Notes to Reliabilist Epistemology

1. However, it is not beyond dispute that all major epistemological philosophers in the Anglophone tradition have hewed tightly to the internalist persuasion. Indeed, Frederick Schmitt offers an interpretation of Hume that construes him as giving a reliability theory of justification (Schmitt 2014: 1 and passim).

2. Miracchi (2015) has argued that standard virtue reliabilist accounts of knowledge have trouble handling a further range of Gettier cases. For example, Miracchi proposes a variant of one of Chisholm’s 1966 Gettier cases. In Miracchi’s variant, a subject sees a sheepdog, mistakes it for a sheep, and consequently believes there’s a sheep in the field in front her. As a matter of fact, the sheepdog is watching over a sheep that is also in the field, just out of the subject’s sight. Miracchi contends that the fact that the subject correctly believes there’s a sheep in the field is explained by her exercise of her perceptual competence, which leads Sosa-style virtue reliabilism to (incorrectly) predict that the subject knows there’s a sheep in the field.

3. Perhaps not all doxastic state serve as inputs to processes should qualify as evidence. Perhaps only justified beliefs should qualify as evidence; or, more narrowly, only true justified beliefs; or, more narrowly still, only beliefs that amount to knowledge. (For arguments that only knowledge can serve as evidence, see Williamson 2000: ch. 9.)

Copyright © 2015 by
Alvin Goldman <>
Bob Beddor <>

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