Supplement to Sextus Empiricus

Revisiting the texts which appeared to support interpretations 3.4.2 and 3.4.3

What of the texts assembled under 3.4.2, which can make it seem that Sextus is after all a rustic skeptic, with no beliefs at all? How would a Frede-style, ‘urbane’, interpreter respond to those texts? PH I 12 states:

The chief constitutive principle of skepticism is the claim that to every account an equal account is opposed; for it is from this, we think, that we come to hold no beliefs (μὴ δογματίζειν).

The urbane interpreter will observe that Sextus immediately goes on in I 13 to give the sense in which the skeptic has no beliefs, and that is the sense in which having a dogma would involve believing something on the basis of giving reasons of some sort; I 12 simply states that the skeptics do not have beliefs in that sense. The urbane interpreter will also need to explain those texts where Sextus says that the skeptic leads his life adoxastôs (translated by Annas and Barnes as ‘without holding any opinions’), such as PH I 15, 24, etc. But again, this word only need be understood as meaning ‘without dogmata (of the forbidden type)’. Sextus goes to such trouble to tell us that there are dogmata that the skeptic does have, and dogmata that the skeptic doesn’t have, it is only reasonable to interpret an adverb such as adoxastôs as meaning ‘without dogmata (of the forbidden type)’, especially since it occurs first in I 15, only a few lines after I 13. Frede-style interpreters would advocate translating adoxastôs in the way Bury did, as ‘undogmatically’ (there is no adverb adogmatikôs in Greek).

What of the text mentioned under 3.4.3, which would support the Fine/Perin view that the skeptic can only believe that they are being appeared to in a certain way? That text is PH I 19–20 (here again in Annas and Barnes’ translation):

When we investigate whether existing things are such as they appear, we grant (δίδομεν) that (ὅτι) they appear, and what we investigate is not what is apparent but what is said about what is apparent—and this is different from investigating what is apparent itself. For example, it appears to us that honey sweetens (we concede (συγχωροῦμεν) this inasmuch as we are sweetened in a perceptual way).

In this text, Sextus seems to say that the skeptic grants that existing things appear in such-and-such a way, and concedes that it appears to them that honey sweetens. This is what inspired Fine (followed by Perin) to argue that the Sceptic does indeed have beliefs, but only of the form "X appears F".

But Annas and Barnes’ translation might not be correct. An alternative translation is this:

When we investigate whether existing things are such as they appear, we grant the one [viz. what is apparent] because (ὅτι) it is apparent, and what we investigate is not what is apparent but what is said about what is apparent – and this is different from investigating what is apparent itself.

On this translation, the thing which is granted is the same as the thing which is explicitly said not be investigated, namely the thing which is apparent, i.e. that the apple is sweet. Crucially, the thing which is granted is not that it is apparent that the apple is sweet. So on this translation Sextus is saying that when something is apparent, e.g. that the apple is sweet, the sceptic grants the apparent thing (namely, that the apple is sweet), but investigates the things said about this, e.g. that the apple is sweet because of the presence of this or that molecular structure, or whatever. The trick is to translate the word normally translated ‘that’ (‘we grant that it appears’) as ‘because’ (to yield ‘we grant it because it appears’), a familiar ambiguity in Greek since the word ὅτι can mean either ‘that’ or ‘because’. In this way, what Sextus says is perfectly exemplified by his subsequent example: he says explicitly that it appears to the sceptic that honey sweetens, and the sceptic concedes this (i.e. that honey sweetens) because it appears perceptually to him that it sweetens.

In this way, the text that is the mainstay for the Fine/Perin interpretation is explained away. (Alternatively, an urbane interpreter of Sextus might stick with the usual translation of I 19–20 and accept that the skeptic not only has beliefs of the ordinary sort, e.g. that it is day right now, but also has beliefs of the sort ‘it appears to me that it is day right now’.)

Copyright © 2019 by
Benjamin Morison <bmorison@princeton.edu>

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