Simone Weil (1909–1943) philosophized on thresholds and across borders. Her persistent desire for truth and justice led her to both elite academies and factory floors, political praxis and spiritual solitude. At different times she was an activist, a pacifist, a militant, a mystic, and an exile; but throughout, in her inquiry into reality and orientation to the good, she remained a philosopher. Her oeuvre features deliberate contradiction yet demonstrates remarkable clarity. It is value centered and integrated but not systematic. It contains scattered notes of her translations of and commentaries on several ancient Greek texts, Pythagorean geometry formulae, and detailed accounts of her daily tasks within a factory; but her oeuvre is also composed of addresses to political, industrial, and religious leaders as well as pieces intended for university students, radical militants, industrial workers, and farm laborers. In both her life and her thought—itself an unstable distinction with respect to Weil—she is a philosopher of margins and paradoxes. In part because Weil’s thought defies categorization, the ways in which her ideas are taken up often say as much about her commentator as they do about her. She was taken as a prototype for Albert Camus’s révoltés and praised by André Gide as “the patron saint of all outsiders”. Giorgio Agamben described her conscience as “the most lucid of our times”, and Hannah Arendt claimed that perhaps only Weil treated the subject of labor “without prejudice and sentimentality”. Maurice Blanchot described Weil as an “exceptional figure” who offers “an example of certitude” in the modern world, and Iris Murdoch wrote of “a profoundly disciplined life behind her writings” that gave “an authority which cannot be imitated”. But Weil was also criticized by Leon Trotsky as a “melancholy revolutionary” and disparaged as “crazy” by Charles de Gaulle. These remarks, however, betray an irony of which Weil was well aware and about which she was deeply concerned near the end of her life, namely, that her person would be considered more than her thought. By categorically focusing on the philosophical concepts Weil articulated and developed, this entry attempts to present her philosophy while speaking to her concern.
Following Weil’s philosophical development, her central concepts are addressed under five categories: social-political philosophy, epistemology, ethics, metaphysical and religious philosophy, and aesthetics. The periodization employed is as follows: 1925–1934 (early), 1935–1939 (middle), 1939–1943 (late). It is important to note that, given Weil’s rejection of systematicity and development of concepts, these categories and periods introduce a degree of artifice into her thought. The conclusion of this entry reports on her reception among the Continental and Anglo-American traditions of philosophy.
- 1. Philosophical Development
- 2. Social-Political Philosophy
- 3. Epistemology
- 4. Ethics
- 5. Metaphysical and Religious Philosophy
- 6. Aesthetics
- 7. Reception and Influence
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Philosophical Development
Simone Weil was born in Paris on 3 February 1909. Her parents, both of whom came from Jewish families, provided her with an assimilated, secular, bourgeois French childhood both cultured and comfortable. Both Weil and her older brother André—himself a math prodigy, founder of the Bourbaki group, and a distinguished mathematician at the Princeton Institute for Advanced Study—studied at prestigious Parisian schools. Weil’s first philosophy teacher, at the Lycée Victor-Duruy, was René Le Senne; it was he who introduced her to the thesis—which she would maintain—that contradiction is a theoretical obstacle generative of nuanced, alert thinking. Beginning in October 1925, Weil studied at Henri IV Lycée in preparation for the entrance exams of the École Normale Supérieure. At Henri IV she studied under the philosopher and essayist Émile-Auguste Chartier (known pseudonymously as Alain), whose teacher was Jules Lageneau. Like Weil at this time, Alain was agnostic. In his classes he emphasized intellectual history: in philosophy this included Plato, Marcus Aurelius, Descartes, Spinoza, and Kant, and in literature, Homer, Aeschylus, Sophocles, and Euripides. Already sympathetic with the downtrodden and critical of French society, she gained the theoretical tools to levy critiques against her country and philosophical tradition in Alain’s class. There, employing paradox and attention through the form of the essay (it is important to note that none of her writings was published as a book in her lifetime), she began intentionally developing what would become her distinct mode of philosophizing. It is therefore arguable that she is part of the Alain/Lagneau line of voluntarist, spiritueliste philosophy in France.
In 1928 Weil began her studies at the École Normale. She was the only woman in her class, the first woman having been first admitted in 1917. In 1929–1930 she worked on her dissertation on knowledge and perception in Descartes, and having received her agrégation diploma, she served from late 1931 to mid-1934 as a teacher at lycées. Throughout this period, outside of her duties at each lycée where she instructed professionally, Weil taught philosophy to, lobbied for, and wrote on behalf of workers’ groups; at times, moreover, she herself joined in manual labor. In her early thinking she prized at once the first-person perspective and radical skepticism of Descartes, the class-based solidarity and materialist analysis of Marx, and the moral absolutism and respect for the individual of Kant. Drawing from each, her early work can be read as an attempt to provide, with a view toward liberty, her own analysis of the fundamental causes of oppression in society.
In early August 1932, Weil travelled to Germany in order to understand better the conditions fostering Nazism. German trade unions, she wrote to friends upon her return to France, were the single force in Germany able to generate a revolution, but they were fully reformist. Long periods of unemployment left many Germans without energy or esteem. At best, she observed frankly, they could serve as a kind of dead weight in a revolution. More specifically, by early 1933 Weil criticized the tendency of social organizations to engender bureaucracy, which elevated management and collective thinking over and against the individual worker. Against this tendency, she advocated for workers’ understanding the physical labor they performed within the context of the whole organizational apparatus. In “Reflections Concerning the Causes of Liberty and Social Oppression” (1934), Weil presented both a summation of her early thought and a prefiguring of central elements in her thematic trajectory. The essay employs a Marxian method of analysis that pays attention to the oppressed, critiques her own position as an intellectual, privileges manual labor, and demands precise and unorthodox individual thinking that unites theory and practice against collective clichés, propaganda, obfuscation, and hyper-specialization. These ideas would provide a theoretical framework for her idiosyncratic practice of philosophy. Near the end of her life she wrote in a notebook: “Philosophy (including problems of cognition, etc.) is exclusively an affair of action and practice” (FLN 362).
On 20 June, 1934, Weil applied for a sabbatical from teaching. She was to spend a year working in Parisian factories as part of its most oppressed group, unskilled female laborers. Weil’s “year of factory work” (which amounted, in actuality, to around 24 weeks of laboring) was not only important in the development of her political philosophy but can also be seen as a turning point in her slow religious evolution.
In Paris’s factories, Weil began to see and to comprehend firsthand the normalization of brutality in modern industry. There, she wrote in her “Factory Journal”, “[t]ime was an intolerable burden” (FW 225) as modern factory work comprised two elements principally: orders from superiors and, relatedly, increased speeds of production. While the factory managers continued to demand more, both fatigue and thinking (itself less likely under such conditions) slowed work. As a result, Weil felt dehumanized. Phenomenologically, her factory experience was less one of physical suffering per se, and more one of humiliation. Weil was surprised that this humiliation produced not rebellion but rather fatigue, docility. She described her experience in factories as a kind of “slavery”. On a trip to Portugal in August 1935, upon watching a procession to honor the patron saint of fishing villagers, she had her first major contact with Christianity and wrote that
the conviction was suddenly borne in upon [her] that Christianity is pre-eminently the religion of slaves, that slaves cannot help belonging to it, and [she] among others. (1942 “Spiritual Autobiography” in WFG 21–38, 26)
In comparison with her pre-factory “Testament”, we see that in her “Factory Journal” Weil maintains the language of liberty, but she moves terminologically from “oppression” to “humiliation” and “affliction”. Thus her conception and description of suffering thickened and became more personal at this time.
Weil participated in the 1936 Paris factory occupations and, moreover, planned on returning to factory work. Her trajectory shifted, however, with the advent of the Spanish Civil War. Critical of both civil and international war, on the level of geopolitics, she approved of France’s decision not to intervene on the Republican side. On the level of individual commitment, however, she obtained journalist’s credentials and joined an international anarchist brigade. On 20 August, 1936, Weil, clumsy and nearsighted, stepped in a pot of boiling oil, severely burning her lower left leg and instep. Only her parents could persuade her not to return to combat. By late 1936 Weil wrote against French colonization of Indochina, and by early 1937 she argued against French claims to Morocco and Tunisia. In April 1937 she travelled to Italy. Within the basilica Santa Maria degli Angeli, inside the small twelfth-century Romanesque chapel where St. Francis prayed, Weil had her second significant contact with Christianity. As she would later describe in a letter, “[S]omething stronger than I compelled me for the first time to go down on my knees” (WFG 26).
From 1937–1938 Weil revisited her Marxian commitments, arguing that there is a central contradiction in Marx’s thought: although she adhered to his method of analysis and demonstration that the modern state is inherently oppressive—being that it is composed of the army, police, and bureaucracy—she continued to reject any positing of revolution as immanent or determined. Indeed, in Weil’s middle period, Marx’s confidence in history seemed to her a worse ground for judgment than Machiavelli’s emphasis on contingency.
During the week of Easter 1938, Weil visited the Benedictine abbey of Solesmes from Palm Sunday to the following Tuesday. At Solesmes she had her third contact with Christianity: suffering from headaches, Weil found a joy so pure in Gregorian chant that, by analogy, she gained an understanding
of the possibility of living divine love in the midst of affliction. It goes without saying that in the course of these services the thought of the passion of Christ entered into [her] being once and for all. (WFG 26)
At Solesmes, she was also introduced to the seventeenth century poet George Herbert by a young Englishman she met there. She claimed to feel Christ’s presence while reciting Herbert’s poem “Love”. As she fixed her full attention on the poem while suffering from her most intense headache, Weil came to see that her recitation had the virtue of prayer, saying, “Christ himself came down and took possession of me” (WFG 27). Importantly, she thought God “in his mercy” had prevented her from reading the mystics until that point; therefore, she could not say that she invented her unexpected contact with Christ (WFG 27). These events and writings in 1936–1938 exemplify the mutually informing nature of solidarity and spirituality in Weil’s thought that began in August 1935.
After the military alliance of Germany and Italy in May 1939, Weil renounced her pacifism. It was not that she felt she was wrong in holding such a position before, but now, she argued, France was no longer strong enough to remain generous or merely defensive. Following the German Western offensive, she left Paris with her family in June 1940, on the last train. They settled eventually but temporarily in Marseilles, at the time the main gathering point for those attempting to flee France, and where Weil would work with the Resistance.
In Vichy France Weil took up a practice she had long sought, namely, to apprentice herself to the life of agricultural laborers. In addition, in Marseilles she was introduced to the Dominican priest Joseph-Marie Perrin, who became a close friend as well as a spiritual interlocutor, and through whom she began to consider the question of baptism. In an effort to help Weil find a job as an agricultural laborer, Perrin turned to his friend Gustave Thibon, a Catholic writer who owned a farm in the Ardéche region. Thus in Fall 1941 Weil worked in the grape harvest. Importantly, however, she was not treated like the rest of the laborers; although she worked a full eight hours per day, she resided and ate at the house of her employers. It is said that she carried Plato’s Symposium with her in the vineyards and attempted to teach the text to her fellow laborers.
In 1942 Weil agreed to leave France in part so her parents would be in a safe place (they would not leave without her, she knew), but principally because she thought she might be more useful for France’s war effort if she were in another country. Thus she went to New York via Morocco. In New York, as in Marseilles, she filled notebook after notebook with philosophical, theological, and mathematical considerations. New York, however, felt removed from the sufferings of her native France; the Free French movement in London felt one step closer to returning to France. In 1943 Weil was given a small office at 19 Hill Street in London. From this room she would write day and night for the next four months, sleeping around three hours each night. Her output in this period totaled around 800 printed pages, but she resigned from the Free French movement in late July (Pétrement 1973 [1976: xx]).
Weil died Tuesday, 24 August 1943. Three days later, the coroner pronounced her death a suicide—cardiac failure from self-starvation and tuberculosis. The accounts provided by her biographers tell a more complex story: Weil was aware that her fellow country-men and women in the occupied territory had to live on minimal food rations at this time, and she had insisted on the same for herself, which exacerbated her physical illness (Von der Ruhr 2006: 18). On 30 August she was buried at Ashford’s New Cemetery between the Jewish and the Catholic sections. Her grave was originally anonymous. For fifteen years Ashford residents thought it was a pauper’s.
2. Social-Political Philosophy
Always writing from the left, Weil continually revised her social-political philosophy in light of the rapidly changing material conditions in which she lived. However, she was consistent in her acute attention to and theorizing from the situation of the oppressed and marginalized in society.
Her early essays on politics, a number of which were posthumously collected by Albert Camus in Oppression et liberté (OL), include “Capital and the Worker” (1932), “Prospects: Are We Heading for the Proletarian Revolution?” (1933), “Reflections concerning Technology, National Socialism, the U.S.S.R., and certain other matters” (1933) and, most importantly, “Reflections concerning the Causes of Liberty and Social Oppression” (1934 in OL 36–117). In her early writings, Weil attempted to provide an analysis of the real causes of oppression so as to inform militants in revolutionary action. Her concern was that, without this analysis, a socially enticing movement would lead only to superficial changes in the appearance of the means of production, not to new forms of structural organization.
The division of labor or the existence of material privilege alone is not a sufficient condition for Weil’s concept of “oppression”. That is, she recognized that there are some forms of social relations involving deference, hierarchy, and order that are not necessarily oppressive. However, the intervention of the struggle for power—which she, following Hobbes, sees as an inexorable feature of human society—generates oppression.
[P]ower [puissance] contains a sort of fatality which weighs as pitilessly on those who command as on those who obey; nay more, it is in so far as it enslaves the former that, through their agency, it presses down upon the latter (“Reflections concerning the Causes of Liberty and Social Oppression”, OL 62).
Oppression, then, is a specific social organization that, as a consequence of the essentially unstable struggle for power, and principally the structure of labor, limits the individual from experiencing the world to the full extent of her or his full capability, a capability Weil describes as “methodical thinking” (pénsee méthodique). By divorcing the understanding from the application of a method, oppression, exercised through force, denies human beings direct contact with reality. Also informing her sense of oppression is her notion of “privilege”, which includes not only money or arms, but also a corpus of knowledge closed to the working masses that, thereby, engenders a culture of specialists. Privilege thus exacerbates oppression in modern societies, which are held together not by shared goals, meaningful relations, or organically developing communities, but through a “religion of power” (OL 69). In this way, both power and prestige contribute to a modern reversal of means and ends. That is, elements like money, technology, and war—all properly speaking “means”—are, through the workings of power, treated as “ends” worthy of furtherance, enhancement, and multiplication without limit.
In her early social-political thought Weil testified to what she called “a new species of oppression” (“Prospects”, OL 9), namely, the bureaucracy of modern industry. Both her anarchism and Marxian method of analysis influenced how she problematized revolutionary struggle: the problem lies in forming a social organization that does not engender bureaucracy, an anonymous and institutionalized manifestation of force. The oppression of modern bureaucracy, to which she responded through analysis and critique, includes clichéd, official and obscurantist language, professionalization—the “caste privileges” of intellectuals (“Technology, National Socialism, the U.S.S.R”, OL 34)— and a division of labor such that, in the case of most workers, labor does not involve, but in fact precludes, engaged thinking. Out of balance in this way, modern humans live as cogs in a machine: less like thinking individuals, and more like instruments crushed by “collectivities”. Collectivity—a concept that centrally comprises industry, bureaucracy, and the state (the “bureaucratic organization par excellence” [OL 109]), but that also includes political parties, churches, and unions—by definition quashes individual subjectivity.
Despite her critiques of oppression, prestige, and collectivity, in a polemical argument Weil is also critical of “revolution”, which for her refers to an inversion of forces, the victory of the weak over the powerful. This, she says, is “the equivalent of a balance whose lighter scale were to go down” (OL 74). “Revolution” in its colloquial or deterministic sense, then, has itself become an “opiate”, a word for which the laboring masses die, but which lies empty. For Weil, real revolution is precisely the re-organization of labor such that it subordinates the laborers neither to management (as in bureaucracy) nor to oppressive conditions (as in factory work). As she sees it, if revolution is to have meaning, it is only as a regulative, and not a positive, ideal (OL 53). In Weil’s adaptation of this Kantian notion, such a regulative ideal involves an attention to reality, e.g., to the present political and working conditions, to human conditions such as the struggle for power. Only thus can it provide a standard of analysis for action: the ideal allows for a dialectical relation between a revolutionary alternative and present praxis, which is always grounded in material conditions. Freedom, then, is a unity of thought and action. It is, moreover—and not unlike in Hegel’s conceptualization—a condition of balanced relations to and dependence on both others (who check our autonomy) and the world (which is limited and limiting). A freeing mode of production, as opposed to an alienating and oppressing one, would involve a relation to thinking and to others throughout the course of labor. When workers understand both the mechanical procedures and the efforts of other members of the collectivity, the collectivity itself becomes subject to individuals, i.e., means and ends are rightfully in a relation of equilibrium.
The ontology behind Weil’s notion of free labor draws on the Kantian emphasis on the individual as an end—especially, for Weil, in her or his capacity for thinking (with Plato, for whom knowing and doing are united). In addition, the teleology of labor in Weil’s philosophy corresponds with the thought of Hegel and Marx, and is in opposition to Locke: in the individual’s mixing with the material world, her interest lies in how this promotes liberty, rather than property. The uprooting Weil experienced in factory work introduced a shift in her conception of freedom: as she began to see the human condition as not just one of inexorable struggle, but of slavery, her notion of freedom shifted from a negative freedom from constraints to a positive freedom to obey. She referred to the latter, a particular kind of relational freedom, as “consent”. She concluded her “inventory of modern civilization” (OL 116) with a call to introduce play into the bureaucratic machine and a call to think as individuals, denying the “social idol” by “refusing to subordinate one’s own destiny to the course of history” and by taking up “critical analysis” (OL 117). In sum, by 1934 Weil pictured an ideal society, which she conceptualized as a regulative impossibility in which manual labor, understood and performed by thinking individuals, was a “pivot” toward liberty.
Weil’s “Factory Journal” from 1934–1935 suggests a shift in her social-political philosophy. During this period, her political pessimism deepened. In light of the humiliating work she conducted in the factories, her post-factory writings feature a terminological intensification: from “humiliation” and “oppression” to “affliction” (malheur), a concept informed by her factory experience of embodied pain combined with psychological agony and social degradation—and to which she would later add spiritual distress.
In 1936 Weil advanced her political commitments in ways that foreshadowed her later social-political thought. She continued to eschew revolution and instead to work toward reform, namely, greater equality in the factory through a shift from a structure of subordination to one of collaboration. In addition, in response to the outbreak of the Spanish Civil War, she argued against fascism while favoring—against the Communist position—French non-intervention. She was opposed to authoritarian logic, and she saw going to war as a kind of surrender to the logic of power and prestige inherent in fascism.
One must choose between prestige and peace. And whether one claims to believe in the fatherland, democracy, or revolution, the policy of prestige means war. (1936 “Do We Have to Grease Our Combat Boots”, FW 258)
Weil’s development of the concepts of power and prestige continued in her article “Let Us Not Start Another Trojan War” (1936, subtitled, and translated into English as, “The Power of Words” in SWA 238–258). Her thesis is that a war’s destruction is inversely proportional to the official pretexts given for fighting it. Wars are absurd, she argued (against Clausewitz), because “they are conflicts with no definable objective” (SWA 239). Like the phantom of Helen that inspired ten years of fighting, ideologies (e.g., capitalism, socialism, fascism), as well as capitalized words such as “Nation” and “State”, have taken on the role of the phantom in the modern world. Power relies on prestige—itself illusory and without limit because no nation thinks it has enough or is sure of maintaining its imagined glory, and in response ever increases its means to wage war—so as to appear absolute and invincible. In response to these forces, Weil prescribed distinguishing between the imaginary and the real and, relatedly, defining words properly and precisely. Taken together, these prescriptions amount to a critique of ideology and political rhetoric (a critique Weil articulated more fully in her later writings).
[W]hen a word is properly defined it loses its capital letter and can no longer serve either as a banner or as a hostile slogan; it becomes simply a sign, helping us to grasp some concrete reality or concrete objective, or method of activity. To clarify thought, to discredit the intrinsically meaningless words, and to define the use of others by precise analysis—to do this, strange though it may appear, might be a way of saving human lives. (SWA 242)
Further, Weil desired a kind of equilibrium, a balance between forces instead of an endless pursuit of an illusion of absolute stability. Following Heraclitus, she saw struggle as a condition of life. What is required of the thinking individual, in turn, is to distinguish between worthwhile conflict, such as class struggle, and illusions of prestige, such as war. In her middle period, then, Weil maintained the contrariety between reality, limit, and equilibrium on the one hand and imagination, limitlessness, and collectivity on the other. In her 1937 “Note on Social Democracy”, she defined politics as follows:
The material of the political art is the double perspective, ever shifting between the real conditions of social equilibrium and the movements of collective imagination. Collective imagination, whether of mass meetings or of meetings in evening dress, is never correctly related to the really decisive factors of a given social situation; it is always beside the point, or ahead of it, or behind it. (SE 152)
In her late period Weil provided an explication of the all-pervasive, indeed indiscriminate, concept of “force” in the essay “The Iliad or the Poem of Force” (1940 in SWA 182–215). It is important to note Weil’s locus of enunciation for this concept, temporally after the fall of France and spatially from a position of exile, including antisemitic marginalization, which is why the essay appeared in the December 1940 and January 1941 Cahiers du Sud under the anagrammatic pseudonym Emile Novis, taken up by Weil to avoid antisemitic confrontation and censorship. This essay was not only the most widely read of Weil’s pieces during her lifetime, but it was also her first essay to appear in English, translated by Mary McCarthy and published in Dwight Macdonald’s magazine Politics in 1945 (November, pp. 321–330).
In her essay on the Iliad—a text Roberto Esposito calls “a phenomenology of force” (Esposito 1996 [2017: 46])—Weil further develops an understanding of force initially presented in her earlier, unfinished essay “Reflections on Barbarism” (1939): “I believe that the concept of force must be made central in any attempt to think clearly about human relations” (quoted in Pétrement 1973 [1976: 361]). The protagonist of the Iliad, Weil writes in an original reading, is not Achilles or Hector, but force itself. Like her concept of “power” in her early writings, “force” reifies and dehumanizes no matter if one wields or undergoes it. Further, force includes not only coercion, but also prestige, which is to say that it has a social element. Two important implications follow. First, on the level of the individual, each “personality” (la personne) is informed by social values and thereby features the operations of force through accidental characteristics, such as the name of the family into which one is born or the embodied features that are considered physically attractive at a certain place, in a certain society, at a certain time. Second, on the level of the collectivity, force can destroy not only bodies, but also values and cultures, as is the case, Weil is at pains to point out, in French colonialism. In her mid-to-late writings, then, Weil saw neither Marx’s notion of class nor Hegel’s self-development of Geist, but force itself, as the key to history. She presents this concept as twofold: as, “in its grossest and most summary form”, “the force that kills”, and, more unpredictably in its effects, as a specific kind of violence “that does not kill just yet”, though
[i]t will surely kill, it will possibly kill, or perhaps it merely hangs, poised and ready, over the head of the creature it can kill, at any moment, which is to say at every moment. (SWA 184–185)
Weil’s concept of force, then, is also a development from Hobbes and Hegel: it names that which renders the individual a slave.
It was in London (1942–1943), during her work for the Free French, that Weil articulated her most robust late social-political philosophy. Her concepts of “labor” and “justice” thickened as she moved further toward Christianity and—against her early emphasis on the individual—toward the social. Weil’s pièces d’occasion from this time period include “Draft for a Statement of Human Obligations” (1943), written in response to de Gaulle’s State Reform Commission in its drafting of a new Declaration of the Rights of Man and Citizen, as well as “Note on the General Suppression of Political Parties” (1943), written because the Free French was considering recognizing political parties. In this piece Weil argues for the complete abolition of political parties. Drawing on Rousseau’s concept of the general will, Weil contends that political parties subdue the independent, individual wills of which the general will is derivative and on which democracy depends. Most important from this period was her major work The Need for Roots (L’enracinement), which Weil called her second “magnum opus” (SL 186), and which Albert Camus published posthumously in 1949, with Gallimard, as the first of 11 volumes of Weil’s he would promote.
Weil wrote additional essays in London, the most conceptually important of which was “La Personne et le sacré” (1942–1943, translated into English as “Human Personality”), in which she critiques “rights” as reliant on force and poses as counter-terms “obligation” and “justice”. She distinguishes between two conceptions of justice: natural (hence social and contingent) and supernatural (hence impersonal and eternal). The Need for Roots (1943 NR) adds “needs of the soul” as another counter-balance to rights. Overall, Weil presents not a law-based or rights-based, but a compassion-based morality, involving obligations to another that are discernible through attention, centered on and evolving toward a supernatural justice that is not of the world, but that can be in it. As a departure from Kant, and through Plato, whom Weil “came to feel… was a mystic” (“Spiritual Autobiography”, WFG 28), the basis of her sense of (supernatural) justice was not human rationality, but a desire for the Good, which she believed all humans share, even if at times they forget or deny this. Importantly, given her critique of French colonialism, and despite her claim that obligations to another must be indiscriminate, i.e., universal, she did not want to universalize law in a Kantian fashion. Rather, her aim was for cultures to continue their own traditions, for the goal of rootedness (l’enracinement) is not to change cultural values per se, but more precisely, to change how individuals in those cultures read and orient themselves toward those values.
Weil’s concept of “roots” is crucial to her late political thought. With connotations of both vitality and vulnerability, “roots” conceptualizes human society as dynamic and living while attesting to the necessity of stability and security if growth and flourishing are to occur on the level of the individual. Beyond the organic metaphor on the level of the natural, her concept of roots serves as a kind of bridge between the reality of society and the ideal of supernatural justice. Roots do this by manifesting human subjection to material and historical conditions, including the need to participate in the life of a community, to feel a sense of connection to a place, and to maintain temporal links, e.g., to cultural history and to hopes for the future. In turn, a rooted community allows for the development of the individual with a view toward God or eternal values. As such, and contra her early and middle maintenance of a critical distance from any collectivity (any Great Beast, to use the Platonic metaphor she frequently employs), in her late thought Weil sees roots as allowing for a “new patriotism” based on compassion. The establishing of roots (l’enracinement) enables multiple relations to the world (e.g., on the level of the nation, the organically developing community, the school) that at once nourish the individual and the community.
In addition to war and colonization, in The Need for Roots Weil points to money and to contemporary education as self-perpetuating forces that uproot human life. The longest section of the text describes modern uprootedness (déracinement), occurring when the imagined modern nation and money are the only binding forces in society, and she characterizes this condition as a threat to the human soul. Modern education is corrupted both by capitalism—such that it is nothing except “a machine for producing diplomas, in other words, jobs” (NR 118)—and by a Roman inheritance for cultivating prestige with respect to the nation: “It is this idolatry of self which they have bequeathed to us in the form of patriotism” (NR 137). As an alternative to modern uprootedness, Weil presents a civilization based not on force, which turns a person into a thing, but on free labor, which in its engagement with and consent to necessary forces at play in the world, including time and death, allows for direct contact with reality. Moreover, Weil’s writing in The Need for Roots is refracted through her religious experience. In this later period, then, she no longer conceptualizes labor in the mechanical terms of a “pivot” as she did in her early writings; it is now the “spiritual core” of “a well-ordered social life” (NR 295). (In her late social-political philosophy, in fact, a spiritual revolution is more important than an economic one.) Contra the Greeks, who devalued physical work, her conception of labor serves to mediate between the natural and the supernatural. In her late writings, labor is fully inflected by her faith in light of her experiences with Christianity. As such, labor’s consent to and, moreover, working through natural forces (e.g., gravity) is in fact consent to God, who created the natural world. Labor’s kenotic activity, as energy is expended daily, is a kind of imitatio Christi.
Her social-political writings in London are markedly different from her early writings as an anarchist informed principally by Descartes, Marx, and Kant. While those influences remain, her later writings must be read through the lens of her Christian Platonism. She suggests that we must draw our spiritual life from our social environment. That is, while spirituality is individual vis-à-vis God, this spirituality occurs within a social context, namely, the collectivity, and principally, the nation. This is a reversal from the critical distance she had maintained from the collectivity, especially in her early emphasis on the individual’s methodical thinking.
Throughout her life, Weil argued that knowledge in and of the world demanded rigorous, balanced thinking, even if that difficulty and measurement led the thinker to near-impossible tasks. For her these tasks of thinking included, for instance, her attempting to synthesize perspectives of intricate Catholic doctrine on the threshold of the Church with wisdom from various traditions such as ancient Greek philosophy and tragedies, Hinduism, Buddhism, and Taoism. Following Aeschylus, she believed knowledge was gained through suffering. Shaped by her social-political and religious thought, Weil’s epistemology would change over time, especially in light of her mystical experiences, of her first-person contacts with God.
In her dissertation, Weil attempts to think with Descartes in order to find foundational knowledge. Like Descartes, she argues for the existence of self, God, and world. Her cogito, however, was a decisive break from his: “I can, therefore I am” (Je puis, donc je suis) (1929–1930 “Science and Perception in Descartes”, FW 59). The self has the power of freedom, Weil argues, but something else—the omnipotent, God—makes the self realize that it is not all-powerful. Self-knowledge, then, is capability always qualified by the acknowledgment that one is not God. She maintained a kind of Cartesian epistemology during her time as a teacher, early in her academic life. In Lectures on Philosophy (1978 LP), a collection of lecture notes taken by one of her students during the academic year 1933–1934 at a girl’s lycée in Roanne, we find that Weil is initially critical of sensations as grounds for knowledge, and thereby critical of empiricist epistemology (LP 43–47).
From her early writings onward she was to problematize the imagination as the “folle imagination”, a barrier between mind and reality, meaning that the human knower is kept from things-in-themselves. Weil’s epistemology, then, informed by her initial studies of Descartes, would take on inflections of Kant and Plato while positioning her against Aristotle. She was critical of any sensation that universalizes one’s reading of the world, and she saw the imagination as thus extending the self, because it could not help but think through its own categories, wishes, and desires, thereby reading the world on its own terms. Relatedly, Weil would develop an intersubjective epistemology. Knowing the truth requires not extending one’s own limited perspective, but suspending or abandoning it such that reality—including the reality of the existence of others—could appear on its own terms. This suspension involves a practice of epistemic humility and openness to all ideas; intelligence for Weil demands the qualified use of language, acknowledgement of degrees, proportions, contingencies, and relations, as well as an ability to call the self into question. These epistemic practices are part of a broader recognition that the individual knower is limited.
The progression of Weil’s epistemology can be seen first in her conceptualization of contradiction. By Lectures on Philosophy, she affirmed a sense of contradiction beyond the logical conjunction “a is b” and “a is not-b”. Indeed, she argues that contradiction can be a generative obstacle in that it requires the mind to expand its thinking in order to transcend the obstacle. Drawing on the mathematics of Eudoxus, she elaborates on this notion to claim that incommensurables can be reconciled when set on a kind of “higher plane”. This is not, however, a type of Hegelian synthesis that can be intellectually apprehended. Instead, the contemplation of contradictions can lead the knower to a higher contemplation of truth-as-mystery. Thus, in her late epistemology Weil presents this concept of “mystery” as a certain kind of contradiction in which incommensurables appear linked in an incomprehensible unity.
Mystery, as a conceptualization of contradiction, carries theological, or at least supernatural, implications. For instance, if contradiction is understood through formal logic, then the existence of affliction would seemingly prove the nonexistence of an omnipotent, wholly benevolent God; however, contradiction, understood as mystery, can itself serve as a mediation, allowing for the coexistence of affliction and God, seen most prominently on the Cross. Indeed, Christ is the religious solution to Weil’s principal contradiction, that between the necessary and the good. Moreover, through incarnation that opens onto universality, Christ also manifests and solves the contradiction of the individual and the collectivity. Thus, in a modification of the Pythagorean idea of harmony, she claims that Christ allows for “the just balance of contraries” (“Spiritual Autobiography”, WFG 33). More broadly, in her 1941 “The Pythagorean Doctrine”, she argues that mathematics are a bridge between the natural and eternal (or between humans and God). That is, the Pythagoreans held an intellectual solution to apparent natural contradictions. Inspired by Pythagoras, she claimed that the very study of mathematics can be a means of purification if light of the principles of proportion and the necessary balancing of contraries—especially in geometry. She saw in the Pythagorean legacy and spirit a link between their mathematical insights and their distinctly religious project to penetrate the mysteries of the cosmos.
As opposed to the suppression or dissolution of contradictions, as in systematic philosophy, in Weil’s value-centered philosophy contradictions are to be presented honestly and tested on different levels; for her, they are “the criterion of the real” and correspond with the orientation of detachment (GG 98). For example, Christ’s imperative to “love your enemies” contains a contradiction in value: love those who are detestable and who threaten the vulnerability of loving. For Weil, submitting to this union of contraries loosens one’s attachments to particular, ego-driven perspectives and enables a “well-developed intellectual pluralism” (Springsted 2010: 97). She writes, “An attachment to a particular thing can only be destroyed by an attachment which is incompatible with it” (GG 101). With these philosophical moves in mind, Robert Chenavier argues that she has not a philosophy of perception, a phenomenology, but rather, borrowing Gaston Bachelard’s phrase, a “dynamology of contradiction” (Chenavier 2009 [2012: 25]).
Overall, Weil’s presentation of contradiction is more Pythagorean or Platonic than it is Marxian: it takes up contradiction not through resolution on the level of things, but through dialectics on the level of thought, where mystery is the beginning and end-point of thought (Springsted 2010: 97). In her unfinished essay “Is There a Marxist Doctrine?”, from her time in London, Weil writes,
Contradiction in matter is imaged by the clash of forces coming from different directions. Marx purely and simply attributed to social matter this movement towards the good through contradictions, which Plato described as being that of the thinking creature drawn upwards by the supernatural operation of grace. (OL 180)
She follows the Greek usage of “dialectics” to consider “the virtue of contradiction as support for the soul drawn upwards by grace”; Marx errs, she thought, in coupling such a movement with “materialism” (OL 181).
A second central epistemological concept for Weil is “reading” (lecture). Reading is a kind of interpretation of what is presented to knowers by both their physical sensations and their social conditions; therefore, reading—as the reception and attribution of certain meanings in the world—is always mediated. In turn, readings are mediated through other readings, since our perception of meaning is undoubtedly involved in and affected by an intersubjective web of interpretations. Weil explains this through the metaphor, borrowed from Descartes, of a blind man’s stick. We can read a situation through attention to another in order to expand our awareness and sensitivity, just as the blind man enlarges his sensibility through the use of his stick. But our readings of the world can also become more narrow and simplistic, as for instance, when a context of violence and force tempts us to see everyone we encounter as a potential threat. Moreover, readings are not free from power dynamics and can become projects of imposition and intervention; here her epistemology connects to her social-political philosophy, specifically to her concept of force.
We read, but also we are read by, others. Interferences in these readings. Forcing someone to read himself as we read him (slavery). Forcing others to read us as we read ourselves (conquest). (NB 43)
She connects reading to war and imagination: “War is a way of imposing another reading of sensations, a pressure upon the imagination of others” (NB 24). In her 1941 “Essay on the Concept of Reading” (LPW 21–27) Weil elaborates, “War, politics, eloquence, art, teaching, all action on others essentially consists in changing what they read” (LPW 26). In the same essay she develops “reading” in relation to the aforementioned epistemological concepts of appearance, the empirical world, and contradiction:
[A]t each instant of our life we are gripped from the outside, as it were, by meanings that we ourselves read in appearances. That is why we can argue endlessly about the reality of the external world, since what we call the world are the meanings that we read; they are not real. But they seize us as if they were external; that is real. Why should we try to resolve this contradiction when the more important task of thought in this world is to define and contemplate insoluble contradictions, which, as Plato said, draw us upwards? (LPW 22)
It is important to note that for Weil, we are not simply passive in our readings. That is, we can learn to change our readings of the world or of others. An elevated transformation in reading, however, demands an apprenticeship in loving God through the things of this world—a kind of attentiveness that will also entail certain bodily involvements, labors, postures, and experiences. Particular readings result from particular ways of living. Ideally for her, we would read the natural as illuminated by the supernatural. This conceptualization of reading involves recognition on hierarchical levels, as she explains in her notebooks:
To read necessity behind sensation, to read order behind necessity, to read God behind order. We must love all facts, not for their consequences, but because in each fact God is there present. But that is tautological. To love all facts is nothing else than to read God in them. (NB 267)
Thus the world is known as a kind of text featuring several significations on several stages, levels, or domains.
Weil’s epistemology grounds her critique of modern science. In The Need for Roots she advocates for a science conducted “according to methods of mathematical precision, and at the same time maintained in close relationship with religious faith” (NR 288). Through contemplation of the natural world via this kind of science, the world could be read on multiple levels. The knower, reading thus, would understand that the order of the world is the same as a unity, but different on its myriad levels:
with respect to God [it] is eternal Wisdom; with respect to the universe, perfect obedience; with respect to our love, beauty; with respect to our intelligence, balance of necessary relations; with respect to our flesh, brute force. (NR 288–289)
As in her social-political thought, in her epistemology Weil is a kind of anti-modern. She sees modern science and epistemology as a project of self-expansion that forgets limit and thinks the world should be subject to human power and autonomy. Labor (especially physical labor, such as farming), then, also assumes an epistemological role for her. By heteronomously subjecting the individual to necessity on a daily basis, it at once contradicts self-aggrandizement and allows for a more balanced reading: the intelligence qualifies itself as it reads necessary relations simultaneously on multiple levels. This reading on different levels, and inflected through faith, amounts to a kind of non-reading, in that it is detached, impersonal and impartial. Through these predicates “reading” is connected to her social thought, aesthetics, and religious philosophy. That is, in her later thought Weil’s epistemology relies on a time-out-of-mind metaphysics for justification. Analogous to aesthetic taste, spiritual discernment—God-given and graceful—allows the abdicated self to read from a universal perspective at its most developed stage. Thus, she argued, one can love equally and indiscriminately, just as the sun shines or the rain falls without preference.
Weil’s central ethical concept is “attention” (l’attention), which, though thematically and practically present in her early writings, reached its robust theoretical expression while she was in Marseilles in 1942. Attention is a particular kind of ethical “turn” in her conceptualization. Fundamentally, it is less a moral position or specific practice and more an orientation that nevertheless requires an arduous apprenticeship leading to a capacity of discernment on multiple levels. This includes discerning what someone is going through in her or his suffering, the particular protest made by someone harmed, the social conditions that engender a climate for suffering, and the fact that one is, by chance (hazard) at a different moment, equally a subject of affliction.
Attention is directed not by will but by a particular kind of desire without an object. It is not a “muscular effort” but a “negative effort” (WFG 61), involving release of egoistic projects and desires and a growing receptivity of the mind. For Weil, as a Christian Platonist, the desire motivating attention is oriented toward the mysterious good that “draws God down” (WFG 61). In her essay “Reflections on the Right use of School Studies with a View to the Love of God” (1942 in WFG 57–65), Weil takes prayer, defined as “the orientation of all the attention of which the soul is capable toward God”, as her point of departure (WFG 57). She then describes a kind of vigilance in her definition of attention:
Attention consists of suspending our thought, leaving it detached [disponible], empty [vide], and ready to be penetrated by the object; it means holding in our minds, within the reach of this thought, but on the lower level and not in contact with it, the diverse knowledge we have acquired which we are forced to make use of. … Above all our thought should be empty [vide], waiting [en attente], not seeking anything [ne rien chercher], but ready to receive in its naked truth the object that is to penetrate it. (WFG 62)
The French makes more clear the connection between attention (l’attention) and waiting (attente). For Weil the problem with searching, instead of waiting en hupomene (δἰ ὑπομονῆς), is precisely that one is eager to fill the void characterizing attente. As a result, one settles too quickly on some-thing: a counterfeit, falsity, idol. Because in searching or willing the imagination fills the void (le vide), it is crucial that attention be characterized by suspension and detachment. Indeed, the void by definition is empty (vide)—of idols, futural self-projections, consolations that compensate un-thinking, and attachments of collective and personal prestige. As such, its acceptance marks individual fragility and destructibility, that is, mortality. But this acceptance of death is the condition for the possibility of the reception of grace. (As explained below in regard to her religious philosophy, Weil’s concept for the disposition characterized by these features of attention, with obvious theological resonances, is “decreation”.)
In attention one renounces one’s ego in order to receive the world without the interference of one’s limited and consumptive perspective. This posture of self-emptying, a stripping away of the “I” (dépouillement)—ultimately for Weil an imitatio Christi in its kenosis—allows for an impersonal but intersubjective ethics. Indeed, if the primary orientation of attention is toward a mysterious and unknown God (often experienced as a desire for the Good), the secondary disposition is toward another person, especially toward those going through affliction.
The soul empties itself [se vide] of all its own contents in order to receive into itself the being it is looking at, just as he is, in all his truth. Only he who is capable of attention can do this. (WFG 65)
Weil recognizes and problematizes the fact that the autonomous self naturally imposes itself in its projects, as opposed to disposing itself to the other; for this reason, attention is rare but is required of any ethical disposition. The exemplary story of attention for Weil is the parable of the Good Samaritan, in which, on her reading, compassion is exchanged when one individual “turns his attention toward” another individual, anonymous and afflicted (WFG 90).
The actions that follow are just the automatic effect of this moment of attention. The attention is creative. But at the moment when it is engaged it is a renunciation. This is true, at least, if it is pure. The man accepts to be diminished by concentrating on an expenditure of energy, which will not extend his own power but will only give existence to a being other than himself, who will exist independently of him. (1942 “Forms of the Implicit Love of God” in WFG 83–142, 90)
As such, attention not only gives human recognition and therefore meaningful existence to another, but it also allows the individual engaged in renunciation to take up a moral stance in response to her or his desire for good.
It is important to distinguish Weil’s ethics of attention from canonical conceptualizations of ethics. Attention is not motivated by a duty (although Weil thinks we are obligated to respond to others’ needs, whether of soul or body [see “Draft for a Statement of Human Obligations” in SWA, esp. 224–225]) or assessed by its consequences. In addition, through its sense of phronesis (practical wisdom), which Weil assumed from Aristotle through Marx, attention is arguably closer to virtue ethics than it is to deontology or consequentialism. However, it is separated from the tradition of virtue ethics in important ways: it often emerges more spontaneously than virtue, which, for Aristotle, is cultivated through habituation as it develops into a hexis; its emphasis on a “negative effort” suggests an active-passive orientation that militates against Aristotle’s emphasis on activity (it is more a “turning” than a “doing”, more orientation than achievement); it is excessive in its generosity, as opposed to being a mean, e.g., liberality; its supernatural inspiration contrasts with Aristotle’s naturalism; it does not imply a teleology of realizing one’s own virtuous projects—in fact, it is a suspension of one’s own projects; finally, for Weil, Aristotle lacks a sense of the impersonal good toward which attention is oriented (and in this respect she is, again, inspired by Plato).
Weil treats the connections among attention, void, and love, relying on her supernatural (Christian Platonic) metaphysics, in “Forms of the Implicit Love of God”.
To empty ourselves [Se vider] of our false divinity, to deny ourselves, to give up being the center of the world in imagination, to discern that all points in the world are equally centers and that the true center is outside the world, this is to consent to the rule of mechanical necessity in matter and of free choice at the center of each soul. Such consent is love. The face of this love, which is turned toward thinking persons, is the love of our neighbor. (WFG 100)
Attention can be seen as love, for just as attention consents to the existence of another, love requires the recognition of a reality outside of the self, and thus de-centers the self and its particularity. Contra the colloquial sense of love, it is because we do not love personally, but “it is God in us who loves them [les malheureux]” (WFG 93–94), that our love for others is “quite impersonal” and thereby universal (WFG 130). Weil allows, however, “one legitimate exception to the duty of loving universally”, namely, friendship (“Last Thoughts”, WFG 51). Friendship is “a personal and human love which is pure and which enshrines an intimation and a reflection of divine love” (WFG 131), a “supernatural harmony, a union of opposites” (WFG 126). The opposites that form the miraculous harmony are necessity/subordination (i.e., drawing from Thucydides’ Melian dialogue, she sees it as an impossibility for one to want to preserve autonomy in both oneself and another; in the world the stronger exerts force through will) and liberty/equality (which is maintained through the desire of each friend to preserve the consent of oneself and of the other, a consent to be “two and not one” [WFG 135]). In other words, in friendship a particular, self-founded reading of the other is not forced. Distance is maintained, and in this way Weil’s concept of friendship advances her previous critiques of the ethos of capitalism, bureaucracy, and colonialism—i.e., free consent of all parties is the essential ingredient of all human relations that are not degraded or abusive. Hence friendship is a model for ethics more generally—even, contra her claim, universally.
Friendship has something universal about it. It consists of loving a human being as we should like to be able to love each soul in particular of all those who go to make up the human race. (WFG 135)
Weil’s ethics of attention informs her later social-political philosophy and epistemology. In relation to her social-political thought, attention suspends the self to allow for supernatural justice, which involves simultaneously turning attention to God and to affliction. Justice and the love of the neighbor are not distinct, for her.
Only the absolute identification of justice and love makes the coexistence possible of compassion and gratitude on the one hand, and on the other, of respect for the dignity of affliction [malheur] in the afflicted—a respect felt by the sufferer himself [les malheureux par lui-même] and the others. (WFG 85)
Additionally, attention, in its consent to distance from and autonomy of the other, is an antidote to force. Important to Weil’s epistemology, attention militates against readings that are based on imagination, unexamined perceptions, or functions of the collectivity (e.g., prestige). Attention here manifests as independent, detached thought. In its religious valence involving obedience and consent, attention also bears on Weil’s epistemology in an additional way: it suggests that knowing the reality of the world is less an individual achievement or attainment of mastery and more a gift of grace—openness to what cannot be predicted and to what often takes us by surprise. To moral gravity, the natural tendency of humans toward expansion of self and injustice, grace inspires attention as an antidote.
5. Metaphysical and Religious Philosophy
Although the metaphysics of Weil’s later thought was both Christian and Platonic, and therefore graceful and supernatural, her turn to God occurred not despite but, rather, because of her attention to reality and contact with the world. It is not the case, then, that her spiritual turn and “theological commitment” (Springsted 2015: 1–2) severed her contact with her early materialism, solidarities, or Marxian considerations; rather, her spiritual turn occurred within this context, which would ground the religious philosophy she would subsequently articulate.
In her late thought Weil presents an original creation theology. God, as purely good, infinite, and eternal, withdrew (or reduced Godself) so that something else (something less than fully good, finite, and spatio-temporally determinate) could exist, namely, the universe. Implicit in this outside-of-God universe is a contingency of forces. She calls this principle of contingency, the “web of determinations” (McCullough 2014: 124) contrary to God, “necessity”. Necessity is “the screen” (l’écran) placed between God and creatures. Here her creation metaphysics echoes Plato’s distinction between the necessary and the good in the Timaeus. Her Christian inflection translates this to the “supreme contradiction” between creature and creator; “it is Christ who represents the unity of these contradictories” (NB 386).
Weil is clear that God and the world is less than God alone, yet that only heightens the meaning of God’s abdication. That is, out of love (for what would be the world and the creatures therein), God decided to be lesser. Because existence—God’s very denial of Godself—is itself a mark of God’s love, providence is therefore not found in particular interventions of God, but understood by recognizing the universe in all its contingency as the sum of God’s intentions. In this theology rests an implication for creatures. If humans are to imitate God, then they must also renounce their autonomy (including imagined “centeredness” in the universe) and power out of love for God and therefore the world; she calls this “decreation” (décréation), which she describes paradoxically by “passive activity” (WFG 126) and, drawing on her readings of the Bhagavad Gita, “non-active action” (NB 124).
Weil articulates her religious philosophy through a series of distinctions—of oppositions or contradictions. It is important to read the distinctions she makes not as positing dualisms, but as suggesting contraries that are, unsynthesized, themselves mediations through which the soul is drawn upward. Her concept of “intermediaries”—or metaxu (μεταξύ), the Greek term she employs in her notebooks—becomes explicit beginning in 1939. Through metaxu God is indirectly present in the world, specifically, for example, in beauty, cultural traditions, law, and labor—all of which place us into contact with reality. In terms of her periodization, her concept of mediation moved from relations of mind and matter on the level of the natural (found in the early Weil) to a mediation relating the natural intelligence to attention and love on the level of the supernatural (at work in the late Weil), thus encompassing her early view through a universal perspective.
Given that reality is itself metaxu, Weil’s late concept of mediation is more universal than the aforementioned specific examples suggest. For her the real (le réel) itself is an obstacle that represents contradiction, an obstacle felt, e.g., in a difficult idea, in the presence of another, or in physical labor; thus thought comes into contact with necessity and must transform contradiction into correlation or mysterious and crucifying relation, resulting in spiritual edification. Her explanation of this mediation is based on her idiosyncratic cosmology, especially its paradoxical claim that what is often painful reality, as distance from God, is also, as intermediate, connection to God. She illustrates this claim with the following metaphor:
Two prisoners whose cells adjoin communicate with each other by knocking on the wall. The wall is the thing which separates them but it is also their means of communication. It is the same with us and God. Every separation is a link. (GG 145)
In developing her concept of the real, Weil is at pains to distinguish it from the imaginary. The imagination—problematized on epistemological grounds in her early thought—is criticized once again in her religious philosophy for its insidious tendency to pose false consolations that at once invite idolatry or self-satisfaction, both of which obviate real contemplation. This is why decreation, in which the individual withdraws her or his “I” and personal perspective so as to allow the real and others to give themselves, is crucial not only spiritually, but also epistemologically and ethically. It is, additionally and more radically, why Weil suggests that atheism can be a kind of purification insofar as it negates religious consolation that fills the void. For those for whom religion amounts to an imagined “God who smiles on [them]” (GG 9), atheism represents a necessary detachment. Crucially, for her, love is pure not in the name of a personal God or its particular image, but only when anonymous and universal.
The real leads us back to the aforementioned concept of “necessity”, for reality—essentially determinate, limited, contingent, and conditional—is itself a “network of necessity” (Vetö 1971 [1994: 90]), such that necessity is a reflection of reality. Moreover, like “power” in her early period and “force” in her middle period, Weil’s concept of necessity includes not only the physical forces of the created world, but also the social forces of human life. Through necessity a sense of slavery remains in her thought, for humans are ineluctably subject to necessity. In this way, enslavement to forces outside our control is essentially woven into the human condition.
Time, contrary to God as eternal, and along with space and matter, is first of all the most basic form of necessity. In its constant reminder of distance from God, and in the experience of enduring, and waiting, time is also painful. Weil’s Christian Platonism comes to light in the two most poignant metaphors she uses to refer to time, namely, the (Platonic) Cave and the (Christian) Cross. In both cases, time is the weight or the pull of necessity, through which the soul, in any effort of the self, feels vulnerable, contingent, and unavoidably subject to necessity’s mediation here below (ici-bas). Time, then, is both the Cave where the self pursues its illusory goals of expansion in the future and the Cross where necessity, a sign of God’s love, pins the self, suffering and mortal, to the world.
Importantly, by 1942 in New York, Weil’s concept of time sides with Plato against what she sees as Christian emphasis on progress:
Christianity was responsible for bringing this notion of progress, previously unknown, into the world; and this notion, become the bane of the modern world, has de-Christianized it. We must abandon the notion. We must get rid of our superstition of chronology in order to find Eternity. (LPr 29)
For Weil progress does not carry normative implications of improvement, for the Good is eternal and non-existent (in that it is neither spatial nor temporal); time must be consented to and suffered, not fled. As for Christ on the cross, for creatures there is redemption not from but through suffering. She thus presents a supernatural use of, not a remedy for, affliction. One form of sin, then, is an attempt to escape time, for only God is time-out-of-mind. However, time, paradoxically, can also serve as metaxu. While monotony is dreadful and fatiguing when it is in the form of a pendulum’s swinging or a factory’s work, it is beautiful as a reflection of eternity, in the form of a circle (which unites being and becoming) or the sound of Gregorian chant. This beauty of the world suggests, when read from the detached perspective, order behind necessity, and God behind order.
A second form of necessity is “gravity” (pesanteur), as distinct from supernatural “grace”. If gravity signifies the forces of the natural world that subject all created beings physically, materially, and socially, and thus functions as a downward “pull” on the “turn” of attention to God and to the afflicted, “grace”, as a counter-balance, is the motivation by and goodness of God. Grace pierces the world of necessity and serves to orient, harmonize, and balance, thus providing a kind of “supernatural bread” for satiating the human void. Grace, entering the empirical world, disposes one to be purified by detachment, waiting for a good that is real but that could never “exist” in a material sense (i.e., as subject to time, change, force, etc.). For Weil, natural/necessary gravity (force) and supernatural/spiritual grace (justice) are the two fundamental aspects of the created world, coming together most prominently in the crucifixion. The shape of the cross itself reflects this intersection of the horizontal (necessity) and the vertical (grace).
Weil’s concept of necessity bears on her late conceptualization of the subject. She connects seeing oneself as central to the world to seeing oneself as exempt from necessity. From this perspective, if something were to befall oneself, then the world would cease to have importance; therefore, the assertive and willful self concludes, nothing could befall oneself. Affliction contradicts this perspective and thus forcefully de-centers the self. Unlike her existentialist contemporaries such as Sartre, Weil did not think human freedom principally through agency; for late Weil, humans are free not ontologically as a presence-to-self but supernaturally through obedience and consent. More than obedience, consent is the unity of necessity in matter with freedom in creatures. A creature cannot not obey; the only choice for the intelligent creature is to desire or not to desire the good. The former—and here her stoicism through Marcus Aurelius and Spinoza emerges in her own appeal to amor fati—is a disposition that implies a consent to necessity and a love of the order of the world, both of which mean accepting divine will. Consent, therefore, is a kind of reconciliation in her dialectic between the necessary and the good. Consent does not follow from effort or will; rather, it expresses an ontological status, namely, decreation. In supernatural compassion one loves through evil: through distance (space) and through monotony (time), attending in a void and thinking freedom through necessity—through the abdication of God. Thus, in regard to contradiction and mediation, just as the intelligence must grapple with mystery in Weil’s epistemology, so too love must be vulnerable and defenseless in the face of evil in her metaphysical and religious philosophy.
Weil’s metaphysic sheds light on her aesthetic philosophy, which is primarily Kantian and Platonic. For Weil beauty is a snare (à la Homer) set by God, trapping the soul so that God might enter it. Necessity presents itself not only in gravity, time, and affliction, but also in beauty. The contact of impersonal good with the faculty of sense is beauty; contact of evil with the faculty of sense is ugliness and suffering—both are contact with the real, necessary, and providential.
Weil is a realist in regard to aesthetics in that she uses the language of being gripped or grasped by beauty, which weaves, as it were, a link among mind, body, world, and universe. Woven through the world, but beyond relying simply on the individual’s mind or senses, beauty, in this linking, lures and engenders awareness of something outside of the self. In paradoxical terms, for Weil, following Kant, the aesthetic experience can be characterized as a disinterested interestedness; against Kant, her telos of such experience is Platonic, namely, to orient the soul to the contemplation of the good. Moreover, for Weil beauty is purposive only because it is derivative of the good, i.e., the order of the world is a function of God. In a revision of Kant’s line that beauty is a finality without finality, then, she sees beauty not only as a kind of feeling or presence of finality, but also as a gesture toward, inclination to, or promise of supernatural, transcendental goodness.
At the same time, Weil’s concept of beauty is not only informed by her Platonism and thus marked by eternity, but it is also inspired by her experiences with Christ and hence features a kind of incarnation: the ideal can become a reality in the world. As such, beauty is a testament to and manifestation of the balance or equilibrium of the network of inflexible necessity that is the natural world—a network that, in some sense, the intelligence can grasp. It is in this way—not as an ontological category but, rather, as a sensible experience—that through beauty necessity becomes the object of love (i.e., in Kantian terms, beauty is regulative, not constitutive). Thus beauty is metaxu attracting the soul to God, and as metaxu, beauty serves as a “locus of incommensurability” (Winch 1989: 173) between the fragile contingency of time (change, becoming, death) and an eternal reality.
Because beauty is the order of the world as necessity, strictly speaking (and like Weil’s conception of providence) it is universal; “beauty” applies principally to the world as a whole, and therefore consent to beauty must be total. Thus it functions as an “implicit love of God” [see WFG 99]. More specifically, on the level of the particular there are, secondarily, types of beauty that nevertheless demonstrate balance, order, proportion, and thus their divine provenance (e.g., those found in nature, art, and science).
One’s recognition of the beauty/order of the world has implications, once again, for the subject. Because beauty is to be contemplated at a distance and in consent, not consumed through the greedy will, it trains the soul to be detached in the face of something irreducible, and in this sense it is similar to affliction. Both de-center the self and demand a posture of waiting (attente). Contemplating beauty, then, means transcending the perspective of one’s own project. Because beauty, as external to self, is to be consented to, it implies both that one’s reality is limited and that one does not want to change the object of her/his mode of engagement. Furthermore, beauty has an element of the impersonal coming into contact with a person. Real interaction with beauty is decreative. True to this claim, Weil’s aesthetic commitments are reflected in her style: in her sharp prose she scrutinizes her own thought while tending to exclude her own voice and avoid personal references; thus she performs “the linguistic decreation of the self” (Dargan 1999: 7).
7. Reception and Influence
Although the French post-structuralists who succeeded Weil did not engage extensively with her thought, her concepts carry a legacy through her contemporaries domestically and her heirs internationally (see Rozelle-Stone 2017). In regard to her generation of French thinkers, the influence of “attention” can be seen in the writings of Maurice Blanchot; her Platonic sense of good, order, and clarity was taken up—and rejected—by both Georges Bataille and Emmanuel Levinas. Following Weil’s generation, in his younger years Jacques Derrida took interest in her mysticism and, specifically, her purifying atheism, only to leave her behind almost entirely in his later references (Baring 2011). It is possible that Weil’s limited influence on poststructuralists is derived not only from the fact that she was not influenced by Nietzsche and Heidegger to the extent of the four aforementioned French thinkers, but also, quite simply, because she did not survive World War II and hence did not write thereafter. It is also important to note that throughout her life, Weil’s status as a female philosopher contributed to ad hominem attacks against her person, not her thought; she was often perceived as “psychologically cold” as opposed to being engaged in “an ethical project with different assumptions” (Nelson 2017: 9).
Across Europe and more recently, Weil’s “negative politics”—that is, turning away from institutions and ideology and toward religious reflection—, in conjunction with Michel Foucault’s concept of biopolitics, has been taken up by the political philosophies of Giorgio Agamben and Roberto Esposito (Ricciardi 2009). In doing so, Agamben (who wrote his dissertation on Weil’s political thought and critique of personhood, ideas of which went on to shape Homo Sacer [see Agamben 2017]) and Esposito rely on Weil’s concepts of decreation, impersonality, and force. Beyond the Continental scene, her Christian Platonism—especially her concepts of the good, justice, void, and attention—influenced Iris Murdoch’s emphasis on the good, metaphysics, and morality, and was thereby part of a recent revival in virtue ethics (Crisp & Slote 1997). The legacy of Weil’s writings on affliction and beauty in relation to justice is also felt in Elaine Scarry’s writings on aesthetics (Scarry 1999). T. S. Eliot, who wrote the introduction to The Need for Roots, cites Weil as an inspiration of his literature, as do W. H. Auden, Czeslaw Milosz, Seamus Heaney, Flannery O’Connor, Susan Sontag, and Anne Carson.
In Anglo-American academic consideration, Weil scholarship has emphasized her concept of supernatural justice, including the philosophical tensions that inform her materialism and mysticism (Winch 1989; Dietz 1988; Bell 1993, 1998; Rhees 2000). Additional considerations treat her Christian Platonism (Springsted 1983; Doering & Springsted 2004). Recent English-language scholarship on Weil has included texts on her concept of force (Doering 2010), her radicalism (Rozelle-Stone & Stone 2010), and the relationship in her thought between science and divinity (Morgan 2005), between suffering and trauma (Nelson 2017), and between decreation and ethics (Cha 2017). Furthermore, her concepts have influenced recent contributions to questions of identity (Cameron 2007), political theology (Lloyd 2011), and animality (Pick 2011).
Cited Works by Weil
- [FLN], 1970, First and Last Notebooks, Richard Rees (trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- [FW] 1987, Formative Writings: 1929–1941, Dorothy Tuck McFarland and Wilhelmina Van Ness (eds. and trans.), Amherst, MA: The University of Massachusetts Press.
- [GG] 1947 , Gravity and Grace, Emma Crawford and Mario von der Ruhr (trans), New York: Routledge; La pesanteur et la grâce, Paris: Librairie Plon, 1947.
- [LP] 1959 , Lectures on Philosophy, Hugh Price (trans.), New York: Cambridge University Press; Leçons de philosophie, Paris: Union Générale d’Éditions, 1959.
- [LPr] 1951 , Letter to a Priest, A. F. Wills (trans.), London: Routledge; Lettre à un religieux, Paris: Gallimard, 1951.
- [LPW] 2015, Simone Weil: Late Philosophical Writings, Eric O. Springsted and Lawrence E. Schmidt (trans.), Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
- [NB] 1956, The Notebooks of Simone Weil, Arthur Wills (trans.), 2 vols., New York: G. P. Putnam’s Sons.
- [NR] 1949 , The Need for Roots: Prelude to a Declaration of Duties toward Mankind, Arthur Wills (trans.), New York: Routledge; L’enracinement. Prélude à une déclaration des devoirs envers l’être humain, Paris: Éditions Gallimard, 1949.
- [OL] 1955 , Oppression and Liberty, Arthur Wills and John Petrie (trans.), New York: Routledge; Oppression et liberté, Paris: Éditions Gallimard, 1955.
- [SE] 1962, Selected Essays: 1934–1943, Richard Rees (trans.), London: Oxford University Press.
- [SL] 1965, Seventy Letters, Richard Rees (trans.), London: Oxford University Press.
- [SWA] 2005, Simone Weil: An Anthology, Siân Miles (ed.), New York: Penguin.
- [WFG] 1966 , Waiting for God, Emma Craufurd (trans.), New York: HarperCollins; Attente de Dieu, Paris: Éditions Fayard, 1966.
Other Works by Weil
- Écrits de Londres et dernières lettres, Paris: Gallimard, 1957.
- Écrits historiques et politiques, Paris: Gallimard, 1957.
- La condition ouvrière, Paris: Gallimard, 1951.
- La connaissance surnaturelle, Paris: Gallimard, 1950.
- Intimations of Christianity among the Ancient Greeks, Elisabeth Chase Geissbuhler (ed. and trans.), London: Routledge and Kegan Paul, 1957.
- Intuitions pré-Chrétiennes, Paris: La Colombe, 1951.
- On Science, Necessity, and the Love of God, Richard Rees (trans.), London: Oxford University Press, 1968.
- On the Abolition of All Political Parties, Simon Leys (trans.), New York: New York Review of Books, 2013.
- Oeuvres complètes, André Devaux and Florence de Lussy (eds.), 7 vols., 1988–2012.
- Pensées sans ordre concernant l’amour de Dieu, Paris: Gallimard, 1962.
- Simone Weil on Colonialism: An Ethic of the Other, J.P. Little (ed. and trans.), Lanham, MA: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc., 2003.
- Sur la science, Paris: Gallimard, 1966.
- “The Iliad, or the Poem of Force”, Mary McCarthy (trans.), Politics, November 1945, pp. 321-330, available online.
Selected Secondary Sources
- Agamben, Giorgio, 2017, “Philosophy as Interdisciplinary Intensity—An Interview with Giorgio Agamben”, interviewed by Antonio Gnolio, translated by Ido Govrin, Journal for Cultural and Religious Theory, 02/06/2017, available online.
- Allen, Diogenes and Eric O. Springsted, 1994, Spirit, Nature and Community: Issues in the Thought of Simone Weil, (Simone Weil Studies), Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
- Avery, Desmond, 2008, Beyond Power: Simone Weil and the Notion of Authority, New York: Lexington Books.
- Baring, Edward, 2011, The Young Derrida and French Philosophy, 1945–1968, New York: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511842085
- Bell, Richard H. (ed), 1993, Simone Weil’s Philosophy of Culture: Readings toward a Divine Humanity, New York: Cambridge University Press.
- –––, 1998, Simone Weil: The Way of Justice as Compassion, New York: Rowman & Littlefield Publishers, Inc.
- Bingemer, Maria Clara, 2011 , Simone Weil: una mística a los límites, Bueonos Aires: Ciudad Nueva. Translated as Simone Weil: Mystic of Passion and Compassion, Karen M. Kraft (trans.), Eugene, OR: Cascade Books, 2015.
- Blum, Lawrence A. and Victor J. Seidler, 2010, A Truer Liberty: Simone Weil and Marxism, New York: Routledge Revivals.
- Cameron, Sharon, 2007, Impersonality: Seven Essays, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
- Cha, Yoon Sook, 2017, Decreation and the Ethical Bind, New York: Fordham University Press.
- Chenavier, Robert, 2009 , Simone Weil, l'attention au réel, Paris: Michalon. Translated as Simone Weil: Attention to the Real, Bernard E. Doering (trans.), Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 2012.
- Crisp, Roger and Michael Slote (eds.), 1997, Virtue Ethics, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Dargan, Joan, 1999, Simone Weil: Thinking Poetically, (Simone Weil Studies), Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
- Dietz, Mary, 1988, Between the Human and the Divine: The Political Thought of Simone Weil, Totowa, NJ: Rowman & Littlefield.
- Doering, E. Jane, 2010, Simone Weil and the Specter of Self-Perpetuating Force, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Doering, E. Jane and Eric O. Springsted (eds.), 2004, The Christian Platonism of Simone Weil, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Dunway, John M. and Eric O. Springsted (eds.), 1996, The Beauty that Saves: Essays on Aesthetics and Langauge in Simone Weil, Macon, GA: Mercer University Press.
- Esposito, Roberto, 1996 , L'Origine della politica: Hannah Arendt o Simone Weil?, Rome: Donzelli Editore. Translated as The Origin of the Political: Hannah Arendt or Simone Weil, Vincenzo Binetti and Gareth Williams (trans.), New York: Fordham University Press, 2017.
- Finch, Henry Leroy, 2001, Simone Weil and the Intellect of Grace, Martin Andic (ed.), New York: Continuum.
- Holoka, James P. (ed. and trans.), 2005, Simone Weil’s the Iliad or the Poem of Force: A Critical Edition (Iliade, ou, le poème de la force), New York: Peter Lang.
- Lévinas, Emmanuel, 1952 , “Simone Weil contre la Bible”, Evidences, 24: 9–12. Translated as “Simone Weil against the Bible” in his Difficult Freedom: Essays on Judaism (Difficile liberté), Seán Hand (trans.), Baltimore, MD: The Johns Hopkins University Press, pp. 133–141.
- Lloyd, Vincent, 2011, The Problem with Grace: Reconfiguring Political Theology, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
- McCullough, Lissa, 2014, The Religious Philosophy of Simone Weil: An Introduction, New York: I.B. Tauris.
- McLellan, David, 1990, Utopian Pessimist: The Life and Thought of Simone Weil, New York: Poseidon Press.
- Morgan, Vance, 2005, Weaving the World: Simone Weil on Science, Mathematics, and Love, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Nelson, Deborah, 2017, Tough Enough: Arbus, Arendt, Didion, McCarthy, Sontag, Weil, Chicago: The University of Chicago Press.
- Perrin, J.M. and G. Thibon, 2003, Simone Weil as We Knew Her, New York: Routledge.
- Pétrement, Simone, 1973 , La vie de Simone Weil, Paris: Fayard. Translated as Simone Weil: A Life, Raymond Rosenthal (trans.), New York: Pantheon Books, 1976.
- Pick, Anat, 2011, Creaturely Poetics: Animality and Vulnerability in Literature and Film, New York: Columbia University Press.
- Rhees, Rush, 2000, Discussions of Simone Weil, (Simone Weil Studies), D.Z. Phillips (ed.), Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
- Ricciardi, Alessia, 2009, “From Decreation to Bare Life: Weil, Agamben, and the Impolitical”, Diacritics, 39(2): 75–84, 86–93. doi:10.1353/dia.2009.0014
- Rozelle-Stone, A. Rebecca (ed.), 2017, Simone Weil and Continental Philosophy, London: Rowman & Littlefield International.
- Rozelle-Stone, A. Rebecca and Lucian Stone (eds.), 2010, The Relevance of the Radical: Simone Weil 100 Years Later, New York: Continuum.
- –––, 2013, Simone Weil and Theology, New York: Bloomsbury T&T Clark.
- Scarry, Elaine, 1999, On Beauty and Being Just, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
- Springsted, Eric O., 1983, Christus Mediator: Platonic Mediation in the Thought of Simone Weil, Chico, CA: Scholars Press.
- –––, 1986, Simone Weil and the Suffering of Love, Eugene, OR: Wipf and Stock.
- ––– (ed.), 1998, Simone Weil: Essential Writings, Maryknoll, NY: Orbis Books.
- –––, 2010, “Mystery and Philosophy”, in The Relevance of the Radical: Simone Weil 100 Years Later, A. Rebecca Rozelle-Stone and Lucian Stone (eds), New York: Continuum, pp. 91–104.
- –––, 2015, “Introduction: Simone Weil on Philosophy”, in Eric O. Springsted (ed.), Simone Weil: Late Philosophical Writings, Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, pp. 1–19.
- Vetö, Miklos, 1971 , La métaphysique religieuse de Simone Weil, Paris: J. Vrin. Translated as The Religious Metaphysics of Simone Weil, (Simone Weil Studies), Joan Dargan (trans.), Albany, NY: SUNY Press, 1994.
- Von der Ruhr, Mario, 2006, Simone Weil: An Apprenticeship in Attention, London: Continuum.
- Winch, Peter, 1989, Simone Weil: “The Just Balance”, New York: Cambridge University Press.
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The authors would like to thank Scott Ritner and Catherine Fullarton for their generosity and support, hospitality and friendship, during the writing of this entry.