewind, 1977. Also see the special issue of Utilitas, November, 2000 commemorating the hundredth anniversary of Sidgwick’s death.

19. See Sidgwick, 1902: 138 ff. for his rejection of Lamarckism. Sidgwick seems to have thought well of other aspects of Spencer’s sociological theory. Regarding Vol. II of The Principles of Sociology, Sidgwick writes that as a “useful essay towards the construction of scientific sociology, I do not know anything as good.” See A. S. Sidgwick and E. M. S. Sidgwick, Henry Sidgwick: A Memoir (London: Macmillan, 1906). D. G. Ritchie likewise rejected Spencer’s Lamarckism in an effort to overstate his differences with Spencer. Ritchie was an evolutionary, liberal utilitarian for whom, following Spencer, utilitarian practical reasoning superseded moral intuitionism as prudent “rational selection” replaced fortuitous natural selection as the mechanism driving social progress and well being. For Ritchie’s criticisms of Spencer, see especially Ritchie, “The Principles of State Interference” in Nicholson, ed., vol. 1, 1998. Also see Weinstein, 2002: 83–90 for a detailed discussion of the overlooked parallels between Spencer and Ritchie. See Den Otter, 1996: 93–8 for the received view of Spencer vs. Ritchie. And see Weinstein, 1998: 26–9, for Spencer’s critical exchange with August Weismann about the plausibility of Lamarckism.

20. Steiner’s admiration of Spencer for anticipating his own version of left libertarianism, see Hillel Steiner, “Land, Liberty and the Early Herbert Spencer,” History of Political Thought, 3 (1983). Also see Hillel Steiner, “Liberty and Equality,” Political Studies, 29 (1981).

21. For a historical overview of liberal utilitarianism’s critics, many of whom have recently repeated unknowingly what earlier ones had already said, see Weinstein, 1998: “Introduction.” For favorable accounts of Millian liberal utilitarianism, see Gray, 1983 and Riley, 1988. Gray has more recently recanted his defense of Mill in particular, and liberal utilitarianism in general, in Gray, “Mill’s and Other Liberalisms” in Gray, ed., 1989.

22. Spencer was clearly overly sanguine in expecting that social evolution was morally perfecting. But his perfectionism was grounded, as I have suggested, in his conviction that “empirical” utilitarianism was gradually and relentlessly giving way to “rational” utilitarianism, which his embrace of Lamarckism encouraged. If our acquired mental and moral talents were inheritable no less than our physical ones, then, so Spencer believed, succeeding generations would become increasingly motivated to act by utilitarian reasons as well as increasingly capable of making the requisite utilitarian calculations.

23. For Mill’s confused rendering of this infamous dictum, which has so often wrongly been attributed to Bentham thanks to Mill in part, see Mill, “Utilitarianism,” in Robson, ed., vol. X, 1969. Mill interprets this dictum inconsistently. One the one hand, he says that it means the “equal claim of everybody to happiness,” which implies that everyone rightfully deserves, as a matter of distributive justice, some equal measure of happiness. On the other hand, he claims that it “involves an equal claim to all the means of happiness,” which implies much less, namely that everyone rightfully deserves equal opportunities to make themselves happy. He also says in his long footnote about Spencer that this principle “may be more correctly described as supposing that equal amounts of happiness are equally desirable, whether felt by the same or by different persons.” This rendering is more disturbing, suggesting that only states of happiness have value whereas individuals have derivative value only as means to happiness. Only the second version is authentically liberal and fits comfortably with what Mill and Spencer mostly had in mind as liberal utilitarians.

Copyright © 2019 by
David Weinstein <weinstd@wfu.edu>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]